Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Disability: Definitions, Models, Experience

1. We use the terms “disabled people” and “people with disabilities” interchangeably. We recognize that this may be controversial, and we want to be clear that in using “people with disabilities,” we do not endorse the view that disabilities should be understood as an attribute of the individual—any more than in using the term “disabled people,” we endorse the view that people are defined by their disabilities.

2. For a dialogue on just this topic between two philosophers, one of whom has a disability, see the correspondence between Magee and Milligan (1995).

3. Whether they hold a medical or social approach to disability, many scholars would agree that time with disability affects the disability experience. Some writers on “quality of life” differentiate between the “coping” of people who grow up with impairments from childhood and the “loss,” “adaptation,” and “adjustment” of people who acquire their impairments later in life (Shakespeare, 2006; Brock 2005). However, it is important to note that first-person accounts of living with disability do not always support these claims. Asch and Sacks (1983) reviewed scores of autobiographical books on blindness and did not find a close correlation between time of onset and attitude toward disability.