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Mind in Indian Buddhist Philosophy

First published Thu Dec 3, 2009

Perhaps no other classical philosophical tradition, East or West, offers a more complex and counter-intuitive account of mind and mental phenomena than Buddhism. While Buddhists share with other Indian philosophers the view that the domain of the mental encompasses a set of interrelated faculties and processes, they do not associate mental phenomena with the activity of a substantial, independent, and enduring self or agent. Rather, Buddhist theories of mind center on the doctrine of no-self (Pāli anatta, Skt.[1] anātma), which postulates that human beings are reducible to the physical and psychological constituents and processes which comprise them.

Indian Buddhist analyses of the mind span a period of some fifteen centuries, from the earliest discourses of the Buddha (ca. 450 B.C.E.) to the systematic developments of late Mahāyāna Buddhism (500–1000 C.E.). Although philosophical accounts of mind emerge only within the Abhidharma scholastic traditions (roughly 150 B.C.E. to 450 C.E.), their roots are found in the Buddha's teachings of the no-self doctrine. At the same time, these accounts parallel similar theoretical developments within the Brahmanical traditions, with which they share a common philosophical vocabulary (and a general view of mental processes as hierarchical and discrete). This article focuses on the picture of mind and mental phenomena that emerges from the canonical literature, the theories of mind advanced by the main Abhidharma scholastic traditions, and the epistemological issues of perception and intentionality debated by philosophers such as Vasubandhu, Dignāga, Dharmakīrti, Candrakīrti, Śāntarakṣita, and Dharmottara.

All references to the canonical literature are to the major collections of texts in the Pāli Canon, primarily to the Long, Middle, and Connected Discourses of the Buddha (the Dīgha, Majjhima, and Saṃyutta Nikāyas respectively). For the Abhidharmic account of mind and related phenomena I draw almost exclusively from Vasubandhu's Treasury of Higher Knowledge (Abhidharmakośa and its bhāṣya; hereafter AKBh), a foundational text for most of the philosophical developments of late Indian Buddhism. For other frequently quoted sources see §3.1, §6.3, §7 and the list of abbreviations.

1. History of the issue

Buddhist conceptions of mind evolved from early attempts to offer a systematic account of human experience as described in the large body of discourses attributed to the Buddha. The Buddha offered an account of the human individual as a composite of various psychological and physical elements that challenged the prevailing philosophical views, dominated by the Upaniṣadic idea of an enduring, substantive self (ātman). This aggregated view of persons became the object of early and extensive scholastic debates as Buddhists sought to explain how we come to mistakenly apprehend an unchanging and enduring self in a stream of causally interconnected phenomena. The notion that the habitual patterns of behavior which condition human existence are the direct result of an entrenched and abiding belief that we are (or have) an enduring, unchanging, and independent core or self, sets this aggregated view of persons apart from all other philosophical accounts of personal identity in classical India.

1.1 The No-self doctrine

In one of his earlier discourses, the Buddha declares that we ought to regard any form of sensation and consciousness, whether “past, future, or present; internal or external; manifest or it actually is...: ‘This is not mine. This is not my self. This is not what I am’” (Majjhima Nikāya I, 130).

This rejection of a permanent self as the agent of sensory and mental activity posed a significant challenge for the early Buddhists. Indeed, if there is no agent (kartṛ), and if actions (karman) are merely transient events arising within a continuum of causally interconnected states, then how is the efficacy of karma or rebirth to be explained? Historically, at least one Buddhist school, that of the Vātsīputrīyas or Pudgalavādins (‘personalists’), does appear to endorse the reality of persons as conceived in reliance upon the collection of aggregates (see §5.5 for a detailed discussion).

Disagreement among modern interpreters of the no-self doctrine attests to the difficulty of providing a definitive account of this core aspect of Buddhist philosophy. Thus, the early Pāli scholar Caroline Rhys Davids (1924, 75) thought that the way the Buddhist understood and used the term consciousness was not very different that the way Upaniṣadic philosophers talked about the self. Similarly, Isaline Horner (1936, 145) suggested that some canonical passages (e.g., Anguttara Nikāya I, 149–50) actually provide support for the notion of self as an ‘unchanging witness’ (Pāli sakkhi, Skt. sākṣin), a view also defended in a recent philosophical reworking of the notion of ‘witness consciousness’ by Miri Albahari (2006). Although he acknowledged the confusion generated by the tendency to attribute to early Buddhism something analogous to the Upaniṣadic doctrine of self, Edward Conze nonetheless asserted that one's true identity is that of an Absolute, which he presumed to be none other than the Buddhist view of consciousness (1962, pp. 43, 127). Perhaps the most detailed attempt to support a two-tier understanding of the doctrine of no-self comes from Kamaleswar Bhattacharya (1973, 64 and passim), who forcibly argued that the denial of self in Buddhism most often targets common views such as those that associate the self with the psycho-physical aggregates, and not the metaphysical notion of self.

