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Dutch Book Arguments

First published Wed Jun 15, 2011

The Dutch Book argument (DBA) for probabilism (namely the view that an agent's degrees of belief should satisfy the axioms of probability) traces to Ramsey's work in “Truth and Probability”. He mentioned only in passing that an agent who violates the probability axioms would be vulnerable to having a book made against him and this has led to considerable debate and confusion both about exactly what Ramsey intended to show and about if, and how, a cogent version of the argument can be given. The basic idea behind the argument has also been applied in defense of a variety of principles, some of which place additional constraints on an agent's current beliefs, with others, such as Conditionalization, purporting to govern how degrees of belief should evolve over time.

1. The Basic Dutch Book Argument for Probabilism

1.1 The Probability Axioms and the Dutch Book Theorem

The conclusion of the DBA is that the degrees of belief, or credences, that an agent attaches to the members of a set X of sentences, statements, or propositions, should satisfy the axioms of probability. The basic axioms of probability are generally taken as requiring that for AX,

(1) 0 ≤ pr(A) ≤ 1;
(2) if A is a tautology, then pr(A) = 1;
(3) if A and B are incompatible, then pr(AB) = pr(A) + pr(B).

Condition 2, which requires only that the truths of propositional logic are given the value one, is sometimes replaced with

(2′) if A is a logical truth, then pr(A) =1,

or even

(2″) if A is a necessary truth, then pr(A) =1.

The distinctions between these formulations of the axioms bear on the objects that probabilities are taken as attaching to and on the reasonableness of the argument's conclusion; but, for the immediate purpose of outlining the basic argument, the differences are not crucial.

The DBA itself begins with the so-called Dutch Book theorem, which concerns the conditions under which a set of bets guarantees a net loss to one side, or a Dutch Book. With de Finetti, it is here assumed that a bet on a proposition H is an arrangement that has the following canonical form:

H     Payoff
True SqS
False qS

The table gives the net payoff to an agent who buys a bet with stake S for the price qS, where S is won if H is true. S is called the stake, as it is the total amount involved in the wager, that is the payoff in the case that H is true together with the amount forfeited if H is false. The quantity q is called the betting quotient, which is the amount lost if H is false divided by the stake. The Dutch Book theorem can now be stated:

Given a set of betting quotients that fails to satisfy the probability axioms, there is a set of bets with those quotients that guarantees a net loss to one side.

It is easy to show how it is possible to make book against someone with betting quotients that violate the probability axioms. Let Q(H) be the agent's betting quotient for H. Assuming that the agent's betting quotients violate the axioms, a bookie can guarantee himself a profit by placing bets with the agent as described below. For simplicity the stake is set here at $1, but the following recipes for constructing a book against such a person are easily adapted for other stakes.

Axiom 1: Suppose that Q(H) < 0. In this case, the bookie buys the bet that pays $1 if H is true and 0 otherwise, for the negative price Q(H), which means that the agent collects Q(H), and pays out $1 if H is true, and $0 otherwise. Here the agent is betting against H and the payoff table for the agent is as follows:

H     Payoff
T −[1 − Q(H)]
F Q(H)

Since Q(H) is negative, the agent will suffer a net loss regardless of the truth-value of H. Suppose on the other hand that Q(H) > 1. In this case the bookie sells the bet that pays $1 if H is true and 0 otherwise, for Q(H).

Axiom 2: Suppose that an agent's betting quotient for a tautology (or a logical or necessary truth) H is not equal to 1. The case where Q(H) > 1 was included above, so assume that Q(H) < 1. Here the bookie will buy the bet in which the agent pays the bookie $1 if H is true, and nothing if H is false, for Q(H). The payoff table for the agent will be:

H     Payoff
T −[1 − Q(H)]
F Q(H)

Notice that since H is a tautology (or logical or necessary truth) it must be true, which means that at the conclusion of the bet, the agent will have lost [1−Q(H)].

Axiom 3 (Additivity): Assume that H1 and H2 are mutually exclusive and that Q(H1H2) ≠ Q(H1) + Q(H2). There are two cases,

Q(H1H2) > Q(H1) + Q(H2), and
Q(H1H2) < Q(H1) + Q(H2).

If Q(H1H2) < Q(H1) + Q(H2), then the bookie will offer the agent the bet that pays $1 if H1 and 0 otherwise for Q(H1) and the bet that pays $1 if H2 is true and 0 otherwise for Q(H2). The bookie then buys the bet that will pay him $1, if (H1H2) is true and 0 otherwise, for the price of Q(H1H2). The possible payoffs to the agent are summed up in the following table:

H1 H2     Net Payoff
T F [1 − Q(H1) − Q(H2) + Q(H1H2) − 1]
F T [1 − Q(H1) − Q(H2) + Q(H1H2) − 1]
F F [−Q(H1) − Q(H2) + Q(H1H2)]

Since Q(H1H2) < Q(H1) + Q(H2), the agent loses in each case and thus the collection of bets assures a loss. If Q(H1H2) > Q(H1) + Q(H2), then the bookie simply reverses the direction of the bets.

Letting V(H) be the payoff if H is true, the expected value of a bet on H is expressed by the equation:

Exp(H) = V(H)Q(H) + V(−H)(1−Q(H)).

Thus, for each axiom, the individual bets involved in making the book are fair, which is to say they have an expected value of zero, when calculated using the agent's betting quotients, yet collectively they will produce a sure loss. The Dutch Book argument assumes that an agent's degrees of belief are linked with her betting quotients. This together with the theorem establishes that degrees of belief that violate the probability axioms are associated with bets that are fair in the above sense, but that lead to a sure loss. The argument then concludes that agents ought to obey the axioms. This leaves open just what the association amounts to and what sort of problem the prospect of such sure loss is really supposed to be.

1.2 A Detailed Version of the Dutch Book Argument

The Dutch Book argument has often been presented as establishing that degrees of belief that violate the axioms are irrational because they can (or do) lead to bad consequences. It assumes that an agent's degrees of belief are associated with her betting quotients such that (1) for an agent with degree of belief q in M a bet on or against M at corresponding odds will be acceptable. With payoffs in dollars and stake S, this amounts to the claim that the agent should be willing to take either direction of a bet with a cost of $Sq that pays

$S if M
$0 otherwise.

But then (2) by the Dutch Book theorem a cunning bettor could assure himself a profit from someone who violates the probability axioms. Since (3) violating the axioms leaves the bettor open to being Dutch Booked (that is, being on the losing side of the Dutch Book) because her degrees of belief make acceptable bets leading to a sure loss, it is concluded that (4) one ought to satisfy the probability axioms (i.e. that probabilism is true). In some presentations, the first premise is strengthened to the claim that the agent actually will accept bets on M for which her degree of belief matches the betting quotient, in an effort to tighten the connection between violating the axioms and the sure loss.

