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Callicles and Thrasymachus

First published Wed Aug 11, 2004; substantive revision Thu Oct 27, 2011

Callicles and Thrasymachus are the two great exemplars in Plato — in all of philosophy — of contemptuous challenge to conventional morality. In the Gorgias and Book I of the Republic respectively, they denounce the virtue of justice, dikaiosunê, as an artificial brake on self-interest, a sham to be seen through by the wise. Together, Thrasymachus and Callicles have fallen into the folk mythology of moral philosophy as ‘the immoralist’ (or ‘amoralist’). This is perhaps not quite the right word, but it is useful to have a label for their common challenge — more generally, for the figure who demands a reason to abide by moral constraints, and denies that this demand can be met.[1] Because of this shared agenda, and because Socrates' refutation of Callicles can be read as a sketchy, perhaps deliberately unsatisfying rehearsal for the Republic, it is tempting to assume that the two figures represent a single philosophical position. But in fact, Callicles and Thrasymachus are by no means interchangeable; and the differences between them provide an important case study both for Plato's methods and for the philosophical options open to the ‘immoralist’. This article discusses these two figures strictly as characters in Plato's fiction, with occasional reference to a third Platonic position, the speech of Glaucon in Republic Book II, and to the sophist Antiphon as a real-life counterpart (and perhaps the historical original) of all three. Thrasymachus was a real person, a famous rhetorician of whose views we know little; of Callicles we know nothing, and he may even be Plato's invention.[2] The discussion focusses on the two positions in their own right, and their significance for Plato; Socrates' arguments against them will be discussed only insofar as they clarify what Callicles and Thrasymachus themselves have to say.

1. Justice

What exactly is it that both Thrasymachus and Callicles reject? Greek handily distinguishes between ‘justice’ as a virtue [dikaiosunê] and the abstractions ‘justice’ [dikê, sometimes personified as a goddess] or ‘the just’ [to dikaion, the neuter form of the adjective ‘just’, masc. dikaios]. The history of these concepts is complex, and it would be wrong to assume that Greek moral concepts were ever neatly defined or uncontested. Still, Hesiod's Works and Days (c. 700 B.C.E.), a very early and canonical text for traditional Greek moral thought, provides a useful baseline for later debates. Hesiod does not define justice, but the injustices he denounces include bribery, oath-breaking, perjury, theft, fraud, and the rendering of crooked verdicts by judges. There are two kinds of underlying unity to this list, each of which relates justice to another central concept in ancient Greek ethics. First, all such actions are prohibited by nomos. This crucial term may be translated either ‘law’ or ‘convention’, depending on the context; nomoi include not only written statutes but unwritten laws and traditional, socially enforced norms of behavior. Hesiod's just man is above all a law-abiding one, and the association of justice and nomos runs deep in Greek thinking. However, nomos is also an ambiguous and open-ended concept: in the fifth century B.C.E. sophistic thinkers come to use it with the very different sense of mere convention — or, as we might now say, social construction. The second common denominator of Hesiodic injustice is that unjust actions are ones typically prompted by pleonexia, best translated ‘greed’ (see Balot 2001). The unjust man is motivated by the desire to have more [pleon echein]: more than he has, more than his neighbor has, more than he is entitled to, and, ultimately, all there is to get. These polarities of the lawful/unlawful and the restrained/greedy are later used by Aristotle to structure his discussion of justice in Nicomachean Ethics V, which is in many ways a rational reconstruction of traditional Greek ideas.

Hesiod also sets out the origins, authority and rewards of justice. Here he is explicit:

The son of Kronos [i.e., Zeus] has set down this law [nomos] for human beings:
Fish and animals and winged birds
Eat each other, since there is no justice [dikê] among them.
But to humans he has given justice, which turns out the best
By far. And if one knows and is willing to proclaim what is just,
Zeus far-sounding gives him wealth. (Works and Days 276-81)

Justice derives from nomos in the sense of a divinely ordained Law; and Hesiod emphasises that Zeus' laws are reliably enforced. Punishment may not be visited directly on the unjust individual, however: rather, a whole city suffers for the injustice of its leaders, and retribution may fall on a man's descendants. Hesiod does seem at one point to waver, and allows that if the wicked go unpunished, we would not have good reason to be just (270–3). Doubts about the reliability of divine rewards and punishments are later an important part of the backdrop to the immoralist challenge; in Republic Book II, Adeimantus complains that the poets are inconsistent on this point, and anyway the rewards and punishments they promise do not show what is good and bad about justice and injustice in themselves (362d-367e).

Hesiod represents only one side of early Greek moral thought. The other foundational poet of the Greek tradition, Homer, has less to say explicitly about justice; more important for later debates is his broader conception of aretê, which can be equally well translated ‘virtue’ or ‘excellence’. Justice is understood to be a part of aretê; or, as we would say, it is a virtue. More particularly it is the virtue governing social interactions and good citizenship or leadership. In the world of the Iliad and Odyssey, aretê is understood as that set of skills and aptitudes which enables someone — paradigmatically, a noble warrior — to function successfully in his social role. The key virtues of the Homeric warrior are courage and practical intelligence, which enable him to be an effective ‘speaker of words and doer of deeds’.[3]

Now this ‘functional’ conception of virtue, as we may call it, can easily come into conflict with Hesiodic ideas about justice. In Plato's Meno, Meno holds an updated version of the functional conception, claiming that a man's virtue consists in the political ability to harm one's enemies and help one's friends, without incurring harm to oneself (71e). Such a view would have been at least intelligible to Homer's warriors; but it seems to involve giving up on Hesiodic principles of justice. When acting as a judge, does the virtuous man give verdicts in accordance with the law, or does he give whatever verdicts (‘crooked’ ones by Hesiod's standards) will help his friends?