The prevailing view, however, is that such interpretations are tenuous. Indeed, later Buddhist traditions develop specific notions, such as that of mind-stream, life-continuum mind, and repository consciousness (citta-santāna, bhavaṅga-citta, and ālaya-vijñāna, respectively) precisely in order to avoid the metaphysical implications of the traditional notion of self. Extensive critiques of the attempt to find support in the canonical literature for the existence of a higher self, perhaps equated with consciousness, are found in Warder (1970), Collins (1982), Kalupahana (1987), Harvey (1995), and De Silva (2005). Vasubandhu’s Treatise on the Negation of the Person (Pudgala-pratiṣedha-prakaraṇa, which forms the 9th chapter of his Abhidharmakośa) provides one of most detailed Buddhist critiques of the personalist view (also targeting Brahmanical conceptions of self) (see §5.5).

Thus Harvey (1995, 22) argues that the notion of a ‘self which witnesses’ most probably refers to deeper aspects of consciousness (citta) acting as ‘conscience.’ In a similar vein, Collins (1982, 87–115) delineates several points supporting the no-self view as the correct account: (1) the metaphysical notion of self as eternal and unchanging is actually just plain erroneous (a defect of speculative opinion); (2) taking the body to be the self is a mistaken view; (3) consciousness itself is not the self; (4) it is impossible to speak of a self apart from experience; (5) a false sense of self may be acquired from the habitual use of pronominal forms such as ‘I’ and ‘mine.’ Furthermore, in his detailed and thorough analysis of Buddhist and Brahmanical views on personal identity, Oetke (1988) interprets the no-self doctrine as reflective of a "revisionary" metaphysics which denies not a self as such but rather the self as something qualified by the property of being the subject of experience or as the referent of such subjective experience.

The denial of a permanent self, as well as the refusal to treat persons as referring to anything real and permanent, forms an integral part of the Buddhist analysis of consciousness. The frequent use of indexicals such as ‘I’ (ahaṃ) and ‘mine’ (mama) does not indicate that the Buddha accepts the conventional reality of persons either. Rather, as Collins (1982, 72) suggests, a good way to avoid such misapprehensions is to offer more elegant translations of Pāli and Sanskrit compounds in which the term self (atta, ātma) is used. For instance, ‘master of himself’ (attādhīna) could be also rendered as ‘free’ or ‘independent,’ ‘at peace with himself’ (khematta) could be translated as ‘tranquil,’ while ‘self-guarded’ (rakkhitatta) could be simply translated as ‘prudent’.

The centrality of the no-self doctrine in Buddhist thought is explained on the basis of its pragmatic role in guiding the adept on the path to enlightenment. Furthermore, the no-self doctrine provides a justification for treating endurance, independence, and self-subsistence as neither desirable nor attainable, but rather as what they are: mistaken notions resulting from the habitual tendency to construct an identity from a stream of physical and subjective phenomena. The Buddhist claims that our sense of self as an autonomous being is imputed, and our attribution of inherent existence to it habitually acquired (see Saṃyutta Nikāya IV, 102; Majjhima Nikāya I, 130), just as Hume claims that a self is never apprehended in the series of perceptions that are characteristic of the mental domain (the parallelism between the Buddhist and Humean reductive analyses of the self is explored at some lenght in Giles 1993, Tillemans 1996, and Kapstein 2001). This routine misapprehension of the discrete phenomena of experience as a self leads to a dualistic perspective: things appear and are categorized as either objective (thus external, but empirically accessible) or as subjective (thus internal, and immediately accessible to consciousness). Puzzled by this dualistic outlook, we cope by constructing an imaginary self as the permanent locus of experience.

This imaginary self, usually conceived in substantial terms as an unchanging reality behind the changing phenomenal world, is in effect the root cause of the pervasive ignorance which afflicts the human condition. From a metaphysical point of view, however, the no-self doctrine extends beyond the domain of subjective experience, to characterize all phenomena. Indeed, it is not just persons that are said to be selfless but all the elements of existence as well. To appreciate the uniqueness of the Buddhist no-self doctrine scholars sometimes contrast it with the two most common alternatives: eternalism and annihilationism (or physicalism). The eternalist, usually the Upaniṣadic philosopher, claims that the innermost part of ourselves, the subtle and abiding self, sometimes equated with pure consciousness, exists for all eternity even as the ordinary person undergoes constant change, ultimately resulting in his or her demise. At the opposite end of the spectrum we find the physicalist who sees human nature as contingent and finite. The Buddhist perspective, called the ‘middle path between extremes’ or simply the ‘middle way’ (madhyamā-pratipad) offers a very different account of human existence: what we routinely call ego, self, soul, individual personality, are merely conventional terms that do not apply to anything real.

