Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Newton's Philosophy

1. In his library, Newton had a 1656 Amsterdam edition of Descartes’s Principles, along with a 1664 London edition of the Meditations. On Newton’s relation to Descartes and to Cartesianism, see the extensive treatment in the chapter “Newton and Descartes” in Koyré (1965), and the illuminating discussion in Stein (2002).

2. The text first appeared, in a transcription of the original Latin and an English translation, in Hall and Hall (1962). In the Halls’ judgment, the text is juvenile and probably originates in the period from 1664 to 1668. Dobbs contends, in contrast, that the work is mature and was written in late 1684 or early 1685, while Newton was preparing the first edition of the Principia (see Dobbs 1991, 141-6, where she also reviews various alternative opinions on the matter). In a recent paper, Stein raises several significant considerations concerning the question of dating (Stein 2002, 302 note 39); he also discusses the broader significance of the text. An amended version of the Hall and Hall translation completed by Christian Johnson appeared in Janiak (2004).

3. Newton himself speculated about the characteristics such an aether might have in query 21 to the Opticks; he did not think there was sufficient independent empirical evidence indicating the existence of the aether to place his speculation within the main text of the Opticks. Newton had first speculated about an aether serving as a medium for the gravitational interactions of material objects in a famous letter to Boyle in 1679  (Janiak 2004, 11-11). For various reasons, including the emergence of new experimental evidence, Newton was sometimes willing to endorse the existence of an aether, and sometimes not. But he was often willing to conceive of God as the intermediary for such interactions, and God’s spatial ubiquity, which Newton characterized in numerous texts, would ensure that all relevant action would be local — see his letter to Bentley of 25 February 1693 (Janiak 2004, 103) and the General Scholium to the Principia (Newton 1999, 941-44). For distinct interpretations of these issues, see McMullin (1978, 96-109) and Westfall (1971, 392-400).

4. Newton’s view that space is an affection, rather than a property, of each kind of being—by which he means material objects, minds, and even God—is obviously quite complex. To sketch the discussion: whereas a property depends upon a particular object, viz., its bearer, for its existence, an affection à la Newton depend not upon any particular object; and whereas a property must somehow fit with its bearer—such that, for instance, a finite object could not be infinitely long or infinitely heavy, etc.—an affection need not do so. Hence Newton seems to think that infinite Euclidean space is an affection of every being, even ordinary, finite material objects. See De Gravitatione in Janiak (2004, 25-6).

5. Clarke seems to endorse an instrumentalist interpretation of “gravitation” as Newton discussed it especially in his fifth and final letter to Leibniz: see Clarke 5: sections 110-16, 118-23, and 124-30, in Leibniz (1931, 437, 439-40).

6. This conception of gravity obviously raises a number of thorny interpretive issues; they are too complex to do them justice here. For a discussion of many of these issues, see Janiak (2007).

7. We owe this translation of the phrase to Alexandre Koyré, who first noted that Newton uses the word “feign” in a parallel discussion in English: see Koyré (1957, 229 and 299 note 12).