Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Russell's Moral Philosophy

Russell's Influence on Moore — the Open Question Argument

1. The Open Qeustion Argument versus Barren Tautology Argument

‘I certainly have been more influenced by [Russell] than any other single philosopher’ wrote Moore in his intellectual autobiography (Schilpp ed. (1942): 16). But Moore's ‘Autobiography’ suggests (without actually saying so) that this influence was mostly metaphysical. I shall argue that Russell had a considerable influence on Moore's ethical doctrines and that some of Moore's key ideas were developed in the course of ongoing debates with Russell.

Moore's Principia Ethica took a long time to finish. He had a pretty good draft in 1898, but he did not publish it until 1903. Why the long delay? One reason, I suspect, was that he had to deal with a problem posed (perhaps unwittingly) by Russell.

It is not generally recognized that Principia Ethica contains two distinct arguments against the ‘Naturalistic Fallacy’, the supposed intellectual error of identifying goodness with some other property (usually, though not necessarily, a naturalistic property). The first, which is derived from Sidgwick, and has a long philosophical pedigree, goes something like this:

(1.1) For any naturalistic or metaphysical ‘X’, if ‘good’ meant ‘X’, then (i) ‘X things are good’ would be a barren tautology, equivalent to (ii) ‘X things are X’ or (iii) ‘Good things are good’.

(1.2) For any naturalistic or metaphysical ‘X’, if (i) ‘X things are good’ were a barren tautology, it would not provide a reason for action (i.e. a reason to promote X-ness).

(1.3) So for any naturalistic or metaphysical ‘X’, either (i) ‘X things are good’ does not provide a reason for action (i.e. a reason to promote X-ness), or ‘good’ does not mean ‘X’.

To put the point another way:

(1.3′) For any naturalistic or metaphysical ‘X’, if (i) ‘X things are good’ provides a reason for action (that is, a reason to promote X-ness), then ‘good’ does not mean ‘X’.

Following Russell, I call this the Barren Tautology Argument or BTA (RoE: 100/Papers 4: 572). The idea is that ‘good’ cannot be synonymous with any naturalistic ‘X’, if ‘X things are good’ is supposed to be a reason for action rather than a ‘barren tautology’. So for example, if ‘good’ just means ‘pleasant’ then ‘Pleasant things are good’ is a barren tautology (equivalent to ‘Pleasant things are pleasant’ or ‘Good things are good’) and cannot provide us with a reason for the pursuit of pleasure. Only if ‘goodness’ and ‘pleasure’ are not synonymous, can ‘Pleasant things are good’ provide an intellectual incentive for the pursuit of pleasant things. This argument crops up at PE: §11, though variants of it recur throughout the first four chapters (PE: §§14, 24 & 26). However Moore did not invent it. A.N.Prior, in his (1949) Logic and the Basis of Ethics, ch. IX, traces it back to Cudworth in the 17th Century, though it doubtful whether Moore was aware of this. (He does not seem to have been particularly well read.) But it certainly occurs in Sidgwick, which is presumably where Moore got it from. The Barren Tautology Argument is to be distinguished from the Open Question Argument proper (the OQA), which Moore did invent. This occurs at PE: §13, a section that does not appear in the 1898 draft. It can be stated thus:

(1.4) ‘Are X things good?’ is a significant or open question for any naturalistic or metaphysical predicate ‘X’ (whether simple or complex). [A question is significant or open if an understanding of the language does not suffice for an answer. Thus ‘Are bachelors unmarried?’ is not an Open Question.]

(1.5) If two expressions (whether simple or complex) are synonymous this is evident on reflection to every competent speaker.

(1.6) The meaning of a predicate or property word is the property for which it stands. Thus if two predicates or property words have distinct meanings they name distinct properties.

From (1.4) and (1.5) it follows that

(1.7) ‘Good’ is not synonymous with any naturalistic or metaphysical predicate ‘X’ (or ‘goodness’ with any corresponding noun or noun-phrase ‘X-ness’).

