# The Traditional Square of Opposition

*First published Fri Aug 8, 1997; substantive revision Sun Oct 1, 2006*

This entry traces the historical development of the Square of
Opposition, a collection of logical relationships traditionally
embodied in a square diagram. This body of doctrine provided a
foundation for work in logic for over two millenia. For most of this
history, logicians assumed that negative particular propositions
("Some *S* is not *P*") are vacuously true if their
subjects are empty. This validates the logical laws embodied in the
diagram, and preserves the doctrine against modern criticisms. Certain
additional principles ("contraposition" and "obversion") were
sometimes adopted along with the Square, and they genuinely yielded
inconsistency. By the nineteenth century an inconsistent set of
doctrines was widely adopted. Strawson's 1952 attempt to rehabilitate
the Square does not apply to the traditional doctrine; it does salvage
the nineteenth century version but at the cost of yielding inferences
that lead from truth to falsity when strung together.

- 1. Introduction
- 2. Origin of the Square of Opposition
- 3. The (Ir)relevance of Syllogistic
- 4. The Principles of Contraposition and Obversion
- 5. Later Developments
- 6. Strawson's Defense
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Introduction

The doctrine of the square of opposition originated with Aristotle in the fourth century BC and has occurred in logic texts ever since. Although severely criticized in recent decades, it is still regularly referred to. The point of this entry is to trace its history from the vantage point of the end of the twentieth century, along with closely related doctrines bearing on empty terms.

The square of opposition is a group of theses embodied in a diagram. The diagram is not essential to the theses; it is just a useful way to keep them straight. The theses concern logical relations among four logical forms:

NAMEFORMTITLEAEvery SisPUniversal Affirmative ENo SisPUniversal Negative ISome SisPParticular Affirmative OSome Sis notPParticular Negative

The diagram for the traditional square of opposition is:

The theses embodied in this diagram I call ‘SQUARE’. They are:

**SQUARE**

- ‘Every
*S*is*P*’ and ‘Some*S*is not*P*’ are contradictories.

- ‘No
*S*is*P*’ and ‘Some*S*is*P*’ are contradictories.

- ‘Every
*S*is*P*’ and ‘No*S*is*P*’ are contraries.

- ‘Some
*S*is*P*’ and ‘Some*S*is not*P*’ are subcontraries.

- ‘Some
*S*is*P*’ is a subaltern of ‘Every*S*is*P*’.

- ‘Some
*S*is not*P*’ is a subaltern of ‘No*S*is*P*’.

These theses were supplemented with the following explanations:

- Two propositions are contradictory iff they cannot both be true and they cannot both be false.

- Two propositions are contraries iff they cannot both be true but can both be false.

- Two propositions are subcontraries iff they cannot both be false but can both be true.

- A proposition is a subaltern of another iff it must be true if its superaltern is true, and the superaltern must be false if the subaltern is false.

Probably nobody before the twentieth century ever held exactly these
views without holding certain closely linked ones as well. The most
common closely linked view that is associated with the traditional
diagram is that the **E** and **I**
propositions *convert simply*; that is, ‘No *S* is
*P*’ is equivalent in truth value to ‘No *P*
is *S*’, and ‘Some *S* is *P*’
is equivalent in truth value to ‘Some *P* is
*S*’. The traditional doctrine supplemented with simple
conversion is a very natural view to discuss. It is Aristotle's view,
and it was apparently endorsed (or at least not challenged) by
everyone who wrote on this topic before the 19th century. I call this
total body of doctrine ‘[SQUARE]’:

[SQUARE] =_{df}SQUARE + "theEandIforms convert simply"

where

A propositionconverts simplyiff it is necessarily equivalent in truth value to the proposition you get by interchanging its terms.

So [SQUARE] includes the relations illustrated in the diagram plus the
view that ‘No *S* is *P*’ is equivalent to
‘No *P* is *S*’, and the view that
‘Some *S* is *P*’ is equivalent to
‘Some *P* is *S*’.