A bit of terminology is in need of clarification here. De Finetti identified degrees of belief with betting quotients and termed degrees of belief that are susceptible to a Dutch Book incoherent; those that are not so susceptible he called coherent (de Finetti 1937). ‘Susceptible’ here should be understood in the sense of the above theorem, namely that bets are specifiable corresponding to those degrees of belief that will produce a sure loss to one side. Given the theorem, coherence amounts to satisfaction of the probability axioms, with incoherence involving their violation, and accordingly the terms are often used as a shorthand way of specifying whether the axioms are satisfied. It is mainly important to distinguish such usage where other norms are at issue. However, both Ramsey and de Finetti took incoherence to be a kind of inconsistency, and some use the term in this sense. There are various questions about understanding violation of the probability axioms and susceptibility to a Dutch Book in this way, as will be discussed, and so here it will be best to use ‘incoherent’ for degrees of belief that violate the probability axioms, and that by the Dutch Book theorem are associated with susceptibility to a sure loss.

1.3 The Converse Dutch Book Theorem

There is reason to accept the conclusion of the DBA that one ought to satisfy the probability axioms so as to avoid Dutch Book only insofar as satisfying the axioms affords at least the possibility of avoiding exposure to a sure loss (Hájek 2005, 2008). Here, the Converse Dutch theorem, proven independently by Lehman (1955) and Kemeny (1955), plays an important role. Roughly stated the result is that

For a set of betting quotients that obeys the probability axioms, there is no set of bets (with those quotients) that guarantees a sure loss (win) to one side.

It assures that the agent would not be exploitable in any event, and thus establishes an advantage to obeying the axioms. Notice that the theorem states that by adhering to the axioms, one will not be susceptible to a sure loss, rather than just the minimal claim required to establish an advantage to coherence that such vulnerability may be avoided.

Both the Dutch Book theorem and its converse are sensitive to the formulation of the axioms, as well as to the understanding of ‘bet’, ‘sure loss’ and what it means for such a loss to be guaranteed. Special care must be taken with the characterization of the probability axioms when it comes to the Converse Dutch Book theorem. Given that the axioms are formulated such that the second axiom only requires that tautological sentences receive probability one, it is possible to satisfy the axioms, yet still be open to a sure loss. Consider the claim that if b has F then something has F. This is not tautological, but betting against it would leave one vulnerable to a sure loss. Sometimes the second axiom is instead formulated as requiring that all logical truths receive probability one, but satisfying this constraint leaves open the possibility of a sure loss by betting against a necessary truth such as ‘nothing is both red and green all over’. Even with strengthening the second axiom to require that all necessary truths receive probability one, there is still a reading upon which the Converse Dutch Book theorem is false, since an agent will be vulnerable to a sure loss if she attaches a probability less than one to a known truth (or a probability greater than zero to a known falsehood). One response to this is to restrict ‘sure loss’ to those losses that do not depend on contingent facts. Instead the restriction could be made to losses that are ‘sure’ in the sense that there is a mechanical formula for inflicting the loss, thus removing the sort of counterexample to the Converse Dutch Book theorem with which we began, and the need to strengthen the axioms. A related move involves restricting the allowable bets, rather than limiting what counts as a sure loss.

It is also clear that in order for the Dutch Book theorem to hold, ‘sure loss’ must be taken to mean loss if the bets are in fact placed and settled. Violation of the probability axioms under any of their formulations does not guarantee an actual loss. Still more must be said here about the meaning of ‘sure loss’, which suggests some sort of necessity, but does not tell us whether this is supposed to be a particular form of logical necessity, metaphysical necessity, or perhaps some other relative necessity. If ‘sure loss’ were taken as foreseeable loss, then an agent could violate the axioms by attaching positive probability to a necessary falsehood, where there is no foreseeable loss given the current state of knowledge concerning the proposition in question. There is also an issue concerning whether it is the agent who must be able to foresee the loss. If ‘sure’ means decidable, then neither the formulation that logical nor that necessary truths receive probability one will do, since there is no decision procedure for determining in general whether a given sentence is a logical truth, let alone a necessary one. Clearly, there is a delicate balance that must be struck between the formulation of the probability axioms, and the understanding of ‘bets’ and ‘sure loss’ for the Dutch Book theorem and its converse to hold.

There is a further issue with the Converse Dutch Book theorem, because there are books that can be made against agents who violate other probabilistic norms, such as Reflection, countable additivity and others (see sections 3, 4, and 5). Satisfaction of the basic axioms is no guarantee that one will not be open to a book due to violation of some other norm. A correct formulation of the theorem must accordingly restrict the form and number of the allowable bets. Kemeny and Lehman put restrictions on the allowable bets (for example their betting systems are restricted to a finite number of bets), which seem to rule out these counterexamples. However, it remains to be shown that avoiding book with such a restricted set of bets suffices to justify adherence to the axioms. The problem here becomes especially pressing with the observation, discussed in the following section, that incoherent agents need not be generally vulnerable to a sure loss, and thus that both coherent and incoherent agents alike may be subject to some books and not others. What is needed in arguing for adherence to the probability axioms is the further claim that the bets which lead to sure losses and that are associated with incoherence pose a special problem, although it seems that this would threaten the use that many proponents of the DBA have wanted to make of Dutch Book arguments in defending other norms.

A related problem concerns the assumption made in the version of the DBA argument presented in section 1.2 that agents will accept, or at least find acceptable, those ‘fair bets’ on or against P where their degree of belief matches the betting quotient for the bet. As discussed in the next section, it is not true that all such bets will be accepted, or even be regarded as acceptable, and additional bets may be accepted (or found acceptable). Some bets that might be accepted, but which are not fair in the above sense, can also produce a Dutch Book. Thus, we need to be concerned more generally with the array of bets that agents will accept (or find acceptable). But since this widens the class of bets that can be used to produce a book, if anything it makes the problem for the DBA that a coherent agent may be subject to a Dutch Book even worse. The version of the DBA in section 1.2 could be modified with the claim that agents accept (or find acceptable) only bets that are fair or favorable, that is those with a non-negative expected value as calculated using their degrees of belief. This rules out some additional bets that would produce a Dutch Book for a coherent agent, but not those that enter into the DBAs for other norms. However, this assumption too is problematic, and fails to address other issues confronting the argument.

1.4 Can it be Rational to Violate the Probability Axioms?

As noted above, the sure loss guaranteed by the Dutch Book theorem need not amount to an actual loss. Indeed a bookie could reverse the direction of the bets that would guarantee a loss for an incoherent agent so as to guarantee her a win, or there could be some sort of other prize that might be awarded for being incoherent. An incoherent agent might not be confronted by a clever bookie who could, or would, take advantage of her, perhaps because she can take effective measures to avoid such folk. Even if so confronted, the agent can always prevent a sure loss by simply refusing to bet. It won't do to respond to such a possibility by insisting on the stronger assumption that an agent will always take bets where the expected value of each is non-negative, because this simply gives the argument a false premise. In any case, it is clear that the trouble with being incoherent cannot be that it will lead to losses. Rather, the idea behind the version of the argument in section 1.2 should be taken to be that incoherence opens one up to sure losses, in a way that having coherent beliefs does not (given an appropriate version of the Converse Dutch Book theorem), and that such potential vulnerability demands adherence to the axioms.