If ‘good’ were synonymous with some naturalistic predicate ‘X’, then this would be obvious on reflection to every competent speaker. Hence there would be some question of the form ‘Are X things good?’ which would not appear to be open to competent speakers, since an understanding of the words involved would suffice for an affirmative answer. Given (1.4), there is no such question; hence ‘good’ is not synonymous with any naturalistic predicate ‘X’.

From (1.6) and (1.7) it follows that

(1.8) Goodness is not identical with any natural or metaphysical property of X-ness.

This argument is wheeled on to discredit a particular naturalistic analysis of ‘good’ — ‘one of the more plausible, because one of the more complicated of such definitions’ — that ‘ good mean[s] … that which we desire to desire’. Where did Moore get this definition? He does not say, crediting it, in effect, to Mr Nobody. But in fact the inventor of this plausible but fallacious definition was none other than Bertrand Russell.

2. Wrestling With Desire: the Young Russell's Adventures in Meta-Ethics

The desire-to-desire theory is the last in a sequence of three attempts to provide a foundation for ethics by defining ‘good’ in terms of desire. In the first, ‘X is good’ means ‘X will satisfy my desires’; in the second, it means ‘I want X for its own sake’; and in the third it means ‘X is what I desire to desire’ (RoE: chs. 7, 9 & 10/Papers 1: nos. 36, 39 & 15).

‘Ethical Axioms’ (1894) was the last piece that Russell wrote for Sidgwick's course on ethics. (RoE: 53-56/Papers 1: 226-228.) Russell takes it as a datum that ‘we do make moral judgments’ and that ‘we regard these, like judgments as to what is, as liable to truth and falsehood’. We are ‘precluded from skepticism’ (presumably the view that moral judgments are all false) ‘by the mere fact we will and act’. (This is not a very convincing argument since I can desire something — and hence act — without thinking it good, as non-human animals presumably do. The precondition of action is desire, not desire tricked out in the vocabulary of good and evil.) Hence ‘some basis must be found for ethical judgments’, but ‘it is sufficiently obvious that such a basis cannot be sought in any proposition about what is or has been’. Thus Russell has set himself a rather difficult problem, since it is not at all clear that there can be any true propositions that are not, in some sense, propositions about what is, has been or will be. Perhaps what he has in mind is a set of self-evident axioms about what ought to be or what we ought to do which do not admit of any further analysis. But he rejects this option because ‘the Kantian maxim’ (whatever that is) is purely formal and because no ‘material precept’ ‘has obtained the universal consent of moralists’. (It seems that a maxim cannot count as self-evident unless it is evident to every qualified self.) Russell also rejects the view that moral judgments are ‘merely statements of a psychological state’ (as, for example, that the speaker desires this or that) on the grounds that in that case ‘they could not err (except by the speaker's mistaking his own feelings)’. He seems to think that it is a conceptual truth that moral judgments are liable to error. Finally he plumps for the view that ‘we may define the good as that which satisfies desire’ (that is, that what is good for each person is what will satisfy that person's desires). This allows for the possibility of error, for though we usually know what we want, we can be wrong about whether we will like it when we get it. Russell hastens to explain that this definition is not as sordid as it sounds. ‘Our duty will consist in self-realization, but self-realization may of course be best attained by what is commonly called self-sacrifice.’

It is nice to know that no sordid or selfish consequences flow from defining the goodness in terms of the satisfaction of desire, but it is not at all clear that Russell has solved the problem that he set himself. For propositions about what will satisfy desire are propositions about what will satisfy desire — that is, propositions about what will be. Underlying Russell's argument is his evident desire to forge a conceptual connection between moral belief and action. The theory must (help) explain the fact that we often do what we believe to be our duty and usually pursue and promote what we believe to be good. (This, not the thesis that we are necessarily motivated by our moral beliefs, is the premise of Hume's famous Motivation Argument at Treatise, 3.1.1: ‘And this is confirmed by common experience, which informs us that men are often governed by their duties, and are deterred from some actions by the opinion of injustice, and impelled to others by that of obligation [my italics]’. See Raphael, D.D. ed. (1991) The British Moralists [henceforward BM): §489].) Russell appears to have thought that a theory that left ‘good’ and ‘ought’ undefined would not meet this constraint. But if ‘good’ means what procures satisfaction, then we have the beginnings of such an explanation. For we usually desire that our desires be satisfied, and hence have a reason to pursue and promote the good.