1.2 The Soteriological dimension of the no-self doctrine

In espousing the doctrine of no-self with its aggregated view of persons, the Buddha claims to be offering a solution to the problem of human suffering. Not only is the idea of a permanent self a conceptual fiction, but adopting such a view leads to grasping after notions such as ‘I,’ ‘me,’ and ‘mine’ with deleterious effects for our psychological well being: attachment to such a fictional ‘I’ is the root cause of a range of negative emotions, including selfishness, craving, hatred, conceit, and ill-will. These negative emotions, in turn, fuel the general feeling of unsatisfactoriness that pervades the unenlightened human condition, and ultimately are responsible for all the troubles that ordinarily afflict our world. The no-self doctrine offers not merely an enlightened metaphysical perspective on the ultimate nature of things, but also an effective remedy for eradicating ignorance and achieving nirvāṇa, the summum bonum of the Buddhist path and the antithesis of cyclical existence (with the caveat that Mahāyāna Buddhist traditions generally place less emphasis on nirvāṇa, focusing instead on the enlightened and compassionate attitude of the Buddhist saint or ‘bodhisattva’).

2. Basic principles

In his first public discourse, known as the Turning of the Wheel of Dharma (Pāli Dhammacakkappavattana Sutta, SN 56, 11), Siddhartha Gautama, the historical Buddha, lays out what is considered to be the foundation of Buddhist doctrine and practice: the middle path approach to understanding the nature of phenomena. At the level of affect the middle path steers clear of the extremes of indulgence and austerity, while at the mental level it avoids the extreme metaphysical positions of eternalism and annihilationism. Thus, the middle path “leads to insight and wisdom, produces calm, knowledge, enlightenment, and nirvāṇa” (Saṃyutta Nikāya, V, 420). Following his exposition of the middle path, the Buddha proceeds to outline the four noble truths and the eightfold noble path, which together represent the most basic aspects of Buddhist teachings. The middle path, thus, is intended both as an ethical method and as a primer for correct reasoning. In this second sense, the middle path relies on a particular understanding the nature of reality as being marked by, or displaying, three specific characteristics (tri-lakṣaṇa): unsatisfactoriness (duḥkha), impermanence (anitya), and the lack of an abiding self (anātman).

2.1 The three marks of existence

The general leitmotif of Buddhist teachings, which is also the first of the four noble truths, is the realization that unsatisfactoriness or suffering (Skt. duḥkha, Pāli dukkha) is a pervasive aspect of conditioned existence. With the recognition of this fundamental truth about the nature of phenomena comes the realization of the cause of discontent and of its finality (the second and third noble truths, respectively). Lastly, undertaking the course of action that leads to its cessation (the fourth noble truth) forms the basis and the main motivating principle of the Buddhist path.

1. Unsatisfactoriness (duḥkha). As the first mark of conditioned existence, unsatisfactoriness presents both an opportunity and a challenge: as an undesirable condition, unsatisfactoriness itself is a motivator for its own overcoming. But without a proper understanding of its root cause, unsatisfactoriness can become a source of aversion (toward unpleasant states) and of grasping (after pleasant states). The cause of this unsatisfactoriness is ignorance (avidyā), understood not simply as lacking knowledge about particular states of affairs, but rather as a basic misunderstanding about how things truly are. The Buddhist Abhidharma traditions break this unsatisfactoriness into three categories:

2. Impermanence (anitya). As the second mark of existence, impermanence pervades all compounded phenomena. It forms an integral part of the theory of momentariness (kṣaṇikavāda), which asserts that phenomena do not endure for more than a moment. In the Shorter Discourse to Saccaka (Majjhima Nikāya, I, 230, 35), the Buddha explains that all formations (feeling, perception, etc.) and in effect all things are to be regarded as impermanent.

3. No-self (anātman). This Buddhist view of the impermanence of all phenomena works against the natural tendency to assume that knowledge and experience are attributable to a self that is permanent, stable, and unchanging. Instead of reifying each moment of existence, and operating with the assumption that continuity is the hallmark of our lives, the Buddhist view presents a fluid account of experience as an ever-changing stream of psycho-physical events. This dynamic model of human existence comprises the five classes of phenomena the Buddha referred to as the “aggregates of grasping” (upādāna-skandha), on account of our tendency to grasp after and identify with them (see §2.3). These classes of phenomena are to be understood purely in causal terms, and not as the attributes and activities of a substantive self. There is no self or substantive mind that either supervenes on or exists apart from these aggregates. Rather, as the term ‘aggregate’ suggests, the Buddhist tradition introduces a new and unique way of talking about human experience by avoiding the metaphysical pitfalls of reification.