We may question whether either the conclusion that incoherence is irrational or that one ought to satisfy the axioms follows from simply being open to a sure loss. If the threat of such a loss is seen as unlikely, say, if the agent thinks she won't face a clever bookie, has confidence that her charms will prevent her from ending up on the losing side of a Dutch Book, or just thinks she just won't take bets leading to a Dutch Book if they are offered, then it is hard to see why the mere potential of a sure loss should demand coherence. Another problem here is the special status accorded to sure losses. In fact the potential sure loss is symmetric with a possible sure gain. As Hájek emphasizes, there is a corresponding “Czech Book Argument”, which parallels the DBA, with the conclusion that one ought to violate the probability calculus (Hájek 2005, 2008). Construed as above, the DBA appears to be canceled out by the “Czech Book Argument”, although Hájek shows that the potential canceling out can be avoided by reformulating the DBA to reflect the observation that the agent should accept bets that are either fair or favorable (Hájek 2008). Still, it is compatible with the Dutch Book theorem that an incoherent agent could end up on the side of a sure gain, and so incoherence cannot be condemned as irrational simply by citing the possibility of sure losses.

Although the threat of a sure loss may be remote, and an agent could face a sure gain, there are some situations in which incoherence is more closely tied to actual losses.

Some versions of the DBA appeal to such scenarios as a preliminary to attempting to establish the general irrationality of being incoherent. One tactic has been to argue that incoherence is irrational in so-called forced betting situations, and from there that the prohibition against being incoherent in such situations can be universalized (Jackson and Pargetter 1976). In a forced betting situation the agent is required to post betting quotients, and then to place bets with those quotients, where the stake and direction of the bets are dictated by an opponent. Assuming that the only source of value is the money (valued linearly) involved in the wagers, it is claimed that it is irrational to be incoherent in such a situation. But this doesn't follow if the irrationality is taken as arising from actual losses that would result. Even in a forced betting scenario, there may be reasons to suppose that incoherent betting quotients will not be taken advantage of, as may occur if making book would require knowledge of some very complicated logical truth (Kennedy and Chihara 1979). Here too, the direction of the bets could be chosen so that an incoherent agent will have a sure gain. This would be an odd forced betting situation, but if the agent had reason to believe that this would occur, it could actually be advisable for her to post incoherent odds.

One might begin instead with a competitive betting situation, in which it is given that both sides attempt to maximize their gain. Here there is a closer connection between incoherence and loss, since the bookie will be trying to maximize his profit, and so a sure gain for an incoherent agent could only be the result of a mistake. If it is assumed that the agent is also forced to bet and that the bookie will act optimally, the agent should post coherent odds, for otherwise she will be subject to a bankrupting Dutch Book. Of course if the competitive situation is one in which the agent can refuse to bet, having incoherent betting quotients need not leave her open to an actual loss.

Even in those forced betting situations and competitive betting situations in which it is irrational to post incoherent betting quotients, it still need not be irrational to have incoherent degrees of belief (Kennedy and Chihara 1979; Adams and Rosenkrantz 1980). For example, if the agent must post odds on what she knows to be either a logical truth or a logical falsehood in a forced betting situation, she may be better off with a betting quotient of either 1 or 0, rather than some intermediate value, for she is susceptible to a Dutch Book in the latter event, but she could end up with the objectively correct value in the former case and thus would avoid a loss. But, it seems that she can have reasons for an intermediate level of confidence, making such an evaluation more rational, at least in the sense of reflecting her available evidence, than an extreme one. Alternatively the agent may simply have no idea whatsoever about the logical status of what is in fact a logical truth upon which she must post odds, in which case a confidence of .5, or perhaps remaining entirely agnostic by not adopting any particular level of confidence, seems more reasonable than her being fully confident despite her ignorance.

At the least, such examples raise questions about the connection that the DBA presupposes between partial beliefs and favorable/unfavorable betting odds. In the case where an agent must give her betting quotient for what is in fact a logical truth, any value less than one leaves her vulnerable to a sure loss, possibly a bankrupting one, yet in such cases not all such credences are rationally on a par. The issue here seems to be more than simply one about how well the underlying theory of action and belief works for extreme values, but also about the relevant conception of rational belief. Rational action-guiding credences should generally reflect the agent's evidence, yet at least in the cases above, probabilism seems sometimes to require that they do not. One may question whether the appropriate or intended sense of ‘rational’ is invoked in these cases in which it seems right to say that rational beliefs can come apart from betting quotients, but such objections just highlight the lack of clarity in most presentations of the argument over what sort of rationality is supposed to be at stake. It has been said, for instance, that it is ideal rationality that demands adherence to the axioms, but this notion too is unclear. What can be said though is that there are cases in which degrees of belief do satisfy an important ideal of rationality but where they seem to come apart from betting quotients, and this puts additional pressure on the premise that agents should be willing to accept bets where their degrees of belief match the betting quotient.

Neither a forced nor a competitive betting situation per se guarantees that incoherence will result in actual losses, and even in the special cases in which it would bring them about, it appears that having incoherent degrees of belief need not be irrational. Indeed, whereas degrees of belief may generally be thought of as guides to action, and as well-modeled by betting quotients in many cases, forced and competitive betting situations in fact reinforce the point that they are not always straightforwardly linked. Thus, arguments for the claim that incoherence is generally irrational that begin with the claim that it is irrational in forced betting situations fail to even get off the ground, let alone show that it is irrational outside of such situations, where the connection between incoherence and the possibility of losses is even more tenuous. Still, forced and competitive betting situations are helpful in identifying rational constraints under idealized conditions, and can serve as useful models of action in some situations. Under highly circumscribed conditions, where the agent's goals are limited, they show that it is prudent to post coherent betting quotients. It is a bad feature of incoherent betting quotients, whether or not they correspond to such degrees of belief, that in a forced betting situation they provide the opportunity for a clever bookie to inflict a sure loss, and guarantee it in competitive ones with a utility-maximizing opponent. But, the special conditions that make it rational to have coherent betting quotients, so as to avoid a sure loss, are not met in general. In some circumstances, a small sure loss can be better than the chance of a greater loss. Additionally, where there is something of value that is linked to a wager besides the stake, it can also be rational to act so as to bring about a sure loss on a bet.

Aside from the reasons given above for the fact that it can be rational to leave oneself open to, or act so as to guarantee, a sure loss, situations in which the value of a bet is not fully represented by its monetary payoff conditions present challenges for versions of the DBA that take the problem with incoherence as stemming from the threat of losing money. An agent may not wish to risk losing money on a large bet, due to additional bad consequences that would or might ensue, or the agent may suffer anxiety over the prospect of loss. De Finetti and others insist on limiting the stakes in an effort to get around this problem, but Ramsey already observed that one might have a “reluctance to bother with trifles”, which is to say that there is a negative value to placing bets with little potential gain. Perhaps there is some range for which the stakes are neither too high nor too low, such that the monetary payoffs may be taken as at least a reasonable approximation of the value of the bets, but this further limits the situations in which the sure loss may be inflicted.

