Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Spinoza's Modal Metaphysics

1. Cf. Oldenburg's remark on behalf of others in Ep74, “If this [necessitarianism] is conceded and affirmed, they say, the sinews of all law, all virtue and religion are severed,” and Jonathan Bennett's remark: “This implies that every particular proposition is itself necessary, that being the dangerously false thesis towards which his explanatory rationalism is pushing him” (Bennett (1984), 121, emphasis mine).

2. See the bibliography for a list of the most recent and/or influential discussions in English.

3. For the most part, I will ignore the thorny issue of how to fit the attributes, like extension and thought, into Spinoza's ontology. Spinoza claims that attributes somehow constitute the essence of substance (Id4), and in Ip4d he even suggests that the attributes are identical to substance itself, though it is far from obvious how to understand this one-to-many identity claim.

4. See also Iax4, Iax5, and Ip3d. The pesky PSR question of what is it in virtue of which these conceptual relations obtain is a difficult one. Leibniz was inclined towards an answer in terms of asymmetrical containment: y conceptually depends on x in virtue of the containment of the concept of y in the concept of x. Spinoza once glosses conceptual relations in terms of containment in passing (C 245), but he fails to develop this idea further, and instead he usually relies on the more ambiguous description of conceptual “involvement.”

5. Spinoza's argument for (5) invokes an a posteriori claim that something or other exists (he uses “we exist” in Ip11d, but anything existing will work). His argument is that (a) something exists; (b) everything that exists exists either in itself (substances) or in another (modes) (Iax1); (c) it is impossible for something that is in another to exist unless that in which it inheres also exists (Ip1 and Ip11d). Spinoza then runs a simple argument by cases: (d′) If a substance is among the things existing in (a), then a substance exists. (d″) If a mode is among the things existing in (a), then a substance exists. Conclusion: since, by (b), nothing besides substances and modes exist, it follows from (a)-(d) that at least one substance exists. (The basis for (d′) is obvious. The basis for (d″) is the fact that modes inhere in substance and (c).)

6. For a good discussion of (4-6), see Garrett (1979). For a good discussion of (9), see Della Rocca (2001).

7. See Descartes' Principles I.53 (CSM I/210) and Comments on a Certain Broadsheet (CSM I/298).

8. This version is taken from Leibniz's early Confessio philosophi (CP 29), but there are many variations of it across Leibniz's corpus. For one of the most recent discussions of Leibniz's views on perfection and harmony, see Strickland (2006).

9. For the most well known version of the “category mistake” objection (as well a discussion of other problems with the property/mode reading), see Curley (1969).

10. Sometimes the absolute/hypothetical distinction is put in terms of the distinction between the necessity of the consequence versus necessity of the consequent. The point being made is that the necessity of the antecedent plus the necessity of the consequence brings about the necessity of the consequent.

11. Obviously, more needs to be said if one wishes to understand how something that necessarily exists can nonetheless be dependent on something else that also necessarily exists. (That is, how can we really make sense of an internal distinction among sources of absolute necessity, and hence a kind of dependence between necessary existents?) On standard accounts of entailment relations between necessary propositions, there will be no space for the required asymmetry. As we will see in later sections, Spinoza's own account of modality allows for such asymmetry, which provides yet one more reason for thinking Spinoza's following-from relation is not simply the modern strict entailment relation. (More accurately, Spinoza's account of modality allows for antisymmetry, since the existence of substance will follow from itself (and hence its necessity will be, in a sense, self-derived).)

12. Spinoza will also need to rule out AP3, the possibility that the actually existing infinite modes could not have had different characteristics than they in fact have. But Spinoza seems to think that effects are wholly determined by their causes in the sense that both their existence and their characteristics are all at least hypothetically necessary. There are no self-determining features of modes; everything about a mode is necessarily determined by its causes. In the case of infinite modes, since those causes are themselves absolutely necessary, this means that both the existence and characteristics of infinite modes are absolutely necessary. Hence AP3 will not be a genuine alternative possibility for infinite modes. If we follow Curley in thinking of the infinite modes as the ontological expressions of the laws of nature (at different levels of generalization), denying AP3 would amount to denying that the laws of nature could have been different than they in fact are.

13. Leibniz appears to have read Spinoza's Ip28 in this way (L 203).

14. Ibid.

15. This account comes dangerously close to talking about two distinct kinds of necessity, which is foreign to Spinoza. Defenders will sometimes point to Spinoza's claim in Ip33s that there are two distinct sources of necessity (an object's essence and an object's cause), but there is no reason to think this distinction of source maps onto a distinction of kind or even strength. The point about source, I suggested earlier, is a distinction internal to absolute necessity.

16. Leibniz develops this PSR point nicely (L 486), though the conclusions he reaches from it are very different from Spinoza's.

17. Notice that, if the entire collection of finite modes is itself an infinite mode, a suggestion Garrett makes, the distinction between [b] and [c] would collapse.

18. Keep in mind the two different kinds of “absolute” distinctions being discussed here. There is the distinction between absolute and hypothetical necessity, which raises a question about the strength of Spinoza's modal views. There is also Spinoza's distinction on Garrett's reading between following from God's absolute nature and following from God's non-absolute nature, which raises a question about the closeness of the relationship between God and God's modes.

19. Spinoza's determinism, on this reading by Curley, is strong in that the laws of nature are necessary, a point that many other determinists would reject. However, the antecedent finite causes of every finite object are not necessary, and so the resulting finite objects will always remain contingent, despite being partially determined by something that is necessary. Necessitarianism, which is much stronger than mere determinism, requires that even the antecedent states of the world are necessary; there is absolutely no contingency according to full-blown necessitarianism.

20. A sentiment confirmed by one J. Jackson in 1734: “When it appears that an absolute necessity in the nature of things themselves is the reason and ground of their being what they are, we must necessarily stop at this ground and reason; and to ask what is the reason of this reason which is in the nature of things the last of all reasons, is absurd” (quoted in Lovejoy (1936), 148).

21. Incidentally, this provides Spinoza a basis from which to criticize some forms of contemporary anti-essentialism, according to which cheaply made conceptual (or, more likely, analytical) connections between objects and properties are sufficient and jointly necessary for metaphysically determining modal facts.

22. It also allows us to answer Bennett's similar questions (Bennett 1984, 123).