2.2 The principle of dependent-arising

What is the relationship between thoughts, or even thoughts about thoughts, and actions? The Buddhist answers this question by introducing a new theory of causality based on the principle of dependent-arising (pratītyasamutpāda). All things, including all cognitive events, arise in dependence upon a multitude of causes and conditions. Thus, the Buddhist appears to reject both top-down (viz., cognitivist) and bottom-up (viz., strongly determinist) approaches to cognition: thoughts are neither prior to actions, and thus causally determine them, nor do they lack causal force, and are thus epiphenomenal. The best known formulation of this principle captures the sense of transience and interdependence of all phenomena: “This being, that becomes; from the arising of this, that arises; this not being, that does not become; from the ceasing of this, that ceases” (Majjhima Nikāya, II, 32).

2.3 The five aggregates

The Buddhist tradition conceives of the human individual as consisting of five types of aggregates that serve as the bases of what we ordinarily designate as persons: (1) material form or body (rūpa); (2) sensations (vedanā); (3) apperception (saṃjña); (4) volitions or dispositional formations (saṃskāra); and (5) consciousness (vijñāna). This aggregated view of persons informs all aspect of Buddhist thought and is indispensable to any account of cognition. Thus, in replacing the agent or cognizing ‘I’ with a play of causal factors resulting in momentary cognitive events, the Buddhist tradition treats the cognizing agent as merely another way of referring to the embodied and dynamic functioning of the five aggregates. The specific nature of these aggregates is the subject of the Abhidharma descriptive analytic (see §3). Following Vasubandhu's Treasury of Higher Knowledge (AKBh ad I, 14–16), the five aggregates may be defined as follows:

Form. The first collection of aggregates, form or materiality (rūpa-skandha), stands for objects regarded as compounded entities (saṃskṛta). Form is understood to be ‘compounded’ in only one of the two senses in which compoundedness can be interpreted: that of being the product of causes and conditions (the other refers to entities that are produced by putting parts together). The category of form also includes the sensory systems, which from an anatomical and physiological point of view are material forms.

Feeling. The second collection includes the aggregates of sensation or feeling (vedanā-skandha) and defines the quality of the impressions that result from contact between the sense and its object. Sensations are generally divided into pleasant, unpleasant and neutral and depend on the sensory modality in which they originate. As internal mental states, sensations are both conditioned by, and conditioning of, the habitual tendencies of past karmic activity.

Apperception. The third collection of aggregates consists of apperception (saṃjña-skandha), and refers to the capacity to comprehend the specific marks (nimitta) of phenomenal objects. The characteristic mark of a phenomenon is its distinctive quality. The term itself is a derivative from saṃ + jñā, meaning ‘to understand,’ ‘to be aware of,’ or more appropriately ‘to make intelligible’ or ‘to cause to be understood,’ thus indicating the causative function of perception predicates. As a synthetic mode of apprehension, apperception is caused by a multiplicity of factors including memories, expectations, dispositions, etc. In this generic sense, apperception might be understood as broadly equivalent to the Aristotelian sensus communis, the faculty that binds together the sensory input into a coherent representation of the object, or to Kant's notion of the transcendental unity of apperception.

Volitions. The fourth collection of aggregates includes dispositional formations or volitions (saṃskṛta-skandha). Volitions are primarily responsible for bringing forth future states of existence. They include all the conditioned factors that are intrinsic to consciousness (saṃprayuktasaṃskāra) as well as factors that are dissociated from consciousness (viprayuktasaṃskāra). Support for the view that mental factors dissociated from thought are to be included in the category of dispositional formations is found in the Saṃyukta-Nikāya (V, 450): “Delighting in such volitional formations, they generate volitional formations that lead to birth, generate volitional formations that lead to aging, generate volitional formations that lead to death, generate volitional formations that lead to sorrow, lamentation, pain, displeasure, and despair.” Volitions, thus, are habitual latencies that predispose and motivate an individual to have a certain type of experience while at the same time conditioning the response to that experience.

Consciousness. The fifth and last collection contains the aggregates of consciousness (vijñāna-skandha). In contrast to apperception, consciousness is defined as the impression (vijñapti) of each object or as the bare apprehension of each object. Glossing on this definition, later Abhidharma commentators treat consciousness (vijñāna) as referring to an awareness of the object alone (vastumātra) (see Yaśomitra's Vyākhyā ad AK I, 16). Unlike sensation and apperception, which apprehend the specific characteristics of objects, consciousness acts as an integrating and discerning factor of experience.