Another problem involving the value of bets arises in establishing the additivity axiom, for even if each in a set of bets is acceptable, it does not follow that they would be jointly acceptable. Consider a person with 4 dollars, who needs 2 dollars for bus fare. He might be willing to take either one of two wagers that cost 2 dollars for a chance at winning enough money to buy a magazine to read on the ride, but be unwilling to risk all 4 dollars, and the possibility of having to walk home. One response here is to insist that the bets should be presented in terms of utilities rather than money, although this raises difficulties of its own, since these are not objective commodities. Such an approach involves assuming either directly or indirectly that such utilities are additive, but even this is not enough. While it may plausibly be argued that given a set of credences and utilities, pragmatic rationality requires maximizing expected value with respect to those credences and utilities, so that an agent with incoherent degrees of belief is committed to accepting bets (paying off in utility) that lead to a sure loss, the problem for the DBA remains that being so committed to a sure loss is still not necessarily irrational. See (Maher 1993).

It is clear that the version of the DBA presented in section 1.2 is far from cogent. There is a gap between the agent's degrees of belief and the acceptance of bets that would produce a sure loss, and the possibility of such a loss need not entail irrationality. One can specify situations in which the connections are tighter, but this fails to establish the general claim of probabilism.

2. The Dutch Book Argument and Probabilistic Consistency

2.1 The Dutch Book Argument as Revealing Inconsistency

A popular response to the objections to the DBA considered in section one suggests that incoherence is not a pragmatic defect per se, and that the Dutch Book is merely a dramatic device for illustrating a kind of logical defect. Skyrms (1987) attributes this reading of the DBA to Ramsey, finding support in his remarks that

Any definite set of degrees of belief which broke them [the laws of probability] would be inconsistent in the sense that it violated the laws of preference between options…If anyone's mental condition violated these laws, his choice would depend on the precise form in which the options were offered him, which would be absurd. He could have a book made against him by a cunning bettor and would stand to lose in any event. (Ramsey 1926, p. 41)

Additional support for this interpretation can be found in Ramsey's assertion that the subject of his paper is the logic of partial belief.

Various authors have elaborated on the idea that incoherence amounts to a kind of inconsistency. For example, Armendt (1993) tells us that it involves an inconsistency that is revealed by the fact that degrees of belief guide action, and that Dutch Book vulnerability amounts to giving conflicting evaluations to the same option(s). He calls this “divided-mind” inconsistency, which he says is a flaw of rationality. This fits the typical sort of case where an agent violates additivity, and sometimes applies to violations of the other axioms, but incoherence does not always entail having two different evaluations of the same option. Although degrees of belief often serve as guides to action, they need not be tied to an evaluation of options at all. However, it is a fundamental assumption of most versions of the DBA that credences do have such a role, as in the theories of Ramsey and de Finitti, so it is of interest that even with this assumption, incoherence need not involve giving conflicting evaluations (Vineberg 2001). Consider for instance a person who is less than fully confident of Fermat's Last Theorem, perhaps because they don't know that it has been proven. On at least some ways of understanding propositions, this need not entail attaching two different judgments to the same proposition. One could also violate coherence by only attaching a probability of less than one to a single proposition that is a logical truth, or one could avoid different evaluations by having the same level of confidence in every proposition. These examples aside, even the additivity axiom is problematic on Armendt's interpretation, for it requires, for mutually exclusive propositions p and q, that joint bets on p and on q amount to the same option as a bet on p or q. This in turn presumes that values are additive, which goes beyond simply having degrees of confidence in p, q, and their disjunction, although Armendt (1993) suggests that the assumption is generally met and appropriate for the purposes of the DBA.

In “Truth and Probability”, Ramsey assumes that, at least under idealized conditions, degrees of belief manifest themselves in preferences for options. This allows Ramsey to characterize the inconsistency involved in violating the probability axioms in terms of violating the axioms of rational preference. While he never claims that degrees of belief are necessarily linked to preferences, the model of belief and preference that he offers assumes such an association, and indeed a great achievement of the paper is what amounts to a representation theorem establishing that an agent satisfying the axioms that he specifies for rational preference can be represented as having degrees of belief that satisfy the probability axioms. In the model he offers, degrees of belief serve as guides to action through their connection with preferences, so that therein at least incoherence does manifest itself in preference inconsistency. But the way that Ramsey casts the inconsistency involved in violating the axioms in terms of preference inconsistency leaves it unclear that his goal of characterizing the logic of partial belief has been satisfactorily met. One trouble is that it does not show us that the preference inconsistency to which incoherent beliefs are tied is appropriately analogous to inconsistency for simple (or full) belief, which involves believing inconsistent propositions, i.e. a set of propositions that cannot all be true. Another worry is that in Ramsey's model degrees of belief are linked with preferences, and it seems that having a degree of belief does not by its nature require any such connection with preference and action. One can surely have finely graded beliefs in propositions without a connection to preferences. Moreover, consistency for full belief derives from the concept of belief as holding propositions to be true and from the logic of propositions, without any such assumed tie to action, and although Ramsey thought that such a connection was necessary to clarify the idea of partial belief, it seems that a fully analogous characterization of consistency for partial belief should do without it.

2. 2 Depragmatized Arguments

Several philosophers have sought to establish coherence as a consistency constraint on degrees of belief through a version of the DBA that does not presuppose any definite connection between degrees of belief and preference (Christensen 1996, 2004; Howson and Urbach 1993; Hellman 1997). These so-called depragmatized arguments purport to improve upon Ramsey's treatment by making clear how coherence is supposed to mirror the ordinary notion of consistency. Howson and Urbach attempt this by identifying an agent's degree of belief in M with the bets she regards as fair, such that for credence q in M, a bet with cost $Sq that pays

$Sq if M
$0 otherwise

is taken as fair. They then employ the Dutch Book theorem to argue that incoherent degrees of belief cannot in fact be fair betting quotients, and thus that incoherence involves taking a set of bets as fair that cannot be fair, which is supposed to parallel having inconsistent beliefs.

There are several problems that undermine Howson and Urbach's approach. The most basic is that an agent with degree of belief q in M need not regard bets of the above form as fair for a variety of reasons. To begin with she may simply lack the concept of a fair bet. Secondly, she could have credence q, yet acknowledge the bet above as explicitly unfair. For instance, if she knows M to be either a logical truth or a logical falsehood, but has no idea which, her confidence that it is true could be ½, though she may well know that this would not be a fair betting quotient for it. Casting credences in terms of the bets that are regarded as fair is also problematic in that it appears to associate degrees of belief with having certain full beliefs, which some think should be avoided. The argument also clearly falters over the additivity axiom, since even if an agent regards each of a set of bets as individually fair, they may not be collectively fair by her lights, so she need not evaluate the bets needed to produce a book as fair bets. Here, and in the basic assumption about the individual bets that an agent finds fair, it is in effect assumed that money acts as a measure of value. Not only is this not generally true, it calls attention to the fact that the argument has not really been depragmatized. While Howson and Urbach do not rely on either the assumption that agents will (or should) act in accordance with their degrees of belief or that they should be willing to accept either direction of a fair bet, they do assume that agents make evaluations of bets, which are tied to the concept of pragmatic value. Maher (1997) argues that their way of spelling out fairness in terms of a primitive concept of advantage, so as to avoid the notions of preference and utility, fails. Indeed, it is hard to see that the latter notions can be avoided in explicating the concept of fairness, upon which their argument depends.