This theory soon ceased to satisfy and Russell reverted to the problem in ‘Are All Desires Equally Moral?’, a paper he composed in about 1896 (RoE: 68-70/Papers 1: 242-44). ‘The Good, for me, at any moment’, he declares, ‘is what I want’ not what will satisfy my wants, since we desire the objects that will satisfy desire and not, ‘except derivatively’, that those desires should be satisfied. (This last point is distinctly dubious. Isn't Reid's desire for our good-on-the-whole in part a second order desire that at least some of our first-order desires should be satisfied? [See Reid, Thomas, (1788) Essays on the Active Powers of Man, excerpted in BM: §§ 861-865.] And did not Russell himself believe that this desire was not only real but often unduly predominant in civilized persons, so much so that most of what we do is done for the sake of something else not because we have a spontaneous first-order desire to do it? See for instance his 1894 paper ‘Cleopatra or Maggie Tulliver’ [RoE: 57-67, Papers 1: 92-98] though the theme is repeated in subsequent writings such as The Principles of Social Reconstruction, first published in 1916.) Thus ‘X is good’, means ‘I want X’, a particularly crude kind of subjectivism that goes back to Hobbes (‘whatsoever is the object of any man's appetite or desire; that is it which he for his part calleth good’. BM: §25.) This theory maintains the link between moral belief and action (naturally we pursue and promote the things that we want!) though it a) reduces moral judgments to ‘statements of a psychological state’ and b) violates the requirement that statements about what ought to be should have nothing to do with what is, since, on this theory, my moral judgments reduce to statements about what is going on inside my head. The theory as stated is a little too crude for Russell however, since it precludes the possibility of moral error. After all, it is difficult to be wrong about what we want. The theory has the further unhappy consequence that we cannot desire what we believe to be bad, let alone what is bad, since from the very fact that I desire something, it follows that for me, at least, it is good. All desires are equally moral since they are all desires for the good.

Russell tries to sidestep these problems by distinguishing between ‘primary desires, for ends, and secondary desires, for means’. The good for each person is what he desires for its own sake and generally speaking he cannot be mistaken about this. But he can be mistaken about whether a given object is the means to what he ultimately desires. Furthermore, if he is mistaken, his secondary desires may be immoral. As Russell realizes, this leads to the ‘Socratic maxim that no man sins wittingly’ since nobody can desire what he believes to be bad. But an agent can both desire the bad and have bad desires, since his secondary desires may be inimical to his ultimate ends. Unfortunately this amendment cannot save the theory. According to Russell's theory, in some cases at any rate ‘X is good’, means ‘I want X for its own sake’, and such judgments are relatively immune from error. Furthermore, people do seem to desire what they believe to be bad (the ‘Socratic maxim’ is not known as the ‘Socratic Paradox’ for nothing!) and we commonly think that desires for ends, as well as desires for means, can be bad. Finally, the theory, even in its amended form, reduces moral judgments to statements of a psychological state. Thus the theory violates Russell's theoretical constraints and is inconsistent with the way we usually talk.