### 1.1 The Modern Revision of the Square

Most contemporary logic texts symbolize the traditional forms as follows:

Every SisP∀ x(Sx→Px)No SisP∀ x(Sx→ ¬Px)Some SisP∃ x(Sx&Px)Some Sis notP∃ x(Sx& ¬Px)

If this symbolization is adopted along with standard views about the logic of connectives and quantifiers, the relations embodied in the traditional square mostly disappear. The modern diagram looks like this:

THE MODERN REVISED SQUARE:

This has too little structure to be particularly useful, and so it
is not commonly used. According to Alonzo Church, this modern view
probably originated sometime in the late nineteenth
century.^{[1]}
This representation of the four forms is now generally accepted,
except for qualms about the loss of subalternation in the left-hand
column. Most English speakers tend to understand ‘Every
*S* is *P*’ as requiring for its truth that there
be some *S*s, and if that requirement is imposed, then
subalternation holds for affirmative propositions. Every modern logic
text must address the apparent implausibility of letting ‘Every
*S* is *P*’ be true when there are no
*S*s. The common defense of this is usually that this is a
logical notation devised for purposes of logic, and it does not claim
to capture every nuance of the natural language forms that the symbols
resemble. So perhaps
‘∀*x*(*S**x* →
*P**x*)’ does fail to do complete justice to
ordinary usage of ‘Every *S* is *P*’, but
this is not a problem with the logic. If you think that ‘Every
*S* is *P*’ requires for its truth that there be
*S*s, then you can have that result simply and easily: just
represent the recalcitrant uses of ‘Every *S* is
*P*’ in symbolic notation by adding an extra conjunct to
the symbolization, like this:
∀*x*(*S**x*
→ *P**x*)
&
∃*x**S**x*.

This defense leaves logic intact and also meets the objection, which is not a logical objection, but merely a reservation about the representation of natural language.

Authors typically go on to explain that we often wish to make
generalizations in science when we are unsure of whether or not they
have instances, and sometimes even when we know they do not, and they
sometimes use this as a defense of symbolizing the **A**
form so as to allow it to be vacuously true. This is, however, an
argument from convenience of notation, and does not bear on logical
coherence.

### 1.2 The Argument Against the Traditional Square

Why does the traditional square need revising at all? The argument
is a simple
one:^{[2]}

Suppose that ‘S’ is an empty term; it is true of nothing. Then theIform: ‘SomeSisP’ is false. But then its contradictoryEform: ‘NoSisP’ must be true. But then the subalternOform: ‘SomeSis notP’ must be true. But that is wrong, since there aren't anySs.

The puzzle about this argument is why the doctrine of the traditional square was maintained for well over 20 centuries in the face of this consideration. Were 20 centuries of logicians so obtuse as not to have noticed this apparently fatal flaw? Or is there some other explanation?

One possibility is that logicians previous to the 20th century must
have thought that no terms are empty. You see this view referred to
frequently as one that others
held.^{[3]}
But with a few very
special exceptions (discussed below) I have been unable to find anyone
who held such a view before the nineteenth century. Many authors do not
discuss empty terms, but those who do typically take their presence for
granted. Explicitly rejecting empty terms was never a mainstream
option, even in the nineteenth century.

In fact, the traditional doctrine of [SQUARE] is completely coherent
in the presence of empty terms. This is because on the traditional
interpretation, the **O** form lacks existential
import. The **O** form is (vacuously) true if its subject
term is empty, not false, and thus the logical interrelations of
[SQUARE] are unobjectionable. In what follows, I trace the development
of this view.

## 2. Origin of the Square of Opposition

The *doctrine* that I call [SQUARE], occurs in Aristotle. It
begins in *De Interpretatione* 6–7, which contains three
claims: that **A** and **O** are
contradictories, that **E** and **I** are
contradictories, and that **A** and **E**
are contraries (17b.17–26):

I call an affirmation and a negation contradictory opposites when what one signifies universally the other signifies not universally, e.g. every man is white—not every man is white, no man is white—some man is white. But I call the universal affirmation and the universal negation contrary opposites, e.g. every man is just—no man is just. So these cannot be true together, but their opposites may both be true with respect to the same thing, e.g. not every man is white—some man is white.