In the schematic analysis of the five aggregates only form is a physical aggregate stricto sensu. While sensations, apperception, and volitions can acquire an objectual aspect, they are not empirical objects proper. Thus, a sensation such as pain is not reducible to the physical substrate, say a finger, in which it is instantiated. Rather, as object-oriented cognitive aspects, sensations, apperception, and volitions are included in the broader Abhidharma category of mental factors (caitasika). Furthermore, the empirical approach that characterizes the Buddhist analysis of materiality does not imply physicalism, at least not in the sense that everything is or supervenes on the physical. Rather, materiality is analyzed as being reducible to the phenomenal content of experience. Thus, the formal properties of material objects are analyzed either in terms of how they are impacted by contact or as factors that oppose resistance. These properties, however, do not extend to the atoms themselves, which according to the Abhidharma form the building blocks of materiality. As monadic units the atoms are seen as devoid of any formal properties (rūpaṇa). It is only as atomic compounds (saṃghātastha, saṃcita) that atoms are subject to the same properties of resistance and destruction as composite material entities (see §4.2).

3. Consciousness and cognition

Speculations on the nature and function of consciousness have a long and complex history in Indian Buddhism. In the canonical literature the term that most often translates as consciousness (vijñāna) is synonymously used for designating ‘mind’ or the ‘life principle’ in the most generic sense of those terms. In a technical sense, consciousness designates either the type of awareness that arises depending on any of the six sensory domains (āyatana) or awareness as one of the five aggregates of existence. In addition, consciousness is also listed as one of the twelve factors or causes (nidana) in the chain of dependently arising (pratītyasamutpāda) phenomena. However, it is only in the Abhidharma scholastic that we come across systematic attempts to understand the dynamic processes of consciousness and cognition. Indeed, the Abhidharma synthesis may be rightly viewed as a theory of consciousness (cf. Piatigorsky 1984, 8).

3.1 Overview of the Abhidharma synthesis

A few clarifications about the origins and scope of the Abhidharma scholastic are necessary before we explore its analysis of mind. First, as the name suggest, the Abhidharma (‘higher doctrine’ from abhi + dharma) is concerned with the notion of dharma (‘element’), its the central and most difficult concept. Depending on the context, a dharma may be taken to designate either the body of teachings attributed to the Buddha or a basic element or unit of existence and/or experience, better captured by the notion of phenomenon. In the Abhidharmic analysis of mind and mental constituents, a dharma most closely refers to a temporal instance in the stream of cognitive events, which is momentary and discrete, that arises together with a moment of cognitive awareness (a vijñāna). In this extended sense, dharmas designates both an indivisible unit of experience and an object of conceptual analysis, which means that factors contributing to the arising of cognitive awareness can in turn become objects of reflective inquiry.

A large body of literature concerned with examining the received teachings had emerged roughly three centuries after the death of the Buddha (ca. 150 B.C.E.). The origins of the Abhidharma schools are thus traceable to the diverse interpretations of the Buddha's teachings. Two main branches of Abhidharma are extant: that of the Theravāda (‘Doctrines of the Elders’), which became dominant in Sri Lanka and southeast Asia, and that of the Sarvāstivāda (the ‘All Exists School’), which flourished in North India and provided the basis for the development of later Abhidharma and Mahāyāna schools in India, and later on in Central and East Asia. The foundational texts for these two branches of Abhidharma are the Kathāvatthu (‘Points of Controversy’) and the Mahāvibhāṣā (‘The Great Commentary’).

The four main schools of Indian Buddhism emerge almost exclusively from the Northen branch of Abhidharma. The Mahāvibhāṣā itself is associated with the first of these schools, the Vaibhāṣika (‘Follower of the Vibhāṣā’). The other three schools are those of the Sautrāntika (‘Follower of the Sūtra’), Madhyamaka (‘Middle Way School’) and Yogācāra (‘Practice of Yoga School’). The Sautrāntika doctrines survive primarily in later texts such as Vasubandhu's Abhidharmakośa (‘Treasury of Higher Knowledge,’ ca. 360 C.E.) and Vimalamitra's Abhidharmadīpa (‘Light of Higher Knowledge,’ ca. 500 C.E.). The Madhyamaka School is associated with the emergence of the vast corpus of Prajñapāramitā (‘Perfection of Wisdom’) literature and with the works of the prominent Buddhist philosopher Nāgārjuna (fl. ca. 150 C.E.), principally with his magnum opus, the Mūlamadhyamakakārikās (‘Verses on the Foundation of the Middle Way’). Lastly, the Yogācāra, which became the dominant philosophical school in India from the 5th through the 12th century traces it origins to the encyclopedic work of Asaṅga (ca. 315–390) and his half brother Vasubandhu (320–380). Asaṅga is credited with the authorship of the Mahāyānasaṃgraha (‘Compendium of the Great Vehicle’) and the encyclopedic Yogācārabhūmiśāstra (‘Treatise on the Stages of the Practice of Yoga,’ most likely a compilation by various authors). Vasubandhu is the author of some of the most influential works of Indian Buddhist philosophy, which include, apart from his Treasury of Higher Knowledge (written from a Sautrāntika perspective) such seminal texts as the Madhyāntavibhāgabhāṣya (‘Commentary on the Separation of the Middle from Extremes’), the Trisvabhāvanirdeśa (‘Teaching of the Three Self-Natures’), and the pithy but influential Viṃśatikākārikā (‘The Twenty Verses’) and Triṃśikakārikā (‘Thirty Verses’) (see §6.3 for a discussion of the main arguments for idealism presented by Vasubandhu in the Twenty Verses).