Thus Plato's characters inherit a complex moral tradition, in which the concept of justice is shaped by conflicting pressures. Fifth-century Greek moral debate is powerfully shaped by the struggles of various thinkers to reconcile these ‘functional’ and ‘Hesiodic’ ideas about the virtues (see Adkins 1960). And the Gorgias and Book I of the Republic take care to locate Callicles and Thrasymachus in just this context. In the Gorgias, Socrates' first interlocutor is the rhetorician Gorgias, who is led into self-contradiction by his unclarity on the question of whether his profession includes the teaching and practice of justice. His student Polus repudiates Gorgias' pretensions to justice, and claims that while it may be more admirable than injustice, injustice is more beneficial to its practitioner. Socrates shows that Polus' position too is ultimately incoherent, and thus the stage is set for Callicles to reject justice (as conventionally understood) altogether, arguing that it is neither admirable nor beneficial. The Republic depicts a strikingly similar dialectical progression, again from age to youth and from respectability to ruthlessness. It begins with a discussion between Socrates and the elderly, decent-seeming businessman Cephalus, who offers (or at any rate assents to Socrates' suggestion of) a markedly ‘Hesiodic’ account of justice as telling the truth and returning what one owes (331c). But Cephalus' son Polemarchus, on ‘inheriting’ the argument, glosses returning what one owes in Meno-esque terms: justice is rendering help to one's friends and harm to one's enemies (332a-b). We seem to move in one fell swoop from Hesiod to a degenerate version of the ‘functional’ conception, expressive of Athenian politics in an era of brutal, almost gangster-like factional strife. Thus the Gorgias and Book I of the Republic both reveal a society in some moral disorder: they use generational change to dramatize moral conflict and instability, and perhaps a decline of traditional values. In both cases the upshot, to which Socrates must respond, is a fully formed challenge to commonplace conceptions of justice. Justice cannot be at the same time (1) the Hesiodic virtue of the good neighbour and solid citizen, involving obedience to law and the restraint of pleonexia, and (2) a part of aretê functionally understood, in a society in which pleonexia and law-breaking (or self-serving lawmaking) may be key strategies for political and financial success. Moreover, from the point of view of the functional conception, it is unclear why (1) picks out anything valuable — anything deserving the name of a virtue — at all.

2. Thrasymachus on Justice

Though the Gorgias was almost certainly written first of the two dialogues, Thrasymachus is the simpler figure with which to begin. His position is foreshadowed by his behavior: he enters the discussion "like a wild beast about to spring" (336b5–6; tr. Grube-Reeve 1992 here and throughout, sometimes with minor revisions), and this tone of impatient aggression is sustained throughout his discussion with Socrates. Yet despite his eagerness for debate, Thrasymachus, a professional sophist, withholds his definition of justice until Socrates' other interlocutors have promised him payment for it. So from the very start, Thrasymachus is depicted as torn between the characteristic drives of the two lower parts of the soul identified in Book IV of the Republic: the appetitive part [epithumêtikon], which lusts after money, and the spirited part [thumos], which loves competition and victory. Though he proves quite a wily debater, Thrasymachus' reasoning abilities are used only as a means to these other, non-rational ends. And this relegation of rationality to a strictly instrumental role is, as we discover in Book IV, constitutive of injustice as Plato understands it.

Thrasymachus eventually proposes a resounding slogan: “Justice is nothing other than the advantage of the stronger” (338c2–3). He explains that each kind of regime (democratic, oligarchic, and so on) makes laws in the interest of the ruling party in it (the mass of poor people in a democracy, or the rich in an oligarchy). “And they declare what they have made — what is to their own advantage — to be just for their subjects…. This, then, is what I say justice is, the same in all cities, the advantage of the established regime” (338e-339a). Thanks to this gloss of the ‘stronger’ in terms of the ruling power, Thrasymachus' position has often been interpreted as a form of ‘conventionalism’: justice in a given community is whatever the laws of that community dictate (i.e., so he cynically explains, whatever serves the ruling party's interests). This conventionalist reading of Thrasymachus is not quite right, but it makes a convenient starting point for seeing what he does have in mind. The conventionalist position can be seen as a more formal version of the Hesiodic association of just behavior with law-abidingness, and does not necessarily involve the cynical spin that Thrasymachus gives it: in Xenophon's Memorabilia, Socrates himself argues that the lawful [nomimon] and the just [dikaion] are the same (IV 4). Closer to Thrasymachus in spirit is the conventionalism to be found in the surviving fragments of On Truth by the sophist Antiphon. According to Antiphon, "Justice [dikaiosunê], therefore, is not violating the rules [nomima] of the city in which one is a citizen" (tr. Gagarin and Woodruff 1995). Antiphon goes on to contrast these rules of justice, which frustrate our nature and are only erratically enforced, with the authoritative laws of nature [phusis]. (This contrast between nomos and phusis is crucial to Callicles' position; it is often, and plausibly, taken as central to sophistic thought: see below Section 4.)

Thrasymachus lacks the theoretical framework by which Antiphon makes his case, making no use of the concept of nature. Moreover, on closer examination, his slogan, ‘Justice is nothing other than the advantage of the rulers’, does not really look like conventionalism after all. For Thrasymachus treats it as interchangeable not only with ‘Justice is the advantage of the stronger’, but with a third slogan: ‘Justice is the advantage of another person’ (343c). Interpreters have debated about how, if at all, these slogans can be reconciled, since they are far from being equivalent (see Chappell 1993). For instance, what if I am the stronger: does just behaviour on my part serve ‘another’ or myself? Worse, if either ‘the advantage of the stronger’ or ‘the advantage of the ruler’ is taken strictly as a general definition, then the self-serving behavior of a rapacious tyrant would have to count as just; but Thrasymachus, in conformity to normal usage, describes the tyrant as perfectly unjust (344a-c) – and praises him for being so.