This gives us the following fragment of the square:

But the rest is there by implication. For example, there is enough to
show that **I** and **O** are subcontraries:
they cannot both be false. For suppose that **I** is
false. Then its contradictory, **E**, is true. So
**E**'s contrary, **A**, is false. So
**A**'s contradictory, **O**, is true. This
refutes the possibility that **I** and **O**
are both false, and thus fills in the bottom relation of
subcontraries. Subalternation also follows. Suppose that the
**A** form is true. Then its contrary **E**
form must be false. But then the **E** form's
contradictory, **I**, must be true. Thus if the
**A** form is true, so must be the **I**
form. A parallel argument establishes subalternation from
**E** to **O** as well. The result is
SQUARE.

In *Prior Analytics* I.2, 25a.1–25 we get the additional
claims that the **E** and **I** propositions
convert simply. Putting this together with the doctrine of *De
Interpretatione* we have the full
[SQUARE].^{[4]}

### 2.1 The Diagram

The diagram accompanying and illustrating the doctrine shows up already in the second century CE Boethius incorporated it into his writing, and it passed down through the dark ages to the high medieval period, and from thence to today. Diagrams of this sort were popular among late classical and medieval authors, who used them for a variety of purposes. (Similar diagrams for modal propositions were especially popular.)

### 2.2 Aristotle's Formulation of the O Form

Ackrill's translation contains something a bit remarkable: Aristotle's
articulation of the **O** form is *not* the
familiar ‘Some *S* is not *P*’ or one of its
variants; it is rather ‘Not every *S* is
*P*’. With this wording, Aristotle's doctrine
automatically escapes the modern criticism. (This holds for his views
throughout *De
Interpretatione*.^{[5]})
For assume again that ‘*S*’ is an empty term, and
suppose that this makes the **I** form ‘Some
*S* is *P*’ false. Its contradictory, the
**E** form: ‘No *S* is *P*’, is
thus true, and this entails the **O** form in Aristotle's
formulation: ‘Not every *S* is *P*’, which
must therefore be true. When the **O** form was worded
‘Some *S* is not *P*’ this bothered us, but
with it worded ‘Not every *S* is *P*’ it
seems plainly right. Recall that we are granting that ‘Every
*S* is *P*’ has existential import, and so if
‘*S*’ is empty the **A** form must be
false. But then ‘Not every *S* is *P*’
*should* be true, as Aristotle's square requires.

On this view *affirmatives* have existential import, and
*negatives* do not—a point that became elevated to a general
principle in late medieval
times.^{[6]}
The ancients thus did
not see the incoherence of the square as formulated by Aristotle
because there was no incoherence to see.

### 2.3 The Rewording of the O Form

Aristotle's work was made available to the Latin west principally via
Boethius's translations and commentaries, written a bit after 500
CE. In his translation of *De interpretatione*, Boethius
preserves Aristotle's wording of the **O** form as "Not
every man is white." But when Boethius comments on this text he
illustrates Aristotle's doctrine with the now-famous diagram, and he
uses the wording ‘Some man is not
just’.^{[7]}
So this must have seemed
to him to be a natural equivalent in Latin. It looks odd to us in
English, but he wasn't bothered by it.

Early in the twelfth century Abelard objected to Boethius's
rewording of the **O**
form,^{[8]}
but Abelard's writing was not widely influential, and except for him
and some of his followers people regularly used ‘Some *S*
is not *P*’ for the **O** form in the
diagram that represents the square. Did they allow the
**O** form to be vacuously true? Perhaps we can get some
clues to how medieval writers interpreted these forms by looking at
other doctrines they endorsed. These are the theory of the syllogism
and the doctrines of contraposition and obversion.