A wide gulf separates works such as Vasubandhu's Treasury of Higher Knowledge, a foundational text for most of the philosophical developments of late Indian Buddhism, from the simple and pragmatic teachings of the Buddha. The Abhidharma scholastic evolved from mnemonic lists (mātṛka) that were initially intended to work as summaries of various topics discussed in the canonical texts. These lists were usually structured around five main categories: form or matter (rūpa), mind or consciousness (citta), mental constituents (caitta), conditioned factors dissociated from consciousness (cittaviprayukta saṃskāra), and unconditioned elements (asaṃskṛta) such as cessation or nirvāṇa. In composing his Treasury of Higher Knowledge, Vasubandhu mainly relied on three Abhidharma texts: Dharmaśri's An Epitome of Abhidharma (Abhidharmasāra), Ghoṣaka's The Nectar of Abhidharma (Abhidharmāmṛtaśāstra) and Kātyāyanīputra's Method of Knowing (Jñānaprasthāna) (see Frauwallner 1963, 1971a, 1971b). From these three works Vasubandhu adopted his categorical classification of Abhidharma topics according to the five aggregates. The analytic models of the five categories and the five aggregates represent, thus, “an attempt to record exhaustively all the elements of being and order them systematically” (Frauwallner 1995, 146). Such efforts were not new: indeed, the Buddhist attempt mirrors similar undertakings in the Brahmanical tradition. A good example of such undertakings is the Sāṃkhya scheme of the mental and physical elements and their derivatives.

3.2 Sensation and Perception

The Sanskrit term most commonly associated with sensory activity, indriya (‘sensation’ or ‘power’), is found in the Rg Veda (I, 55; II, 16), a collection of hymns dealing with various religio-philosophical topics central to the Brahmanical tradition. Here the senses are likened to lesser deities acting on behalf of Indra, the king of the gods, as messengers to the lower realms. As manifestations of Indra's specific powers, the senses thus understood correspond to his capacity for knowledge (buddhīndriya) and action (karmendriya). This early mythological narrative in which lesser deities are the agencies of sensory activity in humans bears some structural similarity to Descartes’ account in his Treatise of Man and Passions of the Soul of the animal spirits which flowing from the pineal gland control the activity of sensation, imagination, as well as bodily movements. In the Upaniṣads, this mythological account gives way to a philosophically nuanced view of sensory activity as the direct result of contact between the self and the world. According to the Upaniṣadic understanding of perception, the senses are created from the substance of sense-objects and with the specific purpose of revealing the latter. The revealing agent, however, is the self (see Kaṭha Upaniṣad, I, iii, 4).

Buddhist authors, unlike their Brahmanical opponents, make a clear distinction between the activity or faculty of sensing (indriyagocara) and the medium which implements it, as for instance in distinguishing between the faculty of vision (cakṣurvijñānadhātu) and the visual system (cakṣurdhātu). Moreover, the senses are conceived as receptacles of experience (indriyādhiṣṭhāna) rather than physical organs interacting with empirical objects. Instead of treating the senses as the faculties of an internal agent, the Buddhists regard them as instruments or mediums joining together the external spheres of sensory activity with the internal spheres of perception (see Abhidharmasamuccayabhāṣya ad I, 4.). In the Treasury of Higher Knowledge (AKBh ad I, 17), Vasubandhu provides the following list to account for the causal relations that obtain between the sensory systems and their bases or domains of activity (āyatana):

The manifest The locus of origin The cognive support
1. visual awareness 1. visual system 7. visibles (e.g. color and shape)
2. auditory awareness 2. auditory system 8. sound
3. olfactory consciousness 3. olfactive system 9. smell
4. gustatory consciousness 4. gustatory system 10. taste
5. tactile consciousness 5. tactile system 11. taste
6. mental awareness 6. cognitive system 12. mental constituents = dharmas

Thus the Buddhist accounts for sensory activity and cognitive awareness by reducing experience to its contents and analyzing it in terms of its constitutive elements and functions. In the often quoted formula of dependent arising (see below §3.3), any of the six types of cognitive awareness in the first column arises in dependence upon a corresponding element in columns 2 and 3. Thus, instead of construing cognitive awareness as the activity of an abiding self, the Buddhist uses the notion of ‘aggregate’ in the original sense of the Sanskrit term skandha: something which is fashioned by the collective combination of multiple causes and conditions (see AKBh ad I, 7). These constitutive parts, which collectively make the psycho-physical continuum that we ordinarily associate with persons, exist as part of a causal continuum of interdependently arising phenomena.