A similar argument is offered by Christensen (1996), except that his depragmatized DBA further weakens the connection between degrees of belief and bets. Where Howson and Urbach specify that an agent will regard a bet as fair, Christensen assumes only that the bet is sanctioned as fair or justified by the agent's beliefs, thus avoiding the first objection to Howson and Urbach's treatment. He then invokes the Dutch Book theorem to argue that incoherent degrees of belief sanction as fair a set of bets, which cannot be fair, and claims this reveals that incoherence is fundamentally an epistemic, and indeed a logical, defect. But, his argument clearly faces the previous difficulty over the additivity axiom; since, even if two bets are sanctioned individually, it does not follow that they are sanctioned jointly. In response to this problem, Christensen (2004) modified his argument by restricting the assumption about the sanctioning of bets to “simple agents” who value only money, value it linearly, etc., so that monetary payoffs function as utilities for them. He then argued that degrees of belief that violate the probability axioms in a simple agent are rationally defective in virtue of the fact that they sanction bets that would be guaranteed to lose money. From this he claimed that since it is the incoherent beliefs themselves that have been shown to be defective, such beliefs are rationally defective in all agents.

Here again, the pragmatic dimension of the argument seems to have been merely submerged. Degrees of belief do not sanction bets in isolation from preference, and so the alleged defect in the simple agent who violates the probability axioms cannot be pinned on those beliefs in isolation. Since it is not the simple agent's beliefs themselves that have been shown to be defective, but rather those beliefs in combination with her preferences, the inference that incoherent degrees of belief are rationally defective in all agents is invalid. For all that has been shown, such beliefs might be fine in combination with a different preference structure. Not only is it premature to conclude that incoherence is rationally defective generally, Christensen has not argued convincingly that incoherence is rationally or logically defective even in simple agents. It could be rational for a simple agent to be incoherent if she were surrounded by “Czech bookies”, who will offer bets, so that she is on the winning, rather the losing, side of the book, because in this situation incoherence will lead to satisfaction of her one goal as a simple agent of increasing her monetary gain. Of course it is incoherence as a logical defect, rather than one of means/ends rationality that is Christensen's focus, but since sanctioning bets as fair that cannot be fair is not a property of incoherent degrees of belief alone, he has not shown incoherence to be on a par with inconsistency with full belief, where the defect lies with the beliefs themselves.

2.3 Coherence as a Pragmatic Consistency Constraint

The depragmatized DBAs attempt to use the Dutch Book theorem to show that incoherent degrees of belief involve a kind of inconsistency on their own, irrespective of the way in which they link up with particular preferences. But, the claim of inconsistency here requires that credences be tied to evaluations of fairness, which in turn invokes a concept of valuation that goes beyond merely having degrees of belief. If an agent's degrees of belief are incoherent, and he makes evaluations of bets using the standard expectation rule, then there will be bets (with payoffs in some measure of utility) such that individually these will have expected value zero, and will in this sense be fair by his lights, but which lead to a net loss, and so may be said to be unfair. The unfairness can be deduced from the agent's beliefs and their connection with the agent's utilities, which establishes the defect brought out by the Dutch Book as internal to the agent, marking a crucial difference between the loss so inflicted and the sort requiring superior factual knowledge on the part of the bookie. While the linkage between the agent's credences and his evaluation of bets is crucial to this result, the needed connection is independent of the agent's particular preference for goods, and so it could be said that the failure to correspond to fair betting quotients is a property of the agent's beliefs, yielding the result that incoherent credences, appropriately connected with preference, display a property that is analogous to inconsistency for full belief.

There is then a version of the DBA that seems close to what Ramsey had in mind, which claims that insofar as degrees of belief link up suitably with preferences, incoherence is associated with a property mirroring inconsistency, although this still need not amount to divided-mind inconsistency in Armendt's sense, nor is it entirely akin to inconsistency for full beliefs, which are characterized directly without any assumed connection to preference and action. The agent by whose lights each of a set of bets looks fair although they lead collectively to a Dutch Book, which can be set up by examining simply the agent's credences, has a system of evaluation that is self-defeating, and as such may be said to exhibit a form of irrationality. On this reading, the vulnerability associated with incoherence is theoretical, and linked closely with the agent's utilities, which means that actual vulnerability depends not only upon an appropriately situated bookie, but also upon the availability of suitable commodities that measure those utilities. With this in place, bets can be fixed that constitute a book on the basis of the agent's beliefs, but which are evaluated as fair by the agent's lights. Notice that the previous points, that an agent might avoid book by refusing to bet and that one might end up on the side of a sure gain, are now otiose, for here it is the agent's evaluations, rather than their consequences that are implicated by the Dutch Book. Still, the DBA depends upon the theory of preference and utility, and as Kaplan notes (Kaplan 1996), this does not emerge straightforwardly from standard presentations of the argument of the sort considered in section one, nor in the depragmatized versions, as observed in the previous section.

The assumptions of the DBA are significant. It is the agent's system of credences together with the way they are involved in evaluating options that is implicated by the Dutch Book. To conclude that simply having incoherent credences is irrational, a further argument is needed showing that rationality demands that credences be linked to evaluations of bets as in the DBA, but there is little to suggest that graded degrees of belief must be so connected. Indeed, the DBA assumes not only that there is some connection between an agent's credences and the evaluation of options, but that one should evaluate a bet as fair if it has an expected value of zero, using the standard expectation rule. It is less than clear why an incoherent agent must accept this, and how much of probabilism this already presupposes. Even assuming the appropriate kind of connection between credences and evaluations of options, it may be objected still that the sort of inconsistency revealed through Dutch Book vulnerability is not necessarily irrational, particularly in cases where this is due to the failure to grasp some subtle or complex logical facts. It is hard to see that rationality requires agents to attempt to remove such inconsistencies in their belief systems; indeed for most it would be both hopeless and counterproductive. Nor does it seem correct to count as more rational the person who avoids inconsistency by refusing to have an opinion in the face of evidence than the person with less than full confidence in a logical truth, who takes the incomplete evidence into account. One option is to insist that coherence is a requirement on ideal agents. It might be suggested instead that coherence is one of a number of ideals, whose satisfaction may sometimes conflict, and that an incoherent agent may still be rational in the sense that they have optimally managed their opinions in light of the totality of their goals and constraints. Whatever the conclusion about the irrationality of being incoherent though, with idealizing assumptions about the connection between degrees of belief and the evaluation of options, the DBA succeeds in establishing incoherence as an evaluative defect.