## 3. The (Ir)relevance of Syllogistic

One central concern of the Aristotelian tradition in logic is the
theory of the categorical syllogism. This is the theory of
two-premised arguments in which the premises and conclusion share
three terms among them, with each proposition containing two of
them. It is distinctive of this enterprise that everybody agrees on
which syllogisms are valid. The theory of the syllogism partly
constrains the interpretation of the forms. For example, it determines
that the **A** form has existential import, at least if
the **I** form does. For one of the valid patterns
(Barbari^{[9]})
is:

EveryBisC

EveryAisB

So, someAisC

This is invalid if the **A** form lacks existential
import, and valid if it has existential import. It is held to be
valid, and so we know how the **A** form is to be
interpreted. One then naturally asks about the **O**
form; what do the syllogisms tell us about it? The answer is that they
tell us nothing beyond the fact that the **O** form is
entailed by the **E** form. This lack of an answer is a
fluke, resulting from the restrictions on what counts as a categorical
syllogism; cases that would clearly decide the issue are not
well-formed categorical syllogisms. At most, the theory confirms what
we already know from SQUARE: that truth of the **E** form
entails truth of the **O** form. And so if you are sure
that the **E** form lacks such import, the
**O** form must also lack it. Syllogistic gets us no
further than this, though it does confirm that this body of theory
nicely coheres with the lack of existential import of the
**O** form.

## 4. The Principles of Contraposition and Obversion

One other piece of subject-matter bears on the interpretation of the **O**
form. People were interested in Aristotle's discussion of "infinite"
negation,^{[10]}
which is the use of negation to form a term from a term instead of a
proposition from a proposition. In modern English we use "non" for
this; we make "non-horse," which is true of exactly those things that
are not horses. In medieval Latin "non" and "not" are the same word,
and so the distinction required special discussion. It became common
to use infinite negation, and logicians pondered its logic. Some
writers in the twelfth and thirteenth centuries adopted a principle
called "conversion by contraposition." It states that

- ‘Every
*S*is*P*’ is equivalent to ‘Every non-*P*is non-*S*’

- ‘Some
*S*is not*P*’ is equivalent to ‘Some non-*P*is not non-*S*’

Unfortunately, this principle (which is not endorsed by
Aristotle^{[11]})
conflicts with the idea that there may be empty or universal
terms. For in the universal case it leads directly from the truth:

Every man is a being

to the falsehood:

Every non-being is a non-man

(which is false because the universal affirmative has existential
import, and there are no non-beings). And in the particular case it
leads from the truth (remember that the **O** form has no
existential import):

A chimera is not a man

to the falsehood:

A non-man is not a non-chimera

These are Buridan's examples, used in the fourteenth century to show
the invalidity of contraposition. Unfortunately, by Buridan's time the
principle of contraposition had been advocated by a number of authors.
The doctrine is already present in several twelfth century
tracts,^{[12]}
and it is endorsed in the thirteenth
century by Peter of
Spain,^{[13]}
whose work was republished for centuries,
and by William
Sherwood.^{[14]}
By the fourteenth century, problems
associated with contraposition seem to be well-known, and authors
generally cite the principle and note that it is not valid, but that it
becomes valid with an additional assumption of existence of things
falling under the subject term. For example, Paul of Venice in his
eclectic and widely published *Logica Parva* from the end of the
fourteenth century gives the traditional square with simple
conversion^{[15]}
but rejects conversion by contraposition,
essentially for Buridan's reason.

A similar thing happened with the principle of obversion. This is the principle that states that you can change a proposition from affirmative to negative, or vice versa, if you change the predicate term from finite to infinite (or infinite to finite). Some examples are:

Every SisP= No Sis non-PNo SisP= Every Sis non-PSome SisP= Some Sis not non-PSome Sis notP= Some Sis non-P

Aristotle discussed some instances of obversion in *De
Interpretatione*. It is apparent, given the truth conditions for
the forms, that these inferences are valid when moving from affirmative
to negative, but not in the reverse direction when the terms may be
empty, as Buridan makes
clear.^{[16]}
Some medieval writers
before Buridan accepted the fallacious versions, and some did
not.^{[17]}

## 5. Later Developments

In Paul of Venice's other major work, the *Logica Magna*
(*circa* 1400), he gives some pertinent examples of particular
negative propositions that follow from true universal negatives. His
examples of true particular negatives with patently empty subject terms
are
these:^{[18]}

Some man who is a donkey is not a donkey.What is different from being is not.

Some thing willed against by a chimera is not willed against by a chimera.

A chimera does not exist.

Some man whom a donkey has begotten is not his son.

So by the end of the 14th century the problem of empty terms was
clearly recognized. They were permitted in the theory, the
**O** form definitely did not have existential import,
and the logical theory, stripped of the incorrect special cases of
contraposition and obversion, was coherent and immune to 20th century
criticism.

