Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Epistemic Contextualism

1. For other useful overviews of some of the history leading up to EC, to which the discussion of this section is indebted, see Pryor 2001, DeRose 1999, and the opening pages of Sosa 1988.

2. See DeRose 1999 on the distinction between ‘subject’ and ‘attributor contextualism’.

3. For some discussion of these two forms of contextualism, as well as the possible relation(s) between the two, see Pritchard 2002.

4. For present purposes, we may move freely between speaking of a sentence's truth conditions and what proposition it expresses.

5. ‘Invariantism’ and its cognates are due to Unger (1984): one is an invariantist (with respect to a given class of statements) just in case one rejects contextualism (with respect to statements of that class).

6. By this principle, if S knows that p and that p entails q, then S knows that q. (Further refinements are needed, but they are not essential here.) For some discussion, see Luper 2006.

7. Though contextualists are generally aligned on these points, there are some exceptions: while DeRose thinks that denying closure, à la Nozick, e.g., forces one to embrace certain “abominable conjunctions” (1995, 27-9), and while Cohen regards the closure principle as “axiomatic” (Cohen 1999, 68), Mark Heller (1999a) is notable amongst current contextualists for recommending that closure be abandoned. (For one critical reaction to Heller's arguments, see Pritchard 2000.)

8. In his earlier papers — most notably, his 1988 — Cohen cast his view in the language of RA theories. In his more recent work, however, he has preferred to detach EC from “the relevant alternatives machinery,” as he puts it (1999, 85, n. 25).

9. While his 1996 paper has received much more attention in recent discussions of EC, Lewis had put forward what is, in its main contours, much the same view in his 1979 paper. There, he argued that our conversations are governed by certain ‘rules of accommodation’, the “general scheme” for which is as follows: “If at time t something is said that requires component sn of conversational score to have a value in the range r if what is said to be true, or otherwise acceptable; and if sn does not have a value in the range r just before t; and if such-and-such further conditions hold; then at t the score-component sn takes some value in the range r” (1979, 240). Applied to the sceptical case, this rule has a predictable result: “The commonsensical epistemologist says: ‘I know the cat is in the carton — there he is before my eyes — I just can't be wrong about that!’ The sceptic replies: ‘You might be the victim of a deceiving demon.’ Thereby he brings into consideration possibilities hitherto ignored, else what he says would be false. The boundary shifts outward so that what he says is true. Once the boundary is shifted, the commonsensical epistemologist must concede defeat” (ibid., 247).

10. Rieber's views bear some obvious affinities to Jonathan Schaffer's contrastivism (see Section 6, below), which is often treated as an alternative to standards forms of EC. Nevertheless, Rieber's theory is included here for the sake of completeness.

11. Here, what Rieber says about the application of his account to Dretske's (1970) zoo case (1998, 196-197) is being extended to the sceptical argument at hand.

12. Another, similar example which has gotten a lot of attention is DeRose's (1992) Bank Case. Because, as both Bach (2005) and Brown (2006) note, self-attributions of knowledge may not be the best cases on which to focus (see too DeRose 2005, 181-183), we shall here consider Cohen's third-personal airport example.

13. DeRose has recently stressed that it is only in the right kind of case (or paired cases) that the contextualist will (or should) claim that the relevant sentences are not conflicting — the parties to the respective utterances must reasonably differ in their epistemic standards, most plausibly because of differences in their practical concerns, and there must be no “arm-twisting, arguing or convincing” between those parties, but only each of the two speakers' ‘informing’ their respective interlocutors that the subject does/doesn't know (2006, Section 1; 2005, Sections 3-4). Cohen's airport case, for instance, seems to fit this description. And, of course, there must be some such cases for there to be the sort of evidence for contextualism currently under consideration.

14. Jonathan Vogel (1990) and more recently John Hawthorne (2004) have both argued that ‘the lottery paradox’ illustrates a problem which generalizes to all sorts of other cases — the airport example being, once again, one illustration of that fact.

15. Other grounds for dissatisfaction with a contextualism-based response to scepticism have been lodged — for example, that it is not well-positioned to explain the plausibility (to many) of certain anti-sceptical claims (e.g., Sosa 2000, 15), that it is not obviously applicable to certain other forms of sceptical arguments (e.g., Feldman 2001, 78ff.; Cohen replies at 2001, 96), or that it makes certain true “knowledge” propositions inexpressible (e.g., Brady and Pritchard 2005, 164). See too Section 6 of ‘Knowledge and Skepticism’, the Supplement to Steup 2006.

16. For instance: “[O]ur new solution [to SA] is designed largely with the goal in mind of crediting most of our attributions of knowledge with truth. And no wonder. We take it as a strike against a theory of a common term of a natural language that it involves the speakers of that language in systematic and widespread falsehood in their use of that term” (DeRose 1995, 46); “Contextualist solutions enjoy one advantage over non-contextualist solutions: they avoid implausible commitment to the falsity of any of the claims comprised in the puzzle” (Neta 2002, 665).

17. At a couple of points, Cohen suggests that the only error the contextualist need impute concerns speakers' ‘meta-judgments’ (2005a, 58, 60; 2001, 89). But, as Bach says (2005, 67, n. 23), it is implausible that such errors could exist in isolation from errors at the object level.

18. One might well wonder whether such ‘relativity’ is really semantic — whether what is said contains, as Hofweber suggests, an ‘unarticulated constituent’ corresponding to one's geographic location, as opposed to that location's being among the very many things one ‘presupposes’, knowingly or otherwise, in saying “August is a summer month” (see, e.g., Searle's (1980) views on ‘the Background’). But we can leave that point aside.

19. Our seeming resistance to such attempts at explicit relativization should be measured against the data Ludlow (2005) presents, discussed briefly in the next Section.

20. While stating that there are other terms — “‘rich’, ‘wise’, ‘tall’, bald’, ‘hot’, etc.” — which would serve just as well (2001, 97, n. 11), the comparison with ‘flat’ is the one Cohen most often uses.

21. The discussion here is restricted to a consideration of ‘classical’ or ‘insensitive’ invariantist proposals, as opposed to the ‘subject sensitive’ variety described in Section 6, below.

22. There are differences among these views; here, one sample elaboration of the general approach is rehearsed.

23. The exact formulation of fallibilism remains somewhat controversial. Stanley (2005: 127) defines fallibilism as “the doctrine that someone can know that p, even though their evidence for p is logically consistent with the truth of not-p”; Cohen (1988) defines it as the view that one can know on the basis of non-entailing reasons. For some nice discussion of fallibilism, see Feldman 1981.

24. The idea can be found, in various forms, in, e.g., Austin 1946, 77; Moore 1993, 277; Williams 2001, 149; Recanati 1986, 219; Alston 2000, esp. 63; Brandom 1994, 203-204; Unger 1975, 252ff; and DeRose 2002. See too the further references given in the latter's note 20, as well as Section 3 of Adler 2006a.