The solution to the puzzle is straightforward. Thrasymachus does not intend his slogans as general definitions — nor as affirmations of conventionalism, though he may hope that they will inherit some plausibility from the superficial resemblance to that popular view. Rather, the slogans describe what Thrasymachus sees as the standard effects of just behavior, assuming the traditional Hesiodic understanding of what justice is (i.e., obedience to nomos and restraint of pleonexia). Thrasymachus aims not to replace or revise that traditional conception, introduced earlier by Cephalus as the baseline for the discussion, but rather to offer a cynical commentary on justice so understood. The man who does as Hesiod commends serves the powers that be; more generally, by passing up opportunities for self-enrichment, he serves anyone else who willing and able to (as we still say) take advantage of him. Combined with this point about the effects of justice is an equally cynical thesis about the language of ‘justice’: namely that one important way in which the politically strong take advantage of the weak is by manipulatively attaching a self-serving sense to this powerful term.

In sum, Thrasymachus' agenda is to assert two debunking theses, one about the effects of justice and one about the use of the term ‘justice’: his concern is less with philosophical analysis than sociology. That is why he begins like a good social scientist, claiming to discern the underlying unity behind superficially diverse phenomena: laws differ from polis to polis, depending on the nature of the regime in force, but really they are everywhere the same in serving the powers that be (338e). Hence too his proclamation that justice is ‘nothing other’ than the advantage of the stronger: the locution is one of cynical debunking, marking his own view as a ‘seeing-through’ and demystification.

However, this debunking is not, and could not be, grounded purely on philosophically neutral ‘sociological’ observation. Thrasymachus is relying on a further pair of assumptions, which we can also find on display in other sophistic and contemporary texts. One is that wealth and power, and the pleasures they can afford, are the goods in relation to which our ‘advantage’ must be assessed. The other is that these goods are zero-sum: for one member of a community to have more of them is for another to have less. That is why my justice, which involves respecting the property and political rights of others, serves the ‘good’, ‘advantage’, and ‘happiness’ (all equivalent terms in this context) of other people and not my own (343b-344c). Only given these assumptions do Thrasymachus' debunking theses capture the most important facts about justice, as he clearly thinks they do. Indeed his boldest, albeit implicit claim is that there is nothing more to be said about it — no other level of analysis worth pursuing, such as the impact of justice on one's psychological state, or on one's relations with other people or with the gods.

This conception of the good in turn shapes Thrasymachus' assumptions about rationality. The intelligent man for him is one who, recognising these ‘facts,’ acts clear-sightedly to obtain his own advantage. When Socrates asks whether, then, he holds that justice is a vice, Thrasymachus instead defines it as an intellectual failing: “No, just very high-minded simplicity,” while injustice is “good judgment” and is to be “included with virtue and wisdom” (348c-e). This conception of rationality as the clear-eyed pursuit of one's own good is also expressed in Thrasymachus' conception of the ‘real ruler’.

This ideal of the ‘real ruler’ only emerges as part of Thrasymachus' position under interrogation by Socrates. Given Thrasymachus' apparently conflicting slogans, Socrates has no difficulty in opening with a classic elenchus — that is, a refutation which elicits a contradiction from the interlocutor's own beliefs (339b-340b). This employs three putatively Thrasymachean premises: (1) to do what the rulers prescribe is just; (2) to do what is to the rulers' advantage is just; (3) sometimes rulers prescribe what is not to their advantage. It follows that (4) in some cases, it is both just and unjust to do as the rulers prescribe. On the assumption that nothing can be both just and unjust, one of claims (1)-(3) must be given up. It comes as a bit of a surprise that Thrasymachus chooses to repudiate (3), which seems to be a matter of obvious fact, rather than (2). Plato emphasises the point by having Cleitophon and Polemarchus recapitulate the argument, with the former charitably suggesting that Thrasymachus meant that the just is whatever the stronger decrees thinking it is to his advantage (in effect, an amendment to (2) which would remove the contradiction): a solution which Thrasymachus vehemently rejects (340a-c). Instead, he affirms that, ‘strictly speaking’, no ruler ever errs. His point is that a ruler is a practitioner of a craft [technê], like a doctor; when in premises (1) and (2) he speaks of the ruler it is precisely or ‘in the strict sense’. And this expert ruler qua ruler by definition acts as his craft demands.

Thrasymachus, it turns out, is passionately committed to this ideal of the rational ruler ‘in the strict sense’, construed as the intelligently exploitative tyrant, and Socrates' arguments against him soon zero in on it. Moreover, the ideal of the rational ruler is the keystone of Plato's own political philosophy, soon to be elaborated as the ‘philosopher-king’ of Republic V-VII (and again later in his dialogue Statesman). So it is very striking that it is first introduced in the Republic not as a Socratic but a Thrasymachean concept. Plato thus seems to mark it as an idea appropriated from the sophistic enemy; it is at any rate a precious piece of common ground which can provide a starting-point for argument.

