Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Taoism

1. Translation Note: The two spellings, "taoism" and "daoism", come from two systems of romanizing Chinese. Western scholarship was dominated by the Wade-Giles system in which the sound closer to d was represented by a t and the sound closer to a t by t’. The Chinese recently developed and adopted their own official romanization.It used the more intuitive d/t representation.Western scholars are gradually adopting the official Chinese romanization. This creates a temporary inconvenience for the reader who does not know the two systems or their relation. It also creates a theoretical puzzle -- ’tao’ and ’Taoism’ are arguably English terms today. The choices of Chinese speakers should not change English conventions. However, English writers have already stopped writing Peking in favor of Beijing. Further, most Chinese scholars, including the author of this article, can hardly bring themselves to say "t-a-o" or "t-a-oism" (just as they cannot bring themselves to say Bei-zhing simply because TV and media people do).

2. Creel, H. G., 1970 What is Taoism? Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

3. Graham, Angus 1981, Chuang Tzu: The Inner Chapters , London: George Allen and Unwin p. 128.

4. Eno, Robert 1990, The Confucian Creation of Heaven Buffalo: SUNY Series in Chinese Philosophy and Culture. Benjamin Schwartz expresses a similar view in his 1985 The World of Thought in Ancient China .

5. Though this seems to require that the mystical dao have some linguistic content to place it in the space of reasons and inference.

6. As Graham notes in his 1972 p. 59, another key argument can be found in Later Mohist writings.

7. Analects 13:3.

8. Daode Jing Ch. 12.

9. Obviously, this textual observation does not prove the friendship is not a literary device-particularly in a text so imaginatively free in its fantasy dialogues and spokesmen. Some speculate that Hui Shi might have been a teacher-or they may have been fellow students.