What about the desire-to-desire theory? If ‘X is good’ means ‘I desire to desire X’ then there is a conceptual connection, though, as Lewis notes, an ‘iffy’ one, between moral belief and action (Lewis (1989) 116/72). I will pursue and promote what I believe to be good in so far as I desire what I desire to desire. Moral judgments ‘like judgments as to what is, [are] liable to truth and falsehood’, though not very liable to falsehood, since it is difficult, but not impossible, to be mistaken about what we desire to desire. (I might be persuaded, especially under moral pressure, that I desire to desire something when in fact I do not.) But it is possible both to desire the bad (to desire what I desire not to desire) and to have bad desires (to have desires which I desire to desire not to desire). Self-conscious depravity is thus a real possibility and the Socratic paradox is dismissed. For like an unhappy junkie, I can act on desires which I desire not to desire. But it is not possible to desire to desire the bad since what we desire to desire is automatically good. Furthermore, moral judgments are reduced to statements of a psychological state, so much so that ethics becomes a branch of empirical psychology. The axioms of ethics, in so far as there are such things, are concerned with what is, since our desires, including our second-order desires are original existents.

Thus Russell was trying in the 1890s to devise a theory that would meet six constraints:

(2.1) Moral judgments, ‘like judgments as to what is’, must have a truth-value.

(2.2) Moral judgments must be liable to error (two constraints that Russell tends to confuse).

(2.3) There must be a conceptual connection (possibly an iffy one) between moral belief and motivation [a rather weak form of motivational internalism].

(2.4) It must be possible to desire the bad and to have bad desires.

(2.5) Moral judgments must not reduce to ‘statements of a psychological state’.

(2.6) The basis for moral judgments cannot be sought in any proposition about what is, has been or will be.

The last condition, which amounts to the denial of naturalism, goes back to a paper that Russell wrote for Sidgwick in 1893, ‘The Relation of What Ought to be to What Is, Has Been or Will Be’ (RoE: 37-40/Papers 1: 213-214). Russell observes that ‘from the point of view of formal logic’ it is impossible to derive an Ought from an Is. This leads him to the conclusion that ‘some one or more propositions ethical in form must be regarded as axiomatic unless [and this is a big ‘unless’] such propositions are materially equivalent to some assertion about what is, has been or will be. By ‘materially equivalent’ he seems to mean ‘mean the same as’. Thus morality might not hang from the skyhook of intuited axioms if moral judgments meant the same as natural judgments of some kind. But he goes on to argue against this possibility, that is, to argue that what Moore was to call naturalism is false. Nor is it odd that he should have anticipated Moore, since Sidgwick, who was their teacher, anticipated them both.

However this provides Russell with a sextet of constraints that cannot be jointly met. For example, it is hard to see how conditions (2.1) and (2.3) can be realized without analyzing ‘good’ or ‘ought’ in terms of desire or some such psychological state. Yet to do so violates conditions (2.5) and (2.6). Thus it comes as no surprise that the theories which Russell managed to come up with all fail to meet his constraints. The first (‘X is good’ means ‘X will satisfy my desires’) meets conditions (2.1) (since what we want may not satisfy us once we get it). It also meets condition (2.4) (just about) since it is possible to want things that will not, in fact, satisfy us. But it doesn't meet (2.5), since ‘X is good’ reduces to a statement about a future psychological state; and a fortiori it fails to meet condition (2.6). The second theory (‘X is good’ means ‘I want X for its own sake’) fares far worse. It meets condition (2.1) but not (2.2), (2.3) but not (2.4), and fails (2.5) and (2.6) altogether. As for the third (‘X is good’ means ‘X is what I desire to desire’), it meets (2.1), struggles to meet (2.2), meets (2.3) and (2.4) but fails both (2.5) and (2.6).

Interestingly if Russell abandoned (2.1) and (2.2) and adopted a non-cognitive theory he would have been able to arrive at a theory which would have satisfied the last four constraints. Take Russell's own brand of emotivism (‘X is good’ means ‘Would that everyone desired X!’), which he did not develop until 1935. (RoE: 131-144/Religion and Science, ch. IX.) This meets condition (2.3), since if I say that X is good, and if am sincere in my ethical pronouncements, then I desire that everyone (including myself) should desire X — a second order desire that is usually (but not always) accompanied by a first-order desire for X itself. Thus if I ‘believe’ (note the scare quotes!) that X is good, I am likely to pursue or promote it. The theory meets condition (2.4) too, since I can desire things, from chocolate to crack, that I desire nobody (including myself) to desire. It meets condition (2.5) as well, since good-judgments, so far from being statements of a psychological state, are not statements at all but optatives. For much the same reason it meets condition (2.6): ‘X is good’, is not equivalent to a proposition about what is, has been or will be, because it is not equivalent to any proposition whatsoever. But of course the standard objection to non-cognitivist theories is precisely that they violate conditions (2.1) and (2.2). They treat utterances which are commonly regarded as true or false as lacking in truth-value (at least with respect to their primary meanings) and they immunize moral judgments from error by depriving them of the possibility of falsehood.

