Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Hermann Weyl

1. Husserl was a professor at Göttingen during Weyl's student days there, and Weyl attended his lectures. But it was his wife Helene, who later came to Göttingen to study with Husserl, who seems to have sparked Weyl's interest in phenomenology.

2. In particular, while there is compelling evidence that the continued existence of the Ego (one's consciousness) is dependent on facts about the external world, for instance, the continuing biochemical activity of one's brain, that dependency cannot be taken as a primary datum for the Ego.

3. As Weyl observed in 1925,

If phenomenal insight is referred to as knowledge, then the theoretical one is based on belief— the belief in the reality of the own I and that of others, or belief in reality of the external world, or belief in the reality of God. If the organ of the former is “seeing” in the widest sense, so the organ of theory is “creativity” (Weyl 1925, 140).

4. In a late paper Weyl offers the natural numbers “by which we count objects” as “the simplest, and in a certain sense most profound, example of symbolic construction.” He continues:

The most natural symbols for them are strokes, one put after the other, |, ||, |||, … . The objects may disperse, “melt, thaw and resolve themselves into dew,” but we thus can keep the record of their number. What is more, we can by a constructive process decide for two numbers represented through symbols which one is the larger, namely by checking one symbol against the other, stroke by stroke. This process reveals differences not manifest in direct observation, which in most cases is incapable of distinguishing even between such low numbers as 21 and 22. We are so familiar with these miracles which the number symbols perform that we no longer wonder at them. But this is only the prelude to the mathematical step proper. We do not leave it to chance which numbers we actually meet by counting this or that concrete set of objects, but we generate the open sequence of all possible numbers which starts with 1 (or 0 = nothing) and proceeds by adding to any number symbol n one more stroke, whereby it changes into the following number n + 1. Being is thus projected onto the background of the possible, more precisely onto a manifold of possibilities which unfolds by iterating the same step again and again and remains open into infinity. (Weyl 1985, 12–13.)

5. It is perhaps for this reason that, unlike Einstein, for example, Weyl does not seem to have been especially troubled by the highly counterintuitive nature of quantum theory. Indeed, the conviction of numerous physicists that the quantum microworld is accessible to us only through abstract mathematical description serves as an excellent illustration of Weyl's thesis that objective reality cannot be grasped directly, but only through the use of symbols.

For Weyl the link between mathematics and natural science established through symbolic construction was certainly very strong, as is attested by his observations in his [1985] on G. H. Hardy's A Mathematician's Apology (Hardy 1967). Introducing it as a “charming little book”, he continues:

For us today the idea that the Gods from whom we wrestled the secret of knowledge by symbolic construction will revenge our hubris has taken on a quite concrete form. For who can close his eyes against the menace of our own self-destruction by science? The alarming fact is that the rapid progress of scientific knowledge is not paralleled by a corresponding growth of man's moral strength and responsibility, which have hardly changed since historical times. I think it is futile to claim with Hardy for mathematics an exceptional and relatively innocent position in this regard. He maintains that mathematics is a useless science, and this means, he says, that it can contribute directly neither to the exploitation of our fellow-men nor to their extermination. However the power of science rests on the combination of experiment, i.e., observation under freely chosen conditions and symbolic construction, and the latter is its mathematical aspect. Thus if science is found guilty, mathematics cannot evade the verdict.

6. In Insight and Reflection (also in Philosophy of Mathematics and Natural Science) Weyl uses a geometric analogy to illustrate his metaphysical scheme. In this analogy, objects, subjects, and the appearance of an object to a subject are correlated respectively with points on a plane, (barycentric) coordinate systems in the plane, and coordinates of a point with respect to a such a coordinate system. Here a coordinate system S consists of the vertices of a fixed nondegenerate triangle T; each point p in the plane determined by T is assigned a triple of numbers summing to 1—its barycentric coordinates relative to S—representing the magnitudes of masses of total weight 1 which, placed at the vertices of T, have centre of gravity at p. Thus objects, i.e. points, and subjects i.e., coordinate systems or triples of points belong to the same “sphere of reality.” On the other hand, the appearances of an object to a subject, i.e., triples of numbers, lie, Weyl asserts, in a different sphere, that of numbers. These number-appearances, as Weyl calls them, correspond to the experiences of a subject, or of pure consciousness.