Before turning briefly to Socrates' counterarguments, it is worth asking what Thrasymachus' ideal of the ‘ruler in the strict sense’ adds to his account of justice. It seems to confirm that he is no conventionalist, since that view involves treating all recognised laws as equal while on Thrasymachus' account not every ruler or act of legislation counts as the real thing. More problematically, Thrasymachus' glorification of tyranny renders retroactively ambiguous his slogan, ‘Justice is the advantage of the stronger’. His praise of the expert tyrant (343b-c) suggests that, in addition to the debunking theses noted earlier, this slogan may also stand for a revisionist normative claim: that is, it really is right and proper, part of the due order of things, for the strong to take advantage of the weak. This is precisely the claim that, as we will see, is expressed in the Gorgias by Callicles' theory of ‘natural justice’. If Thrasymachus too means to make this claim then he, like Callicles, evidently has what we may call a moral world-view — a view, that is, about how the world ought to be. (This is one reason why the label ‘immoralism’ is probably not quite right for either of them.) However, as we have seen, Thrasymachus only flirts with the revision of ordinary moral language which this view would imply; when Socrates suggests that according to him justice is a vice and injustice a virtue, he at first attempts to eschew such moral categories altogether (348c-d). This hesitation seems to mark Thrasymachus as caught in a delicate and unstable dialectical way-station: his debunking comes ‘in between’ conventionalism and a full-blown Calliclean reversal of moral values, marking a point at which the traditional language of ‘justice’ has been challenged and demystified, but no satisfactory way to redeploy it has been found.

3. Socrates vs. Thrasymachus[4]

After the opening elenchus which elicits Thrasymachus' ideal of the real ruler, Socrates offers a series of five arguments, of which the first three revolve around the shared hypothesis that ruling is a craft [technê]. Socrates' first argument (341b-342e) is that real crafts, such as medicine, are disinterested, serving some good distinct from the good of the practitioner: the end served by the doctor qua doctor is the health of the patient. So Thrasymachus' selfish tyrant cannot be practising a craft; the real ruler properly understood is the one who expertly serves his weaker subjects. This argument is bitterly resisted by Thrasymachus (343a-345e). With what seems like genuine disgust, he upbraids Socrates for infantile naïveté: he might as well claim, absurdly, that shepherds and cowherds fatten their flocks for the good of the sheep and cows themselves. To reaffirm and clarify his position, Socrates offers a further argument about wage-earning (345e-347d). It is precisely because real crafts (such as medicine and, Socrates insists, shepherding too) do not in themselves benefit their practitioners that extrinsic ‘wages’ are given in return; and the best ‘wage’ for a ruler is not to be governed by someone worse than himself. So again, the Thrasymachean ruler is not genuinely practising a craft.

Third, Socrates argues that Thrasymachean rule is formally or structurally unlike the real crafts (349a-350c). A craftsperson does not seek to ‘outdo’ [pleonektein] fellow craft practitioners but to do the same as they, i.e., to perform whatever action the craft requires. The just person, who does not seek to ‘outdo’ other just people, fits this pattern, while the Thrasymachean ruler again does not. And since craft is a paradigm of goodness and cleverness in its specialized area, “a just person has turned out to be good and clever, and an unjust one ignorant and bad” (350c). Socrates takes this as equivalent to showing that “justice is virtue and wisdom and that injustice is vice and ignorance” (350d). The use of pleonektein in this argument is confusing, and perhaps confused, but it raises an interesting point: the goods realized by genuine crafts are not zero-sum. The doctor's restoration of the patient's health does not make anyone else less healthy; if one musician plays in tune, so may another.

All these arguments rely on the hypothesis that the ‘real ruler’ is practising a craft [technê], and appeal to various structural features of crafts to establish what real ruling consists in. This is not so tangential to Thrasymachus' account of justice as it might seem, for it is a way of raising the very basic question of how justice is related to practical reason. The real ruler is, for Socrates and Thrasymachus both, an ideal of successful rational agency; and the recognized crafts provide a model for spelling out what that ideal must involve. By asking what ruling as a technê would be like — self-interested or other-directed, dedicated to zero-sum goals or not — they are really addressing a more general and still-vital set of questions: what does practical reason as such consist in? Is it reducible to the intelligent pursuit of self-interest, or does it involve some responsiveness to non-self-interested reasons? And underlying this dispute is a more fundamental disagreement still about the nature of the good, which the rational person is assumed to pursue: does it consist in zero-sum goods like wealth and power (and the pleasures assumed to depend on them), or in goods which might be attained in a cooperative rather than a pleonectic way?

Once he has established that justice, with the crafts and virtues, is an other-directed form of practical reason aimed at non-zero-sum goods, Socrates turns directly to consider its nature and powers more directly. Injustice, he argues, is by nature a cause of disunity, strife, and, therefore, disempowerment and ineffectiveness (351a-352b). Even a gang of thieves can only function successfully when they are just amongst themselves. Likewise within the human soul: justice is what harmonizes the soul and makes a person effective. At this point Thrasymachus more or less gives up on the discussion, but Socrates adds a fifth argument as the coup de grace (352d-354c): justice, as the virtue of the soul (the conclusion of the third argument), is what enables the soul to perform its functions well, so that the just person lives well and happily.This is a close ancestor of the famous ‘function argument’ used by Aristotle in Nicomachean Ethics I.7: it shows that Plato (and for that matter Aristotle) by no means rejects the ‘functional’ conception of virtue as such. Rather, the whole argument of the Republic amounts to a proof that it can be reconciled with the demands of Hesiodic justice, if only we understand rightly what successful human functioning consists in.

The focus is now where, in Plato's view, it really belongs: on the psychology of justice, and its effects on the human soul. In fact, these last two arguments amount to an outline sketch of what justice in the soul is — a sketch of which the rest of the Republic, and Book IV in particular, is largely an elaboration. Justice is a virtue of the soul — in a way, it is the virtue par excellence, since by unifying the soul (as it does the city, or any human group) it enables the other virtues to be exercised in successful action.