3.3 Mental proliferation

Ordinary mentation is bound up with expectations, judgments, and desires. The Buddhist philosophical term used for describing the state of ordinary mentation is prapañca (lit. ‘fabrication,’ usually translated as ‘conceptual proliferation’)[see Samyutta Nikāya, IV, 72]. We don't simply apprehend an object. Rather, we apprehend it as the locus of a multiplicity of associations: in seeing a tree we perceive an entity made of trunk, branches, and foliage but also something that can provide shade and lumber. In perception we are ordinarily assailed by a stream of conceptualizing tendencies, which have their ultimate source in linguistic conventions and categorizing practices. These conceptualizing tendencies overwhelm and distort the perceptual experience.

In the canonical literature conceptual proliferation is associated with sensory activity rather than consciousness [see Samyutta Nikāya, I, 100, IV, 52; Majjhima Nikāya, I, 65]. These proliferating tendencies, which are sustained by a constant flow of sense impressions, give rise to the common sense conceptual schema that informs our ordinary, habitual coping practices. Thus cognition, in its perceptual aspect, has a dual form: subjectively, it discloses a bare consciousness that merely attends to the flow of sensations; objectively, it corresponds to each specific domain of empirical awareness: visual objects to visual awareness, sounds to auditory awareness, etc.

An inevitable outcome of this dual aspect view of perception is the tendency of most Buddhist philosophy of mind toward metaphysical idealism, since the diversity and manifoldness of the perceived world suggest not a rich and variegated ontology, but a profligate mind. Alternatively, the Buddhist philosophy of mind could be interpreted as a type of phenomenology, since it argues that empirical awareness opens us to a world that is not entirely free from our own mental propensities (see §5.4 and §6.3). It is primarily on account of this proliferating tendency of the ordinary mind that notions such as self and other are superimposed upon the constant flow of phenomena. Such superimpositions are the main cause for the reification of perceptual content, leading to the all too familiar propensity to operate with notions such as existence and non-existence, self and other. As the Abhidharma traditions maintain, concepts are superimposed upon the constant flow of phenomena in dependence upon the presence or absence of stimuli at the sense-doors.

3.4 Consciousness

The canonical literature presents us with a standard formula for the dependently arising phenomenon of consciousness:

Dependent on the eye and forms, visual-consciousness arises. The meeting of the three is contact. With contact as condition there is feeling. What one feels, that one perceives. What one perceives, that one thinks about. What one thinks about, that one mentally proliferates. With what one has mentally proliferated as the source, perception and notions resulting from mental proliferation beset a man with respect to past, future, and present forms cognizble through the eye (Majjhima Nikaya, I, 111–112).

As this passage illustrates, a specific type of consciousness accompanies each of the sensory modalities, in this case the experience of visual awareness. No one element in this nexus of interactions has causal priority. Rather, these associations between perception and thinking are due to the habitual tendency of the mind towards conceptual proliferation, for as the Buddha declares in his discourses, the perceptual experience of ordinary people is replete with mistaken apprehensions. Note that while sense, object, and conscious apprehension come together as a consequence of past habituations and other conditioning factors, the ensuing cognitive awareness appears to both sustain and be sustained by these factors.

Now, in the canonical literature consciousness (vijñāna) is treated as a synonym of apperception (saṃjñā) [see Sutta Nipata, 538, 806]. This lack of clear dissociation between apperception, understood here as the empirical apprehension of phenomena, and consciousness as the apprehending faculty, is made obvious by frequent references to saṃjñā as being the cause of attachment to agreeable physical objects and mental states. Furthermore, apperception is often contrasted with wisdom thus suggesting that what is meant by it is not sensory activity proper but rather the awareness that bears upon it. Likewise, vijñāna does not denote consciousness as a cognitive phenomenon distinct from sense perception. Rather, it refers to the consciousness of a specific sense modality (e.g., visual-awareness, auditory-awareness). Because the mental faculty is also regarded as a sensory system, the type of awareness that bears upon it is termed mental or ‘introspective awareness’ (manovijñāna). The arising of consciousness, thus, depends on sense perception, but it also depends on attention, since sensory activity alone does not give rise to perception. The latter activity requires attending to the stimuli: the amorphous mass of the sense data gives rise to a percept only when sensation is coupled with attention. In the formula of dependent arising that we encounter at several places in the canonical literature, consciousness is said to arise in dependence upon the sense and the physical object. But the appearance of phenomena itself depend in turn upon this empirical awareness. Thus, the Buddha declares:

Mind and body condition contact. By whatever properties, characteristics, signs or indications the mind factor is to be conceived, in their absence...would any grasping at the idea of the body factor be manifest? No, Sir...By whatever properties the mind factor and the body factor are designated, in their absence...would any grasping at the notion of sensory reaction be manifest? No, Sir. By whatever properties, characteristics, signs or indications the mind factor is conceived, in their absence is there any contact to be found? No, Sir. Then, Ānanda, just this, namely mind and body, is the root, the cause, the origin, the condition for all contact. I have said: ‘Consciousness conditions mind and body’ (Dīgha Nikāya II, 63, 2–21).

