Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Paul Ricoeur

1. Ricoeur, “On Interpretation,” in TA, trans. Kathleen Blamey and John B. Thompson (Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1991), 15, translation modified.

2. See also Ricoeur, “Negativity and Primary Affirmation” in his History and Truth, trans. Charles Kelbley (Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1965), 305-28, hereafter HT.

3. See Ricoeur, “Nature and Freedom” in his Political and Social Essays, eds. David Stewart and Joseph Bien (Athens: Ohio University Press, 1974), esp. 29-37.

4. Ricoeur, “Intellectual Autobiography” in The Philosophy of Paul Ricoeur, ed. Lewis E. Hahn (Chicago: Open Court, 1995), 16.

5. See Ricoeur, “The Hermeneutical Function of Distantiation” in TA, esp.77-78 and Gary Gutting, French Philosophy in the Twentieth Century (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001), 368-69.

6. Ricoeur, “De l’ésprit,” Révue Philosophique de Louvain, Vol. 92, no. 2,1994, 248. See also Ricoeur, “Autonomie et vulnerabilité,” in his Le Juste II, (Paris: Éditions Esprit, 2001), 88 , and François Dosse, Paul Ricoeur: Les sens d'une vie (Paris: La Découverte, 1997), 651-52, hereafter cited as PRL.

7. Ricoeur, Critique and Conviction, trans. Kathleen Blamey (New York: Columbia University Press, 1998) 74-75.

9. Ricoeur, Paul, Interview with Richard Kearney in Kearney, ed., On Paul Ricoeur: The Owl of Minerva (Aldershot: Ashgate Publishing, 2004) 127, hereafter OPR. Footnote 8Ricoeur in OPR, 129.

9. Ricoeur, “The Model of the Text: Meaningful Action Considered as a Text,” in TA, 145.

10. Ricoeur, “The Model of the Text,” 159.

11. Ricoeur, “The Model of the Text,” 160.

12. Ricoeur, “Explanation and Understanding,” in TA, 137.

13. G. H. von Wright, Explanation and Understanding, (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1971), esp. 50 and 60-82.

14. Ricoeur, “Initiative,” in TA, 214-17.

15. Ricoeur, “Narrated Time,” Philosophy Today, Vol. 29, no.4, 1985, 263.

16. Ricoeur, “Initiative,” 214, my insertion

17. See Ricoeur, Time and Narrative, Vol. III, trans. Kathleen Blamey and David Pellauer (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1988), 164-77 and 301-09. See also his “Entre mémoire et histoire,” Projet, no. 248, 1996, esp. 13-14.

18. Ricoeur, TN, III,108-09. See also Ricoeur, “The Narrative Function,” in his Hermeneutics and the Human Sciences, ed and trans John B. Thompson (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1981), 294. For a good discussion of narrativity, see Jean Greisch, Paul Ricoeur: L'itinérance du sens (Paris: Éditions Jerome Millon, 2001), 175-216.

19. Ricoeur, Time and Narrative, I, trans. Kathleen McLaughlin and David Pellauer (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1984), 52.

20. Ricoeur, Time and Narrative, III, 118. The theme of indebtedness to others figures largely in Ricoeur's later works. There are debts that are in principle never fully repayable. Debts of this sort are of capital importance in his ethical and political thought.

21. Ricoeur finds support for his account in Claude Bremond, Logique du récit (Paris: Éditions du Seuil, 1973), esp. 134.

22. For a helpful discussion of Ricoeur's conception of narrative identity, see David Rasmussen, “Rethinking Subjectivity: Narrative Identity and the Self,” Philosophy and Social Criticism, Vol.21, no. 5, 1995, 159-72.

23. Ricoeur, “Reflections on a New Ethos for Europe,” Philosophy and Social Criticism, Vol. 21, no. 5, 1995, 6, translation modified.

24. See Greisch concerning memory, PRIS, 258-324, and concerning history, PRIS, 217-18.

25. One of Ricoeur's essays deserves special mention. See his “Éthique et Morale: Visée Théologique [sic] et Perspective Déontologique,” in Ragione Pratica Libertà Normatività , ed. Marcello Sanchez Sorondo (Rome: Herder-Università Lateranense, 1991), 353-66. Obviously ‘théologique’ is a misprint for ‘teleologique. See also my Paul Ricoeur: The Promise and Risk of Politics (Lanham, Md.: Rowman & Littlefield, 1998), 141-209, hereafter PRPR

26. For instructive remarks about Ricoeur's ethical thought and that of other thinkers, see Dosse, PRL, 699-755.

27. Later Ricoeur revised his view of the starting point for ethical reflection. According to the revised view ethical reflection begins with a two-fold realization. On the one hand, a person realizes that there are some things that ought to be done or that to do some things is better than to do others. Thus there are norms that regulate conduct. On the other hand, this person recognizes that he or she is capable of genuine agency and hence is a subject of imputation. See Ricoeur. “De la morale à l’éthique et aux éthiques.” in his Le Juste II (Paris: Éditions Esprit, 2001), esp. 57-60. This revision, though by no means trivial, does not contradict the analysis in OAA.

28. Ricoeur, “Preface,” in his The Just, trans. David Pellauer (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2000), xv-xvi

29. Ricoeur, “Entretien,” in Éthique et responsibilité Paul Ricoeur, ed. Jean-Christophe Aeschlimann (Neufchâtal: Baconnière, 1994), 16.

30. Examples of difficult cases that Ricoeur discusses are those dealing with the treatment of embryos, fetuses, and the question of abortion and those dealing with the dying and their suffering. These are cases that deal with the “beginning of life” and the “end of life.” See OAA, 269-72.

31. An example of what Ricoeur considers a sound exercise of practical wisdom is the 1995 version of the new official French Code de déontologie médicale. See his preface to Code de déontologie médicale, introduced and commented on by Louis René (Paris: Editions du Seuil, 1996), 9-25. See also Ricoeur, “Les trois niveaux du jugement médicale,” in his Le Juste II ( 227-43).

32. See also Ricoeur's “The Political Paradox,” in HT, 247-70.

33. Eric Weil, La philosophie politique (Paris: Vrin, 1984), 131, cited in Ricoeur, “Ethics and Politics,” in From Text to Action, 330.

34. Ricoeur, “Le paradox de la liberté politique,” in La Liberté: Rapport de la sixième conferenceannuelle Canadien des Affaires Publiques (Montreal: Institut Canadien des Afaires Publiques, 1959), 51. See also Dosse, PRL, 237-38.

35. Aristotle, Rhetoric, 1356a1-1362b9.

36. Ricoeur, “The Fragility of Political Language,” Philosophy Today, Vol. 31, no. 1, 1987, 35-44.

37. See Ricoeur, “Sanction, Rehabilitation, Pardon,” in his The Just, 133-45.

38. Ricoeur, MHO, 593-655. See also Greisch, PRIS, 314-19. For more on political fragility and responsibility, see my PRPR, 211-86.

39. See my “Ricoeur and the Tasks of Citizenship,” in Paul Ricoeur and Contemporary Moral Thought, eds. John Wall, William Schweiker, and David Hall, (New York and London: Routledge, 2002), 233-50.