Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Object

1. The Principles of Mathematics, London 1937, 43.

2. Locke, Essay, Bk.II ch.16.

3. E.J.Lowe, The Oxford Companion to Philosophy. Lowe holds further that the statement ‘Everything is a thing’ amounts to an analytic triviality. In his Logic, J.S. Mill also articulates a view of this genre, while at the same time voicing frustration over the difficulties of achieving a philosophically unencumbered term of art for the very general purpose at hand. Mill writes:

When we shall have occasion for a name which shall be capable of denoting whatever exists ... there is hardly a word applicable to the purpose which is not also ... taken in a sense in which it denotes only substances. But substances are not all that exists; attributes, if such things are to be spoken of, must be said to exist ... . Yet when we speak of an object, or of a thing, we are almost always supposed to mean a substance ... . If, rejecting the word Thing, we endeavour to find another of more general import, a word denoting all that exists.... no word might be presumed fitter ... than being ... . But this word ... is still more completely spoiled for the purpose ... . Being is, by custom, exactly synonymous with substance ... Attributes are never called Beings ... . In consequence of this perversion of the word Being, philosophers ... laid their hands upon the word Entity ... . Yet if you call virtue an entity, you are ... suspected of believing it to be a substance ... . Every word which was originally intended to connote mere existence, seems, after a time, to enlarge its connotation to separate existence ... . (Logic, pp.30-1.)

4. They might equally be called the unity-concept and the unity-thesis, etc.; a rose by any other name is just as sweet.

5. Tractatus, 4.1272.

6. At this level of abstraction, talk of variables and the like does no more than reformulate the issues in symbolic mode, whereas the object-thesis is primarily a thesis concerning the applicability of a certain formal category or categories to natural-language pre-philosophical discourse.

7. Russell writes “Whatever is, is one: being and one, as Leibniz remarks, are convertible terms... yet it is equally true that whatever are, are many”. (Principles of Mathematics 132.)

8. Notice the oddity, indeed the inappropriateness, of characterising the referring expressions in these contexts as singular terms.

9. I ignore a possible response which turns the Strawsonian thesis into a manifest truism -- the response which consists in parsing the thesis as the empty statement that any thing whatever can be introduced into discussion by means of a singular expression.

10. Introduction to Mathematical Philosophy, London, 1919, 181. The response is to be found in Chapter Seventeen, following his well known re-presentation in that book of the Theory of Descriptions.

11. Max Black, ‘The elusiveness of sets’, The Review of Metaphysics, 24 1971, 614-636.

12. ‘The Metaphysics of Abstract Objects’, Journal of Philosophy 1995, Vol XCII, no. 10, 522-23. Lowe continues ‘sets so conceived qualify as objects... the principle of extensionality provides them with determinate identity conditions’.

13. There are of course traditional uses of the expressions ‘set’ and (perhaps especially) ‘class’ which have no ontological import -- which constitute no more than a facon de parler, serving the purely syntactic function of transforming a straightforwardly plural expression or sentence into a collective but singular expression or sentence -- transforming “The integers include prime numbers”, for instance, to “The class of integers includes prime numbers”, or again, “All men are mortal” to “The class of men is included in the class of mortals”. Such talk is spurious class-talk; its spurious nature is clearly displayed in the analysis provided by the predicate calculus. Such inconsequential talk of sets or classes is a feature of the (so-called) Boolean ‘algebra of classes’, which need involve commitment to no objects beyond the individuals of the first-order predicate calculus. See, e.g., Quine, Methods of Logic, chapter 20, ‘Boolean algebra’. The spurious, unhelpful introduction of set talk is surprisingly commonplace. For example, of the sentence “The two students admire each other”, Kamp and Reyle write that the sentence asserts “of each of the members of the set denoted by ‘the two students’ that it satisfies the predicate of ‘admiring other’ (sic).” From Discourse to Logic 463. And concerning theories of numbers (or maybe numerals?), Quine writes that one might “argue for the intuitiveness of Frege’s version, as follows. A natural number n serves primarly to measure multiplicity, and may hence be naturally viewed as an attribute of classes, viz., the attribute of ain having n members” (italics mine). Word and Object, 263.

14.   Word and object, 90 (see then 118, including fn.10, and 174ff.). Rejection or elimination of the plural does not of course entail a scepticism with regards to sets.

15. “To be is to be the value of a variable (or to be some values of some variables)”, Journal of Philosophy 1984, 430-449.

16. But see also the recent writings of Alex Oliver, e.g., ‘Are subclasses parts of classes?’ Analysis 54.4, October 1994, pp. 215-223.

17. Boolos, op. cit. Boolos introduces plural variables to address the challenges of plural sentences; but given his rejection of plural entities, his symbolism cannot be viewed as an attempt to encode an ‘ideal language’ or ‘canonical notation’ in the sense in which this is traditionally understood, as a system for clarifying ontological commitments. Boolos also remarks that it

is haywire to think that when you have some Cheerios, you are eating a set -- what you're doing is eating THE CHEERIOS ... it doesn't follow just from the fact that there are some Cheerios in the bowl that, as some who theorise about the semantics of plurals would have it, there is also a set of them all. (448-449)

18. Boolos, op. cit. 449,

19. There is no suggestion here, of course, that there are no bona fide groups (no crowds, no flocks, no packs). Such objects are not what plural references as such denote; they are already full-fledged single objects which may be designated by full-fledged singular referring expressions (‘that flock’, ‘this crowd’, and so on).

20. Quine offers a version of the object-thesis which is, as formulated, neutral between monism and pluralism. “We are prone”, he writes, “to talk and think of objects... for how else is there to talk?” (‘Speaking of Objects’, reprinted in Ontological Relativity, New York and London 1969, p.1.)

21. Locke expressly maintains that number “applies itself to everything that either does exist or can be imagined”, and number does indeed “bring the idea of one along with it”. There is here, therefore, a comparable modification or expansion of the predicate-formulation of the object-thesis: “all predicates, if true of anything, are true of at least one item at a time”.

22. Foundations of Arithmetic, J.L. Austin translation, Blackwell 1959, 66e.