3. Dutch Book Argument for Countable Additivity

Given a countable infinity of mutually exclusive and exhaustive ways Wi in which the proposition A can be true, the Principle of Countable Additivity requires that

pr(A) =


A Dutch Book argument can be constructed for the principle by extending the Dutch Book for finite additivity (Adams 1962; Jeffrey 2004; Williamson 1999) by appealing to an infinite set of bets that each pay $1 if Wi is true for the price pr(Wi). In the case of the Dutch Book argument for countable additivity, there is an additional reason beyond those for the basic argument to favor the interpretation of it, as Jeffrey does, as establishing the principle as a consistency constraint, since the loss is purely theoretical. There is no threat of an actual loss to an agent since this would require an infinite series of bets, which cannot all be made and settled. However, the principle itself is controversial, making the Dutch Book argument for countable additivity highly provocative. Both de Finetti (1972) and Savage (1954) argued that the principle should not be invoked as a constraint on rational degrees of belief. A consequence of the principle is that it prohibits uniformly distributed beliefs over a countably infinite set, and yet it seems at least acceptable in the absence of a reason to favor some possibilities over others to adopt such a distribution. Intuitively, a uniform distribution ought to count as consistent, which puts pressure on the idea, at least when it comes to countable additivity, that Dutch Books reveal a defect that is substantially analogous to inconsistency. In the background, as with the basic argument, the Dutch Book argument for countable additivity makes significant assumptions about how degrees of belief are linked with preference and assessments of value. For details concerning how these relate to the demand that an agent's degrees of belief satisfy countable additivity, see (Seidenfeld and Schervish 1983).

4. Diachronic Dutch Book Arguments

The basic idea behind the Dutch Book argument for probabilism has been used in defense of a variety of principles that purport to govern how beliefs should evolve over time. In each case, it is argued that the agent who violates the principle is subject to a Dutch Book. Here, the bets involved are placed at different times, but there is an algorithm for placing the bets that is available at the outset guaranteeing a profit to one side. Such arguments are generally referred to as “Dutch Strategy” arguments.

4.1 Conditionalization

There is a Dutch Book (strategy) argument purporting to show that an agent ought to change beliefs by Conditionalization, which is due to Lewis (1999), but was first reported by Teller (1973). The Rule of Conditionalization states that an agent with the probability function pr1 at time t1 who learns E and nothing stronger at time t2 should obtain her new probability function pr2 from her old probability function by conditionalizing on E, i.e. for each proposition A, pr2(A) = pr1(A|E). When an agent violates this rule by adjusting her probabilities such that pr2(A) < pr1(A|E), a bookie can inflict a sure loss by first selling the agent the following three bets:

Bet 1 for pr1(AE)
$1    if AE
$0 otherwise

Bet 2 for pr1(A|E)pr1E)
$ pr1(A|E)    if ¬E
$0 otherwise

Bet 3 for [pr1(A|E) − pr2(A)]·pr1(E)
$ pr1(A|E) − pr2(A)    if E
$0 otherwise

If E is false, the agent has a net loss of [pr1(A|E) − pr2(A)] pr1(E). If E is true, then the bookie buys back a fourth bet:

Bet 4 for pr2(A)
$1    if A
$0 otherwise

Bets 1 and 2 together amount to a conditional bet on A, which is called off if E is false. In the event that E is true, this bet is bought back at the lower price of pr2(A). Bet 3 spreads the expected winnings of that exchange in order to assure a profit in the case that E is false. Thus, if E is true the agent suffers a net loss of [pr1(A|E) − pr2(A)] pr1(E). If pr2(A) > pr1(A|E), then the strategy involves reversing the direction of the above bets. Where dollars are taken as measures of utility, each bet is fair given the agent's beliefs at the time offered.

As van Fraassen points out, the betting formula above does not yield an argument for the diachronic Principle of Conditionalization as stated (van Fraassen 1989). There is no strategy for the bookie that guarantees him a profit from an agent for whom pr2(A) ≠ pr1(A|E) unless the agent makes a commitment to violate the rule in a particular way in advance. The idea that the above bets constitute a betting strategy yielding a Dutch Book tacitly assumes that the agent's deviant rule D is fixed at time t1, before it is known whether or not E is true, and that the agent is sure to follow the rule if E is learned.

However, the bookie can guarantee himself a profit in some cases even if it is not assumed that the agent will follow though by placing a side bet that he wins in the event that the agent does not change beliefs as planned. The Dutch Strategy depends upon the fact that the agent initially has some definite probability that he will shift probabilities in the event that E, in some particular way that is not the result of conditionalization on E. The Dutch Strategy argument in no way establishes that one must have such a probability, and so at most shows that one should not have a plan involving a fixed probability to update upon learning E in a way that differs from conditionalizing on E.

Even where it is assumed that an agent is fully committed to following through on some deviant rule, there are questions about what the Dutch Strategy shows. As with the basic DBA for probabilism, it is possible to devise scenarios in which it would be rational to leave oneself open to a Dutch Strategy, by announcing a deviant updating rule, and so the Dutch Strategy argument should not be taken to show that it is strictly irrational to have an updating rule other than Conditionalization. Rather, the existence of the strategy points to a tension in adopting such a rule. Shifting from pr1 to pr2 by conditionalizing on E is equivalent to invariance, i.e. for each proposition A, pr1(A|E) = pr2(A|E). Adopting a rule for updating other than Conditionalization is thus tantamount to holding at time t1 that for some A, pr1(A|E) ≠ pr2(A|E). Note that the bookie simply takes advantage of the difference between the agent's probability for A given E at t1 and at t2. Where the agent is certain at t1 that he would update via some deviant rule D, D induces a conditional probability at that time for A given E that differs from pr1(A|E). In such a case, pr2(A|E) is fixed at t1 by the agent's credal state, and so given that pr1(A|E) ≠ pr2(A|E), the agent's credences may be said to exhibit a kind of inconsistency. While this is more problematic than the sort of inconsistency involved in simply having different levels of confidence for a proposition at different times, it appears less like inconsistency for full belief than failing to obey the probability axioms, where the agent has evaluations according to which each in a set of bets is fair at a single time. While pr2(A|E) may be fixed at t1, this is not the agent's conditional probability at t1, but rather the probability for A given E that she will come to have at t2 upon learning E. Such updating plans are part of the agent's credal system though, for which Dutch Book vulnerability signals a defect. The fact that there is a converse Dutch Book argument, as Skyrms (1987b) provides, shows that the trouble is avoided by adhering to the Rule of Conditionalization, which has virtues over the sort of diminished system of beliefs that avoids inconsistency by shunning an updating rule.