Taken together, it is striking what Socrates' arguments against Thrasymachus leave out. They do nothing to attack Thrasymachus' initial debunking theses about the effects of just behaviour and the uses of moral language; in fact these are never really challenged, unless you count a strikingly perfunctory appendix to the argument in Book X (612a-3e). The Book I arguments instead take as their target deeper claims Plato does dispute: namely, Thrasymachus' assumptions about practical rationality and advantage or the good, deployed in his conception of the ‘real ruler’. Socrates' larger argument in Books II-IX will also focus on these deeper claims, providing alternative conceptions of the good, rationality, and political wisdom. However, this larger-scale vindication of justice is presented as a response not directly to Thrasymachus, but to the restatement of his argument which Glaucon and Adeimantus offer (in the hope of being refuted) in Book II. And since their version of the immoralist position departs in significant ways from its inspiration, it is somewhat misleading to treat the Republic as a whole as a response to Thrasymachus. Rather, this division of labor confirms that for Plato, Thrasymachean debunking is dialectically preliminary. It is useful for its clearing away of conventional assumptions and hypocritical pieties, rather than being a fully fledged opponent or alternative.

4. Callicles on Natural and Conventional Justice

Nothing is known of any historical Callicles, and it is odd that such a forceful personality would have left no trace in the historical record. All we can say on the basis of the Gorgias itself is that he is an Athenian aristocrat with political ambitions and personal connections to Gorgias. E.R. Dodds notes that, given Plato's usual practices, “the probabilities are strongly against” Callicles' being simply a literary invention (1959, 12); but as Dodds also remarks, it is tempting to see in Callicles a fragment of Plato himself — a frightening vision, perhaps, of what he might have become without Socrates (1959, 14). At any rate the Gorgias repeatedly marks him as a kind of antithesis or double to Socrates as the paradigmatic philosopher. Socrates opens their debate with a somewhat jokey survey of how much the two have in common (481c-d); they later exchange speeches arguing for their diametrically opposed ways of life, with repeated allusions to the contrasted brothers Zethus and Amphion in Euripides' play Antiope (485e, 486d, 489e, 506b). These dramatic touches express the philosophical reality: more than any other character in Plato, Callicles is Socrates' philosophical antithesis and polar opposite.

Callicles' version of the immoralist challenge turns out to involve four main ingredients, which I will discuss in order: (1) a critique of conventional justice, (2) a positive account of ‘justice according to nature’, (3) a theory of the virtues, and (4) a hedonistic conception of the good.

(1) Callicles' critique of conventional justice emerges from his diagnosis of Polus' failure in the preceding argument. Polus had accused Gorgias of succumbing to shame in assenting to Socrates' suggestion that he would teach justice to any student ignorant of it; Callicles accuses Polus of succumbing to shame himself, and being tricked by Socrates, whose arguments equivocate between natural and conventional values. According to convention [nomos], doing injustice is more shameful than suffering it, as Polus allowed; but “by nature all that is worse is also more shameful, like suffering what's unjust” (483a, tr. here and throughout Zeyl, sometimes revised). Callicles locates the origins of the convention in a conspiracy of the weak: “the people who institute our laws are the weak and the many… they assign praise and blame with themselves and their own advantage in mind” (483b). This diagnosis of ordinary moral language as a mask for self-interest is reminiscent of Thrasymachus; but there is also a contrast, for Thrasymachus presented the laws as adapted to serve the strong, i.e., the rulers. Callicles is perhaps more narrowly focussed on democracy, which he depicts as the tyranny of the many over the exceptional individual. The many “mold the best and the most powerful among us … and with charms and incantations we subdue them into slavery, telling them that one is supposed to get no more than his fair share” (483e-484a).

This rhetorically powerful critique of justice inaugurates a durable philosophical tradition: Nietzsche, Foucault, and their successors in various projects of genealogy and ‘unmasking’ are all Callicles' heirs. In the ancient context, Callicles' speech belongs to a prominent sophistic genre, in which the institutions of human society, such as law and language, are explained by an account of their origins, so that features owing to ‘nature’ [phusis] and those owing to ‘convention’ (i.e., human decision or social construction) [nomos] are disentangled.[5] This project of analysis (and, often, debunking) can be seen as an extension to the human realm of Presocratic natural science, with its attempts to identify the eternal explanatory principles [archai] behind the ever-changing, diverse phenomena of the cosmos. Callicles' genealogy of morals, like Glaucon's in Republic II, presents pleonexia as an eternal and universal first principle of human nature; and he goes further than either Thrasymachus or Glaucon in taking this nature as the basis for a positive norm.

(2) Natural Justice: Callicles' denunciation of conventional justice is bound up with a ringing endorsement of its opposite, the just ‘according to nature’; in fact his opening speech is perhaps our most important text for the sophistic contrast between nature [phusis] and convention [nomos]. Nomos is, as noted above (in section 1), first and foremost Law in all its grandeur, attributed by Hesiod to the will of Zeus. But in sophistic contexts, nomos is often used to designate some norm or institution as merely a matter of social construction. That is why nomos varies from polis to polis and nation to nation, and can be changed by our decisions. What is by nature, by contrast, is a kind of ethical and political ‘given’, outrunning our wishes or beliefs; and the contrast involves at least an implicit privileging of nature as inherently authoritative (see Kerferd 1981a, Chapter 10).