From the standpoint of naïve realism the points (objects) simply exist as such, but Weyl indicates the possibility of constructing geometry (which under the analogy corresponds to external reality) solely in terms of number-appearances, so representing the world in terms of the experiences of pure consciousness, that is, from the standpoint of idealism. Thus suppose that we are given a coordinate system S. Regarded as a subject or “consciousness”, from its perspective a point or object now corresponds to what was originally an appearance of an object, that is, a triple of numbers summing to 1; and, analogously, any coordinate system S′ (that is, another subject or “consciousness”) corresponds to three such triples determined by the vertices of a nondegenerate triangle. Each point or object p may now be identified with its coordinates relative to S. The coordinates of p relative to any other coordinate system S′ can be determined by a straightforward algebraic transformation: these coordinates represent the appearance of the object corresponding to p to the subject represented by S′. Now these coordinates will, in general, differ from those assigned to p by our given coordinate system S, and will in fact coincide for all p if and only if S′ is what is termed by Weyl the absolute coordinate system consisting of the three triples (1,0,0), (0,1,0), (0,0,1), that is, the coordinate system which corresponds to S itself. Thus, for this coordinate system, “object” and “appearance” coincide, which leads Weyl to term it the Absolute I.

Weyl points out that this argument takes place entirely within the realm of numbers, that is, for the purposes of the analogy, the immanent consciousness. In order to do justice to the claim of objectivity that all “I”s are equivalent, he suggests that only such numerical relations are to be declared of interest as remain unchanged under passage from an “absolute” to an arbitrary coordinate system, that is, those which are invariant under arbitrary linear coordinate transformations. According to Weyl, “this analogy makes it understandable why the unique sense-giving I, when viewed objectively, i.e., from the standpoint of invariance, can appear as just one subject among many of its kind. “

At this point Weyl adds an intriguing parenthetical observation:

Incidentally, a number of Husserl's theses become demonstrably false when translated into the context of the analogy—something which, it appears to me, gives serious cause for suspecting them.

Unfortunately, we are not told precisely which of Husserl's theses are the “suspect” ones.

Weyl goes on to emphasize:

Beyond this, it is expected of me that I recognize the other I—the you—not only by observing in my thought the abstract norm of invariance or objectivity, but absolutely: you are for you, once again, what I am for myself: not just an existing but a conscious carrier of the world of appearances.

This recognition of the Thou, according to Weyl, can be presented within his geometric analogy only if it is furnished with a purely axiomatic formulation. In taking this step Weyl sees a third viewpoint emerging in addition to that of realism and idealism, namely, a transcendentalism which “postulates a transcendental reality but is satisfied with modelling it in symbols.”

7. The others, in order, are: understanding and expression; thinking the possible; and finally, in science, the construction of symbols or measuring devices.

8. See also the section on Weyl and Hilbert below.

9. It is also worth quoting one of Weyl's last, bittersweet observations on mathematics, from his (1985):

Mathematics has been called the science of the infinite. Indeed, the mathematician invents finite constructions by which questions are decided that by their very nature refer to the infinite. That is his glory. Kierkegaard once said religion deals with what concerns man unconditionally. In contrast (but with equal exaggeration) one may say that mathematics deals with the things which are of no concern to man at all. Mathematics has the inhuman quality of starlight, brilliant and sharp, but cold. But it seems an irony of creation that man's mind knows how to handle things the better the farther removed they are from the center of his existence. Thus we are cleverest where knowledge matters least.