Work on logic continued for the next couple of centuries, though
most of it was lost and had little influence. But the topic of empty
terms was squarely faced, and all solutions that were given within the
Medieval tradition were consistent with [SQUARE]. I rely here on
Ashworth 1974, 201–02, who reports the most common themes in the
context of post-medieval discussions of contraposition. One theme is
that contraposition is invalid when applied to universal or empty
terms, for the sorts of reasons given by Buridan. The **O** form is
explicitly held to lack existential import. A second theme, which
Ashworth says was the most usual thing to say, is also found in
Buridan: additional inferences, such as contraposition, become valid
when supplemented by an additional premise asserting that the terms in
question are non-empty.

### 5.1 An Oddity

There is one odd view that occurs at least twice, which may have as
a consequence that there are no empty terms. In the thirteenth century,
Lambert of Auxerre proposed that a term such as ‘chimera’
which stands for no existing thing must "revert to nonexistent things."
So if we suppose that no roses exist, then the term
‘rose’ stands for nonexistent
things.^{[19]}
A related view also
occurs much later; Ashworth reports that Menghus Blanchellus Faventinus
held that term negations such as ‘nonman’ are true of
non-beings, and he concluded from this that ‘A nonman is a
chimera’ is true (apparently assuming that ‘chimera’
is also true of
nonbeings).^{[20]}
However, neither of these views seems to
have been clearly developed, and neither was widely adopted (or even
widely
discussed).^{[21]}
Nor is it even clear that either of them
is supposed to have the consequence that there are no empty terms.

### 5.2 Modern, Renaissance, and Nineteenth Centuries

According to
Ashworth,^{[22]}
serious and sophisticated investigation of logic ended at about the
third decade of the sixteenth century. The *Port Royal Logic*
of the following (seventeenth) century seems typical in its approach:
its authors frequently suggest that logic is trivial and
unimportant. Its doctrine includes that of the square of opposition,
but the discussion of the **O** form is so vague that
nobody could pin down its exact truth conditions, and there is
certainly no awareness indicated of problems of existential
import. This seems to typify popular texts for the next while. In the
nineteenth century, the apparently most widely used textbook in
Britain and America was Whately's *Elements of Logic*. Whately
gives the traditional doctrine of the square, without any discussion
of issues of existential import or of empty terms. He includes the
problematic principles of contraposition (which he calls "conversion
by negation"):

Every SisP= Every not- Pis not-SNo SisP= No not- Pis not-S

He also endorses
obversion:^{[23]}

- Some
*A*is not*B*is equivalent to Some*A*is not-*B*, and thus it converts to Some not-*B*is*A*.

He says that this principle is "not found in Aldrich," but that it is
"in frequent
use."^{[24]}
This "frequent use" continued; later
nineteenth and early twentieth century text books in England and
America continued to endorse obversion (also called "infinitation" or
"permutation"), and contraposition (also called "illative
conversion").^{[25]}
This full nineteenth century tradition is consistent only on the
assumption that empty (and universal) terms are prohibited, but
authors seem unaware of this; Keynes 1928, 126, says generously "This
assumption appears to have been made implicitly in the traditional
treatment of logic." De Morgan is atypical in making the assumption
explicit: in his 1847 text (64) he forbids universal terms (empty
terms disappear by implication because if *A* is empty,
non-*A* will be universal), and in his technical 1860 work he
justifies this limitation on the grounds that universal terms are
"needless"
(16).^{[26]}

In the twentieth century Łukasiewicz also developed a version of syllogistic that depends explicitly on the absence of empty terms; he attributed the system to Aristotle, thus helping to foster the tradition according to which the ancients were unaware of empty terms.

Today, logic texts divide between those based on contemporary logic and those from the Aristotelian tradition or the nineteenth century tradition, but even many texts that teach syllogistic teach it with the forms interpreted in the modern way, so that e.g. subalternation is lost. So the traditional square, as traditionally interpreted, is now mostly abandoned.