The implications of the nomos-phusis contrast depend on how the ‘natural’ is understood. Callicles appeals both to human nature and the animal world: “both among the other animals and in whole cities and races of men, it [nature] shows that this is what justice has been decided to be: that the superior rule the inferior and have a greater share than they” (483d). He adds two examples at the level of ‘cities and races’: the invasions of Greece by the Persian Emperor Xerxes, and of Scythia by his father Darius (483d-e). He also imagines an individual within society who would exercise superiority to the full: if a man of outsize ability manages to throw off our moralistic shackles, “he would rise up and be revealed as our master, and here the justice of nature would shine forth” (484a-b). What the justice of nature amounts to is simple: it is for the superior man to appropriate the power and possessions of the inferior (484c).

For all its ranting sound, Callicles has a straightforward and logically valid argument here: (1) observation of nature can disclose the content of ‘natural justice’; (2) nature is to be observed in the realms where moral conventions have no hold, viz among states and among animals; (3) such observation discloses the domination and exploitation of the weak by the strong; (4) therefore, it is natural justice for the strong to rule over and have more than the weak. From a modern point of view, premise (1) is likely to appear the most dubious, for it violates the plausible principle, most famously advanced by David Hume, that no normative claims may be inferred from purely descriptive premises (‘no ought from an is’). But then, legitimate or not, this kind of appeal to nature runs through almost all of ancient ethics: it is central to the moral theory of Plato himself, as well as Aristotle, the Epicureans, and the Stoics. So Socrates' objection is instead to (2) and (3): Callicles gets nature wrong. In truth, Socrates insists later on, “partnership and friendship, orderliness, self-control, and justice hold together heaven and earth, and gods and men, and that is why they call this universe a world order, my friend, and not an undisciplined world-disorder” (507e-508a). Callicles advocates pleonexia only because he ‘neglects geometry’ (508a): instead of predatory animals, we should observe and emulate the orderly structure of the cosmos as a whole.

(3) Callicles' theory of the virtues: As with Thrasymachus, Socrates' response is to press Callicles regarding the deeper commitments on which his views depend. He first prods Callicles to articulate the conception of the ‘superior’ which his account of natural justice involves. Callicles has said that nature reveals that it is just for the ‘superior’, ‘better’ or ‘stronger’ to have more: but who are they (488b-c)? In practice, as Socrates points out, ‘the many’, whom Callicles has condemned as weak, are in fact stronger: they are able, as Callicles himself has complained, to suppress the gifted few. So, like Thrasymachus when faced with the fact that rulers sometimes make mistakes in the pursuit of self-interest, Callicles now distinguishes the ‘strength’ he admires from actual political power. (This leaves it unclear whether and why we should still see the invasions of Darius and Xerxes as examples of the ‘strong’ exercising the ‘justice of nature’; since both their expeditions were notorious failures, the examples are rather perplexing anyway.)

Callicles goes on to articulate (with some help from Socrates) a conception of ‘superiority’ in terms of a pair of very traditional sounding virtues: intelligence [phronêsis], particularly about the affairs of the city, and courage [andreia], which makes men “competent to accomplish whatever they have in mind, without slackening off because of softness of spirit” (491a-b). These are the familiar virtues of the Homeric warrior, and the claim that such a man should be rewarded with a ‘greater share’ is no sophistic novelty but a restatement of the Homeric warrior ethic: the best fighter in the battle of the day deserves the best cut of the meat at night. At the same time, Callicles is interestingly reluctant to describe his ‘superior’ man as possessing justice [dikaiosunê], a virtue which we might have expected him to redefine in terms of the justice of nature. Instead, he seems to dispense with any conception of justice as a virtue; and he explicitly rejects the fourth traditional virtue which Plato will take as canonical in the Republic: sôphrosunê, temperance or moderation.

This traditional side of Calliclean ‘natural justice’ is worth emphasising, since Callicles is often read as a representative of the sophistic movement and their subversive ‘modern’ ideas. (Nietzsche, for instance, discusses the sophists — with immense admiration — in a way that is hard to make sense of unless we take Callicles as a principal source (1968, 232–4; and see Dodds 1958, 386–91, on Callicles' influence on Nietzsche's own thought).) Despite Callicles' opposition of nomos and phusis, and his association with Gorgias, this reading is somewhat misleading. Callicles is clearly not a professional sophist himself — indeed Socrates mentions that he despises them (520b). (His friend Gorgias is properly speaking a rhetorician, i.e. a teacher of public speaking — presumably a more practical, less intellectually pretentious, and thus, to Callicles, more manly line of work.) And Callicles' ideas are no more expressive of sophistic thought (which was by no means uniform in any case) than of the ancient elitist tradition in Greek moral thought (found for instance in Theognis as well as Homer's warrior ethic), expressed here by his argument that egalitarianism and majority rule are unnatural.

(4) Hedonism: Once the ‘strong’ have been identified as a ruthlessly intelligent and daring natural elite, a second point of clarification arises: of what, exactly, do they deserve more? Socrates already pressed the point at the outset by, in his usual fashion, posing it in the lowliest terms: should the stronger have a greater share of food and drink, or clothes, or land? These suggestions are scornfully rejected at first (490c-d); but Callicles does in the end allow that eating and drinking, and even scratching or the life of a catamite, count as instances of the appetitive fulfilment he recommends (494b-e).