4.2 Jeffrey Conditionalization

Jeffrey proposes a further Generalized Conditionalization Rule (also termed Probability Kinematics or Jeffrey Conditionalization) to cover cases in which experience does not manifest itself in some evidential proposition E shifting to one, but rather stems from a shift in probabilities over some partition {Ei}(Jeffrey 1983). Jeffrey's Rule states that pr2(A) = S pr1(A|Ei) pr2(Ei), which is equivalent to the invariance condition that pr1(A|Ei) = pr2(A|Ei), for each element Ei of the partition. To maintain that updating goes by Jeffrey Conditionalization is to mandate invariance for each proposition A. This might seem to be required, as Armendt shows that a Dutch Strategy can be constructed against an agent who has a rule for updating that conflicts with Jeffrey's Rule (Armendt 1980). As with the Rule of Conditionalization though, the Dutch Strategy does not show that there is any problem with shifting probabilities over a partition, and then abandoning one's prior conditional probabilities over that partition, that is violating invariance; the problem is with adopting a rule of this sort in advance. As with the simple Rule of Conditionalization, Skyrms (1987b) shows that there is also a converse Dutch Strategy argument showing that following Jeffrey's Rule avoids a Dutch Book. While the Rule of Conditionalization is generally presented as demanding that agents satisfy invariance for each proposition, and various authors have rightly complained that this demands an unreasonable rigidity of belief (Bacchus, Kyburg, and Thalos 1990; Levi 2002), Jeffrey does not treat the condition as a strict requirement on rational belief change (Jeffrey 2004). He leaves open the possibility that when probabilities are shifted over a partition, the conditional probabilities could change, although this leaves the unanswered question as to when invariance is reasonable to assume. In any case, as with the Simple Rule of Conditionalization, the Dutch Strategy argument here tells in the same way against planned violations of invariance.

4.3 The Principle of Reflection

A Dutch Strategy argument has also been given for the controversial Principle of Reflection, which requires that for any proposition A and any future time t, an agent's current probability for A conditional on later assigning it probability r is itself r, that is pr (A|prt(A) = r) = r. In violating Reflection, the agent fails to endorse certain of her possible future judgments, which as van Fraassen showed (van Fraassen 1984), opens the door to a Dutch Strategy. If the agent violates Reflection in that pr(A|prt(A) = r) > r, the bookie sells the following bets:

Bet 1 for pr(A ∧ prt(A) = r)
1    if (A ∧ prt(A) = r)
$0 otherwise

Bet 2 for x pr(prt(A)≠r)
x    if prt(A)≠r
$0 otherwise

Bet 3 for (xr) pr(prt(A) = r)
xr    if prt(A) = r
$0 otherwise

where x = pr(A | prt(A = r)).

In the event that prt(A) = r, the bookie then buys a fourth bet from the agent on A with a prize of 1, with a price of the agent's new probability.

The idea that the existence of such a strategy shows that agents should satisfy Reflection has been widely disputed, even by many who take the Dutch Book arguments for probabilism and conditionalization as having force. Much of the discussion stems from a variety of counterexamples to Reflection in which it actually appears irrational not to violate the principle. One example, due to Talbott, turns on the fact that real agents lack perfect recall (Talbott 1991). He considers a person who had spaghetti (S) the previous night, say November 16, and contemplates the probability that she will give to her having eaten spaghetti on that day in year's time. Since she eats spaghetti on average one out of every ten days, she thinks it likely that prt(S) = 0.1. But surely she should not assign a probability of 0.1 to her having had spaghetti the previous night conditional on the claim that prt(S) = 0.1, since she is nearly certain (say prt(S) = 0.99) of what she had for dinner the previous night.

The forgetting that makes it reasonable to violate Reflection in Talbott's spaghetti dinner example involves one type of limited future impairment. Christensen gives a different case in which an agent has just consumed a mind-altering drug (LSQ) that he expects in hour's time will make him believe that he can fly, without conferring upon him any such power (Christensen 1991). However, this is the only effect of the drug, so that the agent's faculties will remain otherwise acute. Before the drug takes effect, the agent should not take his probability that he can fly conditional on his coming to believe it in an hour to be high, as required by Reflection, because what he will think when under the influence is irrelevant to his ability to fly. A similar example involving Ulysses and Sirens is discussed by van Fraassen (1995).

It is important in both of these examples that it is not only reasonable to violate Reflection, but that to do otherwise would involve failing to properly account for the evidence about the unreliability of one's future beliefs. Christensen's own response involves arguing that because the bets in Diachronic Dutch Book arguments are made over time, unlike in the synchronic argument for the probability axioms, they do not reveal a form of inconsistency that is generally irrational. One of several troubles with this is that it would require rejecting the claim that the Dutch Strategy against agents who plan to violate conditionalization reveals any sort of problematic inconsistency. Other problems with Christensen's response are discussed in (Vineberg 1997).

Others have tried to respond to the counterexamples by distinguishing features of the Dutch Strategy argument for Reflection that do not involve dismissing all diachronic Dutch Book arguments. For instance, Hitchcock emphasizes that it is important to consider what the bookie knows in assessing the relevance of Dutch Books on an agent's rationality (Hitchcock 2004). He observes that unlike the case in which an agent violates the probability axioms, and the bookie can determine and place the bets with only the knowledge of the agent's beliefs, in Talbott's example, the bookie may need to exploit information that is unavailable to the agent in order to make the Dutch Book. If the agent indeed forgets what she had for dinner after a year, it can reasonably be assumed that she has also forgotten making the initial bets in the bookie's strategy, for otherwise she could figure out what her previous belief was on November 17 for having eaten spaghetti the night before. In this case, the bookie only knows to make the appropriate follow-up bet, because he retains this information about the bets, which the agent lacks. Hitchcock concludes that, at least in such cases of forgetting, the Dutch Strategy does not show that agents should satisfy Reflection, since the bookie cannot be assured of making a profit without calling upon knowledge not possessed by the agent.

Taking into account what a bookie needs to know in order to guarantee himself a profit fails to distinguish adequately between the Dutch Books that appear to be norms of rationality and those that do not. First, as Hitchcock acknowledges, this won't work to resolve the tension between the Dutch Strategy argument for Reflection and many of the other counterexamples. In Christensen's example, taking LSQ does not have any effect on memory, it merely changes the agent's evaluation of his ability to fly, that is, he changes his view of a very limited bit of evidence, so that the Dutch Strategy can be carried out without the bookie having relevant information that the agent does not.

Still, perhaps we might take the fact that book can be made without having knowledge beyond that of the agent as at least a necessary condition for a telling book. Various cases, besides that of the spaghetti dinner, give plausibility to the idea that a Dutch Book only establishes the unreasonableness of violating a particular principle when the book is made with no special knowledge not possessed by the agent. Consider an agent who violates the probability axioms in virtue of failing to recognize some complicated logical truth. Arguably this is not unreasonable, and setting up a Dutch Book in this case would require knowledge that the agent lacks. But, insofar as the irrationality in violating the axioms stems from the fact that it is supposed to be a form of inconsistency, as both Hitchcock and Christensen maintain, then the fact that a bookie might need (logical) knowledge that the agent lacks in order to set up the book, is irrelevant to whether the book has force. Whether an agent's beliefs are inconsistent, unlike the question of whether she is to be regarded as reasonable, is independent of what she or anybody else knows. The distinguishing feature of a Dutch Book is that it involves a sure loss to the agent who accepts the bets. As previously observed, there is some question about exactly what is to count as a sure loss, but in a proper Dutch Book the loss does not depend upon which contingent propositions are true. The agent who violates the probability axioms, plans to violate Conditionalization or violates Reflection, and whose beliefs are appropriately associated with her preferences, is subject to such a loss from bets that can be fixed on the basis of the agent's credences, and it is this fact that establishes such violations as internal defects in the agent's belief system. Whether or not an actual bookie would need special knowledge to detect such a defect, set up the bets, and carry them out, so as to assure himself a profit is irrelevant; it is the existence of the bets that indicates the problem.