10. Nevertheless, Weyl seems to have been initially attracted to set theory—at least in the axiomatic formulation Zermelo provided for it in 1908. As emphasized by Feferman [2000], Weyl [1910] anticipates Fraenkel's and Skolem's later identification of Zermelo's “definite property” with “property definable within the language of set theory”.

11. In this respect Weyl's views were close to those of Poincaré, and also, to some extent, those of Russell.

12. In this connection it is of interest to note that on 9 February 1918 Weyl and George Pólya made a bet in Zürich in the presence of twelve witnesses (all of whom were mathematicians) that “within 20 years, Pólya, or a majority of leading mathematicians, will come to recognize the falsity of the least upper bound property.” When the bet was eventually called, everyone—with the single exception of Gödel—agreed that Pólya had won.

13. Weyl shared with many mathematicians the conviction that the concept of natural number is the fons et origo of mathematics. For example, in [1921] we read:

The starting point of mathematics is the sequence of natural numbers, that is, the law… which from nothing generates the first number, and from every generated number generates the next following one; a process never returning to a number that has already occurred. If we want to capture numbers for our intuition, we must distinguish them symbolically by means of qualitative signs…. One can say that, in a mathematical examination of Reality, an attempt is made to represent the world—which is given to consciousness in its more general form of a penetration of Being and Essence (of the “this” and “so”)—in the absoluteness of pure Being. That is why there is a profound truth in the Pythagorean doctrine that any being as such is based on number.

14. It is worth pointing out that Brentano, in his On What is Continuous of 1914, had drawn the similar conclusion that the continuum concept is derived from primitive sensible intuition and indeed that “all our sensible intuitions present us with that which is continuous.” This led him to regard the constructions of the continuum of Dedekind, Cantor, and their successors as “fictions”.

15. The connection between mathematics and physics was of course of paramount importance for Weyl. His seminal work on relativity theory, Space-Time-Matter, was published in the same year (1918) as Das Kontinuum; the two works reveal subtle affinities.

16. This fact would seem to indicate that in Weyl's theory the domain of definition of a function is not unambiguously determined by the function, so that the continuity of such a “function” may vary with its domain of definition. (This would be a natural consequence of Weyl's definition of a function as a certain kind of relation.) A simple but striking example of this phenomenon is provided in classical analysis by the function f which takes value 1 at each rational number, and 0 at each irrational number. Considered as a function defined on the rational numbers, f is constant and so continuous; as a function defined on the real numbers, f fails to be continuous anywhere.

17. E.g. in Weyl [1950], 8 and [1949], 123

18. However there were marked differences between Weyl's and Brouwer's philosophical attitudes. Brouwer's philosophy amounted virtually to solipsism, while Weyl still seems to have cleaved to phenomenology, at least up to 1928. And from what Weyl reveals about his later philosophical development, it is clear that it carried him even further away from Brouwer. (For an analysis of the relationship between intuitionism and phenomenology in Weyl's thought, see Mancosu and Ryckman [2002].)

19. Nevertheless, there is reason to think that Weyl continued to regard the predicative approach underlying Das Kontinuum as being of genuine value. If indeed this is the case, then Weyl's belief was correct, since Das Kontinuum is now viewed as the initial stage in the emergence of predicative mathematics, which has undergone a rapid development since the 1960s (see Feferman [1988], [2000]).

20. Weyl's contention is strikingly similar to (and may have had an influence on) Hilbert's later assertion that “contentual” statements are, from the finitist standpoint, incapable of being negated. See, e.g., Hilbert [1926], 378.