So it is not made clear to us what pleasures Callicles himself had in mind — perhaps he himself is hazy on that point. All he says is that the superior man must “allow his own appetites to get as large as possible and not restrain them. And when they are as large as possible, he ought to be competent to devote himself to them by virtue of his courage and intelligence, and to fill him with whatever he may have an appetite for at the time” (491e-492a). This seems to leave the content of those appetites entirely a matter of subjective preference. And Callicles eventually allows himself, without much resistance, to be committed by Socrates to a simple and extreme form of hedonism: all pleasures are good and pleasure is the good (495a-e). Their arguments over this thesis stand at the start of a fascinating and complex Greek debate over the nature and value of pleasure, which is here understood as the ‘filling’ or ‘replenishment’ of some painful lack (e.g., the pleasure of drinking is a replenishment in relation to the pain of thirst). However, it is difficult to be sure how much this discussion tells us about Callicles, since it is Socrates who elaborates the conception of pleasure as replenishment on which it depends. Even the strength of Callicles' commitment to the hedonistic equation of pleasure and the good is uncertain. At 499b, having been refuted by Socrates, he casually allows that some pleasures are better than others; and as noted above, hedonism was introduced in the first place not as a thesis he was keen to propound, but as the answer to a question he could not avoid — viz, the stronger should ‘have more’ of what? Callicles' philosophical enthusiasm is not, it seems, for pleasure itself but for the intensity, self-assertion and extravagance that accompany its pursuit on a grand scale: he endorses hedonism so as to repudiate the restraints of temperance, rather than the other way around. One way to understand this rather oddly structured position is, again, as inspired by the Homeric tradition. Callicles' somewhat inchoate ideal, the superior man, is imagined as having the arrogant grandeur of the larger-than-life Homeric heroes; but what this new breed of hero is supposed to fight for and be rewarded by remains cloudy to his imagination.

5. Socrates vs. Callicles

The most fundamental difficulty with Callicles' position is brought out by Socrates' final refutation at 497d-499b. This is a simple and elegant argument which brings into collision Callicles' hedonism and his account of the virtues, as follows (roughly put): (1) pleasure is the good; (2) good people are good by the presence of good things; (3) good people are the virtuous, i.e., the intelligent and courageous; (4) the foolish and cowardly sometimes experience as much pleasure as the intelligent and courageous, or even more; (5) therefore, bad people are sometimes as good as good ones, or even better. Here, premises (1) and (3) represent Callicles' hedonism and his account of the virtues respectively; (2) and (4) seem undeniable; but (1), (2) and (4) together entail (5), which conflicts with (3) and is anyway a contradiction in terms.

The problem is obvious: one cannot consistently claim both that pleasure is the good, and that courage and intelligence (which are manifestly not instances of pleasure, or derivative of it, or even coextensive with it) are goods. Callicles could perhaps respond that the virtues are instrumentally good: an intelligent and courageous person is ‘good’ in the indirect sense that he is, overall and in the long run, more apt than others to obtain the good of pleasure. But this is not a very plausible claim — least of all in the warfare-ridden world of the Greek polis, where the coward might be at a significant advantage for survival. And this ‘instrumentalist’ option would in any case be false to Callicles' spirit. His praise of the virtues of the superior man expresses a hazy but genuine spirit of admiration (like Thrasymachus with his ‘real ruler’), rather than a calculation of instrumental utility. So Callicles is genuinely torn. He is urging Socrates and us to pursue two ends which are not only different but sometimes incompatible: pleasure and the virtues as he understands them. This is perhaps the first clear formulation of the philosophical contrast which will later be spelled out in terms of ‘inclination’ and ‘duty’ (Kant), or the ‘dualism of practical reason’ (Sidgwick). And the case of Callicles can help us to see an important point often obscured in later versions, which is that some conflict along these lines can arise even if one's conception of virtue has nothing to do with altruism. Even for an immoralist, there is room for a clash between motivations stemming from self-interested desire and those stemming from other sentiments (admiration of one's heroes, for instance) — for a clash between the goods I would like to obtain and the sort of person I would like to be.

Like his praise of the justice of nature, Callicles' non-instrumental attachment to the virtues of his superior man raises the question whether ‘immoralist’ is really the right term for him. He resembles his fan Nietzsche in being a shape-shifter: at times seeming to attack the legitimacy of moral norms as such but at other times offering what looks like his own morality, one much less new and radical than he seems to want us to think. If we do want to retain the term ‘immoralist’ for him, we need to allow that the basic immoralist challenge (that is, why be just? or why be moral?) may be raised from two rather different perspectives. Rather than being someone who disputes the authority of any and all un-self-interested norms as such, the immoralist may be someone who has his own set of such norms (such as Calliclean virtue), ones which are at odds with ordinary morality.

Callicles himself does not seem to realize how deeply the problems with his view go. He responds to Socrates' refutations by making a rather shrug-like suggestion that (contrary to his earlier explicit insistence) some pleasures are of course better than others (499b). In the end, Callicles' position is perhaps best seen as a series of shifting suggestions or impulses — against conventional justice, against temperance, for the Homeric self-assertion of the strong, for pleasures and psychological intensity — rather than a coherent set of philosophical theses. The disunified, inchoate quality of Callicles' thought may actually be the key to its perpetual power: almost all readers find something to tempt them here, and are easily left with the lurking sense that the ‘real’ Calliclean position, whatever we might prefer it to be, remains unrefuted. (And indeed of the four ingredients of Callicles' position which I have discussed, Socrates' arguments target only (3) and (4): whether (1) and (2) could be reconceived on some lines not reliant on them is an open question.) This unease is strengthened by a fifth feature of Callicles' position which I have not so far discussed: his attack on the value of philosophy itself. It is a prominent theme of Callicles' opening rants that philosophy, while a valuable part of liberal education, is unworthy and a waste of time for a serious adult (485e-486d). The life of philosophy is unmanly and immature, the antithesis of an honorable public life; Socrates ought to ‘stop this refuting’ and ‘leave these subtleties to others’. Callicles' anti-intellectualism does not prevent him from showing some skill in dialectic, and more commitment to its norms than most of Socrates' interlocutors (e.g., at 495a). But Callicles also claims that he argues only to please Gorgias (506c); and in the end, he opts out of the discussion altogether, retreating into surly silence. What makes this rejection of philosophical dialectic disturbing is Callicles' suggestion that Socrates' own positions are self-serving expressions of his commitment to his own way of life — a version of the plausible ancient Greek truism that each man naturally praises his own way of life as best. According to Callicles, this means that Socrates must change his practices to gain insight: “This is the truth of the matter, as you will know if you abandon philosophy and move on to more important things” (484c). Callicles is here the first voice within philosophy to raise the prospect that there are truths which philosophy itself may hide from us. That is a possibility which Socrates clearly rejects; but it is hard to see how he could refute it.