Now I don't say that Russell's six constraints are correct (they can't be since they are inconsistent), nor that Russell's meta-ethical theories are right (which at most one of them can be since they, too, are inconsistent). But I do say that the constraints are plausible and that it is a desideratum in a meta-ethical theory that it meet as many as possible. Russell demonstrates his philosophical acumen by making the attempt.

In 1897, Russell decided in effect, to sacrifice conditions (2.5) (2.6), and perhaps (2.2) to conditions (2.1), (2.3) and (2.4). In that year he read a paper to the Cambridge Apostles ‘Is Ethics a Branch of Empirical Psychology’ in which he defined goodness as that which we desire to desire. (RoE: 71-78/Papers I: 100-104). Moral judgments (at least judgments about goodness) reduce to ‘statements of a psychological state’ since to say something is good is to say that ‘we’ desire to desire it, a statement well within the frontiers of psychology (whether ‘we’ refers to the community at large or the speaker whoever he or she may be). And of course, if judgments about goodness reduce to ‘statements of a psychological state’, they clearly reduce to statements about ‘what is, has been or will be’, since whether ‘we’ desire to desire something is determined by whatever is the case in ‘our’ minds. Are moral judgments liable to error? Only in so far as we can be mistaken about what we desire to desire, which is, perhaps, not very far. On the plus side, moral judgments will be true or false, and will have a conceptual connection (albeit an iffy one) to our actions and passions. Assuming that (at least sometimes) I actually desire what I desire to desire, the fact that (for me) X is good means that (at least sometimes) I will have a desire to pursue or promote X. Finally, it is perfectly possible to have bad or even evil desires, namely the desires I desire not to desire, thus solving a problem with Russell's previous attempts at a desire-based ethic. (See RoE: ch. 9/Papers I: ch. 39.) Thus the answer Russell provides to his own question (‘Is Ethics a Branch of Empirical Psychology?’) is a clear, but reluctant, yes.

3. Why the Open Question Argument?

Now why should this theory pose a problem for Moore? Because the time-honored Barren Tautology argument does not work against it. Remember, the conclusion of the Barren Tautology Argument is this:

(1.3′) For any naturalistic or metaphysical ‘X’, if (i) ‘X things are good’, provides a reason for action (that is, a reason to promote X-ness), then ‘good’ does not mean ‘X’.

By substitution this gives us:

(1.3″) If (i′) ‘Things which we desire to desire are good’, provides a reason for action (that is, a reason to promote what we desire to desire), then ‘good’ does not mean ‘what we desire to desire’.

But the point of defining goodness in terms of what we desire to desire is not to give us a reason to pursue or promote what we desire to desire — rather, it is supposed to explain why something's being good gives us a reason (or at least, a motive), to pursue or promote it. Russell is not advocating the pursuit of what we desire to desire: he is trying to provide an analysis of ‘good’ which helps to make sense of the fact that we tend to pursue and promote (what we believe to be) good things. (We do it because to be good just is to be something which we desire to desire, and hence something which, sometimes at any rate, we will actually desire.) In other words, (i′) ‘Things which we desire to desire are good’ is meant to be a barren tautology — barren in terms of practical consequences, that is, though, hopefully, philosophically illuminating. It does not provide (and is not intended to provide) a reason for action. But in that case, the antecedent of (1.3″) — that the belief that ‘Things which we desire to desire are good’, provides a reason for action — is false, so far as Russell's analysis is concerned. Thus even if the conditional (1.3″) is true, it does not support the consequent — that ‘good’ does not mean ‘what we desire to desire’. The Barren Tautology Argument is therefore impotent against the desire-to-desire theory.