## 6. Strawson's Defense

In the twentieth century there were many creative uses of logical
tools and techniques in reassessing past doctrines. One might
naturally wonder if there is some ingenious interpretation of the
square that attributes existential import to the **O**
form *and* makes sense of it all without forbidding empty or
universal terms, thus reconciling traditional doctrine with modern
views. Peter Geach, 1970, 62–64, shows that this can be done
using an unnatural interpretation. Peter Strawson, 1952, 176–78,
had a more ambitious goal. Strawson's idea was to justify the square
by adopting a nonclassical view of truth of statements, and by
redefining the logical relation of validity. First, he suggested, we
need to suppose that a proposition whose subject term is empty is
neither true nor false, but lacks truth value altogether. Then we say
that *Q* entails *R* just in case there are no instances
of *Q* and *R* such that the instance of *Q* is
true and the instance of *R* is false. For example, the
**A** form ‘Every *S* is *P*’
entails the **I** form ‘Some *S* is
*P*’ because there is no instance of the
**A** form that is true when the corresponding instance
of the **I** form is false. The troublesome cases
involving empty terms turn out to be instances in which one or both
forms lack truth value, and these are irrelevant so far as entailment
is concerned. With this revised account of entailment, all of the
"traditional" logical relations result, if they are worded as follows:

Contradictories: The AandOforms entail each other's negations, as do theEandIforms. The negation of theAform entails the (unnegated)Oform, andvice versa; likewise for theEandIforms.Contraries: The AandEforms entail each other's negationsSubcontraries: The negation of the Iform entails the (unnegated)Eform, andvice versa.Subalternation: The Aform entails theIform, and theEform entails theOform.Converses: The EandIforms each entail their own converses.Contraposition: The AandOforms each entail their own contrapositives.Obverses: Each form entails its own obverse.

These doctrines are not, however, the doctrines of [SQUARE]. The
doctrines of [SQUARE] are worded entirely in terms of the possibilities
of truth values, not in terms of entailment. So "entailment" is
irrelevant to [SQUARE]. It turns out that Strawson's revision of truth
conditions *does* preserve the principles of SQUARE (these can
easily be checked by
cases),^{[27]}
but not the additional conversion principles of [SQUARE], and also
not the traditional principles of contraposition or obversion. For
example, Strawson's reinterpreted version of conversion holds for the
**I** form because any **I** form
proposition entails its own converse: if ‘Some *A* is
*B*’ and ‘Some *B* is *A*’ both
have truth value, then neither has an empty subject term, and so if
neither lack truth value and if either is true the other will be true
as well. But the original doctrine of conversion says that an
*I* form and its converse always have the same truth value, and
that is false on Strawson's account; if there are *A*s but no
*B*s, then ‘Some *A* is *B*’ is false
and ‘Some *B* is *A*’ has no truth value at
all. Similar results follow for contraposition and obversion.

The "traditional logic" that Strawson discusses is much closer to
that of nineteenth century logic texts than it is to the version that
held sway for two millennia before
that.^{[28]}
But even though he
literally salvages a version of nineteenth century logic, the view he
saves is unable to serve the purposes for which logical principles are
formulated, as was pointed out by Timothy Smiley in a short note in
*Mind* in
1967.^{[29]}
People have always taken the square to
embody principles by which one can reason, and by which one can
construct extended chains of reasoning. But if you string together
Strawson's entailments you can infer falsehoods from truths, something
that nobody in any tradition would consider legitimate. For example,
begin with this truth (the subject term is non-empty):

No man is a chimera.

By conversion, we get:

No chimera is a man.

By obversion:

Every chimera is a non-man.

By subalternation:

Some chimera is a non-man.

By conversion:

Some non-man is a chimera.

Since there are non-men, the conclusion is not truth-valueless, and
since there are no chimeras it is false. Thus we have passed from a
true claim to a false one. (The example does not even involve the
problematic **O** form.) All steps are validated by
Strawson's doctrine. So Strawson reaches his goal of preserving
certain patterns commonly identified as constituting traditional
logic, but at the cost of sacrificing the application of logic to
extended reasoning.

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Aristotle, General Topics: logic | Brentano, Franz: theory of judgement | contradiction | syllogism: medieval theories of | terms, properties of: medieval theories of