6. Conclusion: Thrasymachus vs. Callicles

One way to frame a comparison of Thrasymachus and Callicles is to ask why Plato chose to represent the former position in the Republic and the latter in the Gorgias. The obvious answer is that the differences between the two put them in very different relations to Socrates and his defense of justice. Socrates and Callicles are antitheses: they address the same questions and give directly conflicting answers. Each offers a positive account of the real nature of justice, grounded in a broader conception of human nature and the nature of things. Indeed, viewed at a high level of abstraction, and if we allow Socrates the fuller positive theory provided in the Republic, their positions are remarkably similar. For in the Republic we see that Plato in fact agrees with Callicles that the many should be ruled by the superior few — i.e., the intelligent and courageous — and that it is only natural and just for the latter to have greater happiness and pleasure than the many. Where they differ is in the content they give to this shared schema: above all, from Plato's point of view, Callicles is wrong about the nature of the good at which the superior man aims. Thrasymachus, on the other hand, stands as dialectically prior to both Socrates and Callicles, for while persuasively debunking justice as conventionally conceived, he fails to offer any account of real virtue in its stead. The closest he comes to offering a substitute norm is in his praise of the expertly rational ‘real’ ruler – an ideal which is pursued and developed more fully both by Callicles in the Gorgias and by Socrates in the Republic itself.

So a Thrasymachean debunking of convention can clear the ground for the development of either Platonic or anti-Platonic moral theory. In the Republic itself, the Calliclean path is pursued by Glaucon's speech in Book II. Glaucon presents his attack on justice as a restatement of Thrasymachus' position (358c); but it represents a considerable advance in sophistication, and the differences bring it closer to Callicles' position. Like Callicles, Glaucon concerns himself explicitly with the nature and origin of justice, classifying it as a merely instrumental good (or a necessary evil) and locating its origins in a social contract. By nature we are all pleonectic; but since we stand to lose more than we could gain from unbridled pleonexia we have entered into a compact neither to do nor to allow injustice. As the famous ‘ring of Gyges’ thought-experiment shows, however, nobody has any real commitment to acting justly when they think they can get away with injustice; for if someone can commit injustice undetected there is no reason for him not to. Thus Glaucon agrees with Callicles in identifying justice as a matter of convention, and in holding that it conflicts with our nature; on the other hand, he remains with Thrasymachus in not articulating any alternative moral norm; and he departs from both in not relying on the questionable complication of dividing mankind into two essentially different groups (the allegedly ‘strong’ and ‘weak’). Thus his position seems to represent the immoralist challenge in a fully developed but streamlined form, as reducible to a simple question: given the conventional character of justice and our own pleonectic nature, why should any one of us be just, in any context in which injustice would be profitable?

This is also the challenge posed by the sophist Antiphon, in the surviving fragments of his discussion of justice in On Truth (see Pendrick 2002 for the texts of Antiphon, and Gagarin and Woodruff 1995 for translation). Antiphon argues that justice is only ever a matter of following the laws of one's own community; and that there is no good reason for anyone to obey those laws when they can break them without fear of detection and punishment. For nature too has its laws, which conflict with those of society, and violation of these is punished infallibly. Antiphon's text and meaning are unclear at some crucial points, but the idea seems to be that the laws of society require us to act against our own interests, by constraining our animal natures and limiting our natural desires and pleasures; and that it is foolish to obey these laws when we can get away with following nature instead. Without wanting to deny the existence of other contemporary figures working similar terrain, we can easily read Callicles, Thrasymachus and Glaucon as Plato's analysis of Antiphon into three possible positions, distinguished in order to clarify the complex philosophical options involved in the immoralist challenge. Thrasymachus represents the essentially negative, cynical and debunking side of the immoralist stance, grounded in empirical observations of the ways of the world. At the same time his idealization of the ‘real ruler’ suggests that this is an unstable and incomplete position, liable to progress to a Calliclean ‘heroic’ form of immoralism. Callicles represents immoralism as a new morality, dependent on the contrasts between nature and convention and between the strong and the weak. Glaucon shows that immoralism can do without the latter: we are all complicit in the social compact which establishes law as a brake on self-interest, and we all have every reason to cheat on it when we can. This is, Plato's presentation suggests, ultimately the most challenging form of the immoralist theory; whether the whole argument of the Republic suffices to defeat it remains a matter of live philosophical debate.


For general accounts of the Republic, see the Bibliography to the entry, Plato's Ethics and Politics in the Republic. The following are works cited in or having particular relevance to the present entry:

The immoralist challenge

The Greek moral tradition, the Sophists and their social context (including Antiphon)

Thrasymachus and the Republic (including Glaucon)

Callicles and the Gorgias

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