21. For my remarks on Weyl's relationship with Intuitionism I have drawn on the illuminating paper van Dalen [1995].

22. Here is Weyl enlarging on the issue in 1921:

…if we pick out a specific point, say, x = 0, on the number line C (i.e., on the variable range of a real variable x), then one cannot, under any circumstance, claim that every point either coincides with it or is disjoint from it. The point x = 0 thus does not at all split the continuum C into two parts C: x < 0 and C+: x > 0, in the sense that C would consist of the union of C, C+ and the one point 0 …. If this appears offensive to present-day mathematicians with their atomistic thought habits, it was in earlier times a self-evident view held by everyone: Within a continuum, one can very well generate subcontinua by introducing boundaries; yet it is irrational to claim that the total continuum is made up of the boundaries and the subcontinua. The point is, a genuine continuum is something connected in itself, and it cannot be divided into separate fragments; this conflicts with its nature. (Weyl 1921, 111.)

23. Brouwer established the continuity of functions fully defined on a continuum in 1904, but did not publish a definitive account until 1927. In that account he also considers the possibility of partially defined functions.

24. Quoted in Reid [1986], 72. And over Hilbert's grave in Göttingen is inscribed: Wir müssen wissen / Wir werden wissen (“We must know / We shall know.”) (Ibid., 220.)

25. In 1922, Hilbert declared:

What Weyl and Brouwer do comes to the same thing as following in the footsteps of Kronecker! They seek to save mathematics by throwing overboard all which is troublesome… They would chop up and mangle the science. If we would follow such a reform as the one they suggest, we would run the risk of losing a great part of our valuable treasures! (Reid 1986, 155).

I believe that, just as little as Kronecker was unable to get rid of the irrational numbers…just as little will Weyl and Brouwer be able to succeed. Brouwer is not, as Weyl believes, the Revolution—only the repetition of an attempted Putsch, in its day, more sharply undertaken yet failing utterly, and now, with the State armed and strengthened, doomed from the start! (Ibid., 157.)

26. It is this aspect of Hilbert's program which led, somewhat inappropriately, to its becoming termed “formalism”. It should be emphasized that Hilbert was not claiming that (classical) mathematics itself was meaningless, only that the formal system representing it was to be so regarded.

27. This is borne out by the following quotation from Hilbert [1927]:

No more than any other science can mathematics be founded on logic alone; rather, as a condition for the use of logical inferences and the performance of logical operations, something must already be given to us in our faculty of representation, certain extralogical concrete objects that are intuitively present as immediate experience prior to all thought. If logical inference is to be reliable, it must be possible to survey these objects completely in all their parts, and the fact that they occur, that they differ from one another, and that they follow each other, or are concatenated, is immediately given intuitively, together with the objects, as something that can neither be reduced to anything else, nor requires reduction. This is the basic philosophical position that I regard as requisite for mathematics and, in general, for all scientific thinking, understanding, and communication. And in mathematics, in particular, what we consider is the concrete signs themselves, whose shape, according to the conception we have adopted, is immediately clear and recognizable. This is the very least that must be presupposed, no scientific thinker can dispense with it, and therefore everyone must maintain it, consciously or not.

28. Underlying this guarantee, of course, is the further assumption that there are no “contradictions in nature”.

29. Weyl [1927], 483. Indeed, in his [1946], Weyl remarks that had it not been for Gödel's demonstration in 1931 that Hilbert's program could not be successfully carried out, “it is likely that mathematicians would have accepted Hilbert's approach.”

30. Weyl [1925], 140. Weyl [1949] contains a similar observation:

A truly realistic mathematics should be conceived, in line with physics, as a branch of the construction of the one real world, and should adopt the same sober and cautious attitude toward hypothetic extensions of its foundations as is exhibited by physics.(231).

31. Weyl [1927], 484. Mancosu and Ryckman (2002) show that Weyl had already begun to retreat from intuitionism because of what he saw as its incapability of supporting natural science, in particular the theoretical physics which was of paramount importance for him.

32. Weyl also observes (ibid., 61):

But whatever the ultimate value of Hilbert's program, his bold enterprise can claim one merit: it has disclosed to us the highly complicated and ticklish logical structure of mathematics, its maze of back-connections, which result in circles of which it cannot be gathered at a first glance whether they might not lead to blatant contradictions.