Although vulnerability to a proper Dutch Book is a mark of an internal defect in the agent's beliefs, Briggs draws a distinction between Dutch Books that reveal what she terms incoherence, which she takes to include those against violators of the probability axioms and Conditionalization, and those against violators of Reflection, which involve self-doubt (Briggs 2009). ‘Incoherence’ here does not mean susceptibility to a Dutch Book, since in that sense violators of Reflection are incoherent. Although she does not give a precise definition, the term carries the sense of ‘inconsistency’. What is claimed then is that judging as fair those bets that lead to a Dutch Book does not always involve genuine inconsistency. This is welcome in that there are differing degrees of plausibility that the various norms for which DBA's can be constructed are consistency constraints. While the basic axioms of probability seem reasonably regarded in this way, this is much less clear for countable additivity, Reflection, and various other principles, whose violation leaves one open to a Dutch Book. Exactly what incoherence in Briggs' sense comes to, and its relation to the ordinary notion of consistency, is unclear though, particularly since she, along with others, seems to take the Dutch Strategy argument as establishing the full principle of Conditionalization, when in fact it at most tells against adopting a deviant rule in advance. But even for those violations of Conditionalization for which there is a Dutch Strategy, it is unclear that this is due to inconsistency in precisely the same sense as may be said to be involved in violations of the probability axioms.

5. Other Dutch Book Arguments

5.1 Sleeping Beauty

An interesting application of Dutch Strategy arguments has been made by Hitchcock to the perplexing Sleeping Beauty problem (Hitchcock 2004). In the problem, Beauty is to undergo an experiment in which she will be put to sleep on Sunday night, after which a fair coin will be tossed. If it comes up heads, she will be awakened just once for a short time on Monday, and if tails she will also be awakened again on Tuesday. In each case, after being awakened, she will be put back to sleep with drugs that will erase her memory of having been awake. Beauty is aware of these facts about the experiment, so that when she wakes up within the experiment, she will not know whether it is Monday or Tuesday. The problem is to determine what her probability should be for heads upon awakening. Elga introduced the problem into the philosophical literature (Elga 2000), and argued that upon awakening Beauty should shift her probability from the value of 1/2 that she assigned on Sunday night to 1/3. Lewis argued shortly thereafter that Beauty's probability upon awakening should remain at 1/2 (Lewis 2001), and additional arguments have followed on both sides. Hitchcock shows that there is a Dutch Strategy against either answer, but then argues that there is only force to the one against the agent who sticks with 1/2.

The strategies serve as potential counterarguments to the two ways of answering the problem, rather than showing that one is irrational for switching to 1/3 or sticking with 1/2 per se, since the individual strategies depend upon the plan to have a particular probability upon awakening. If Beauty plans to switch to probability 1/3 for heads, the Dutch Strategy is just an application of the general strategy against someone who violates Reflection. Hitchcock argues that this would not establish Beauty's irrationality, since in this case the bookie must know during the experiment what day it is in order to implement the strategy, which is information that Beauty lacks. On the other hand, if Beauty sticks with 1/2, a strategy can be carried out without the bookie having to know more than Beauty by having the bookie undergo the experiment with her and offer a bet against heads on Sunday and a bet on heads whenever Beauty and the bookie awake within the experiment. If the coin lands heads, the bookie sells Beauty just one bet on heads, with her gain totaling less than her loss on the first bet against heads. If the coin lands tails, the bookie sells a bet on heads once on Monday and the same bet again on Tuesday, so as to again produce a loss for Beauty. Hitchcock takes this book to tell against the answer 1/2, and in favor of 1/3.

One trouble with defending the answer of 1/3 in this way is that what a bookie must know to assure himself a profit does not characterize what is essential to a proper Dutch Book. There is also a particular reason to suppose that Beauty's predicament is one in which reasonable degrees of belief and betting quotients can come apart, because the third bet needed to make book in the switching case is only offered when it is sure to be a losing bet (discussed in Vineberg 2004—see the Other Internet Resources, and Bradley and Leitgeb 2006). In this case the bookie exploits features of the experiment, so that the strategy can be carried out without his possessing knowledge of the day. But the fact that the bets leading to book are triggered by the circumstances, suggests that it is not just Beauty's beliefs on which the strategy depends, and hence the loss does not reflect a purely internal defect, despite the fact that the bookie can implement the strategy without having access during the experiment to knowledge that Beauty lacks.

5.2 Concentration of Opinion

Suppose that an agent's probability function is not concentrated at finitely many points. Such a state of opinion, in which the agent does not rule out all but a finite number of possibilities, seems entirely reasonable, yet assuming that an agent's utilities are unbounded, McGee shows that there is an infinite series of bets, each with positive expected value, which together assure a loss (McGee 1999). Surely having one's opinion concentrated at finitely many points is not a requirement of consistency. Taking it to be reasonable to violate this condition, McGee calls into question the adequacy of the decision theoretic framework that his Dutch Book argument presumes.

6. Conclusion

It remains defensible that the Dutch Book argument shows that the probability axioms are something like consistency constraints on partial belief, at least given some substantial decision-theoretic assumptions, unlike the idea that their violation is a pragmatic liability. But this interpretation is less successful for the various other norms for which Dutch Book arguments have been constructed. The Dutch Strategy arguments for the Principle of Conditionalization and for Jeffrey's Rule do not fully support the norms, but only the weaker claim that one should not commit in advance to following an alternative rule, and the sense in which it may be said to be inconsistent to do so seems different from what is involved in violating the axioms. The other claims considered here for which Dutch Book arguments have been constructed are even less plausibly regarded as consistency constraints, and thus seem to be a different sort of requirement on ideal rationality. But it is the idea that violation of the probability axioms involves inconsistent evaluations that supports retention of the probabilist's thesis that they are norms of rationality, despite recognition that violating the axioms is not necessarily a pragmatic defect. What is needed is to identify ‘consistency’ with a narrower set of conditions than mere Dutch Book vulnerability, if we are not to abandon the idea of the probability axioms as a consistency constraint that extends the ordinary concept and, perhaps, the DBA altogether. A more fine-grained analysis of the various Dutch Books might yield a way of marking off those that point to genuine inconsistency from those exhibiting some other sort of defect. Briggs takes a step in this direction, although she does not pinpoint the kind of inconsistency at stake, and her strategy won't help to distinguish the Dutch Book argument for the basic probability axioms from those for countable additivity and concentration of opinion. But something of this sort is needed, if Ramsey's basic idea that a Dutch Book argument can support probabilism is to be retained.


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Special thanks to Branden Fitelson, Alan Hájek, and an anonymous SEP referee for their helpful comments on previous drafts of this article. Thanks are also due to my colleagues, Eric Hiddleston, Gregory Novack, and Larry Powers, for their discussions with me about Dutch Book arguments.