Nor is this all. The Barren Tautology Argument fails against other theories whose aim is to explicate the appeal of goodness rather than to advocate the pursuit of some alleged good thing. For instance, if ‘good’ means ‘what we are ideally inclined to approve of’, then ‘What we are ideally inclined to approve of is good’ will be a barren tautology. But since people like Hume, who propound such definitions, don't intend them to be anything else, they are not compelled to the conclusion that such definitions are false. Thus if naturalism was to be defeated (which was clearly Moore's project) a new argument had to be invented. And it is significant, I think, that Moore did not publish Principia Ethica until he had invented just such an argument.

The Open Question Argument proper does not terminate in a conditional but a categorical. It starts with the assumption that ‘Are X things good?’ is a significant or open question for any naturalistic or metaphysical predicate ‘X’. It is not a tautology, barren or otherwise, that what we desire to desire is good, and the proof of this is that competent speakers can sensibly wonder whether or not it is true. Indeed, according to Moore, ‘any one can easily convince himself by inspection’ that the predicate ‘good’ ‘is positively different from the notion of “desiring to desire”’. If we grant Moore's first implicit assumption — that if two expressions are synonymous this is evident on reflection to every competent speaker — we can derive the consequence that ‘good’ does not mean ‘what we desire to desire’. And if we grant his second implicit assumption — that if two predicates or property words have distinct meanings they name distinct properties — then we can derive the conclusion that he really wants, namely that goodness is not identical with what we desire to desire. And by parity or reasoning we can do the same for any naturalistic property whatsoever.

Now Moore's twin assumptions have subsequently fallen upon hard times. (The first leads straight to the Paradox of Analysis, whilst the second would exclude synthetic identities such as water is H2O.) But if they were correct, the OQA would indeed dispose of the desire-to-desire theory along with kindred theories such as Hume's. It is notable that David Lewis, who revived Russell's theory in 1989 (without realizing it was Russell's), explicitly affirms what Moore implicitly denies — that there can be unobvious analytic truths; that is, truths not evident to every competent speaker. (See Lewis (1989) and Pigden (2007).) But if Moore were correct and there were no such things, then naturalistic analyses of the moral concepts such as Russell's would be in big trouble. The BTA only works against some naturalistic analyses of ‘good’, namely those that define ‘good’ in terms of some property that the theorist wishes to promote. The OQA, if it works at all, works against them all. It seems very likely that what prompted Moore to invent his philosophical weapon of mass destruction was the desire-to-desire theory of Bertrand Russell.

‘Then why didn't Moore say so — or at least, why didn't he attribute the desire-to-desire definition to its original inventor?’ Because Russell propounded his definition at a meeting of the Apostles, a supposedly secret society. The rather priggish Moore took the code of secrecy very seriously and used to fuss about discussing the doings of the Apostles by postcard in case they were read in transit. (The slightly less priggish Russell had to reassure him that only college porters were likely to read them and only initiates would understand.) To have attributed the desire-to-desire theory to an Apostolic paper of Russell's would have broken the code of silence (a code designed to promote the unfettered exchange of honest opinion).

There is an irony in this episode. The last page of the paper, ‘Is Ethics a Branch of Empirical Psychology?’ is marked with a query in Russell's hand ‘Shall we spell {Good/good} with’, to which Moore replies ‘Good = good’ - which looks like a succinct formulation of his famous no-definition definition of ‘good’ (‘If I am asked “How is good to be defined?” my answer is that it cannot be defined and that is all I have to say about it.’ PE: 58.) If I am right, Russell's desire-to-desire theory posed a problem for Moore which it took him five years to solve. But, given the annotation, it seems that the debate on Russell's paper began a process of conversion that led Russell himself to accept the doctrines of Moore's Principia Ethica.

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