Passages such as this present a metaphysical picture of mental and psychological individuation as arising in dependence upon the activity of empirical consciousness. Consciousness, however, is not treated as the direct cause for the manifestation of body, feelings and perceptions. Rather, the Buddhist tradition assigns this causal role to the four elements. The structure is one of mutual formation: on the one hand, feelings, perceptions, and volitions are caused by contact resulting from intentional states of cognitive awareness; on the other hand, the psycho-physical aggregates in turn condition the manifestation of consciousness.

Thus, the Nikāyas do not offer a comprehensive picture of consciousness as a distinct phenomenon, but only as something that arises and passes away as a result of the activity of all the other psycho-physical elements. Its characteristic aspect is determined by the sensory system with which it happens to be associated. Thus, the distinctive aspect of visual consciousness is determined by the makeup of the visual sense and not by any intrinsic properties of its own.

The rejection of an immutable self abiding in each individual seems to have undermined all attempts to analyze consciousness on its own terms. Even though the Sanskrit term vijñāna (which in the Upaniṣads designates consciousness as an abiding characteristic of the self) is adopted by the Buddhists as an appropriate designation for consciousness, the interpretations found in the Nikāyas and the early Abhidharma deny its immutability and instead regard it as indistinct from perceptual cognition. At this early stage in the development of a Buddhist theory of mind, vijñāna still retains its double meaning: (1) that of ‘consciousness’ as a factor in the chain of dependently arisen phenomena that is essential for the continuity of the karmic process; and (2) that of ‘cognition’, a faculty that is associated with each of the five sensory modalities and with the mind [see Samyutta Nikāya, III, 87; Majjhima Nikāya, I, 292]. In later Abhidharma traditions, such as those of the Sautrāntika and Yogācāra Schools, consciousness is discussed mainly in relation to the aggregates of cognition (vijñānaskandha), which are primarily the senses and the mental faculty [see AKBh ad I, 16a].

Already in the earliest strata of the canonical literature we find a tripartite model of cognition in which a clear distinction is made between the phenomenal world, its mode of apprehension, and the specific type of consciousness by which it is apprehended. However, what is meant by world (loka) in this context is not an external reality of physical entities and processes, but the phenomenal world of perception (lokasaṃjñā) that arises in dependence upon the proliferating activities of mind. Thus, the notion that consciousness acts as a causal condition for the appearance of phenomena, while not a direct rejection of external, mind-independent objects, does seem to anticipate the idealist tendencies of the Yogācāra School (see §6.3).

3.5 Intentionality

In the canonical literature intentional acts are often assimilated to karmic tendencies in such a way as to suggest that intentions or volitions (cetanā) are not separate from the propensities generated by past experience. Abhidharma traditions, on the other hand, operate with the assumption that all cognitions are inherently intentional. Indeed, for the Vaibhāṣika all types of consciousness are intentional: they are about an object that must necessarily exist. However, a detailed account of intentionality is only found in later philosophical developments associated with the Buddhist logico-epistemological school of Dignāga and Dharmakīrti (see §7.3).

For instance, in the Treasury of Higher Knowledge (AKBh ad I, 1ab), Vasubandhu defines action (karman) as volition (cetanā) and its ensuing result. However, the action in fact comprises two distinct types of activity: the volition itself and the intentional act (cetayitvā). Furthermore, the action itself, conceived as a dual process of volition and its result, in fact consists of three discrete stages: bodily, verbal, and mental action, corresponding respectively to the basis of the action (or how it is realized), its own nature, and the cause which prompts it. Each of these three stages, although apparently separate, are in fact the same action viewed from three different angles. From the perspective of its basis, the action is grounded in the body, which serves as its instrumental medium. From the perspective of its nature, an action consists in its verbal and/or habitual expression. Finally, as far as its motivation is concerned, an action finds its ultimate cause in the realm of the mental. Thus conception and verbal expression, represent forms of activity that manifest an individual's intention to express certain ideas or engage with a certain object of experience. This intentionality springs from continuous residual impressions (vāsanā) resulting from past associations of names with the things they designate.

In explaining the relationship between volition and action, Vasubandhu points to traces left by past volitions to demonstrate that intentional acts are not entirely determined by the present volition. For example, the intention to break a rule of conduct such as not lying, is conditioned both by the present volition and by traces left by similar volitional acts. In his Treatise on Action (Karmasiddhiprakaraṇa, III, 2, 40), Vasubandhu expands on his idea that impressions of past experience are instrumental in effecting the karmic continuum that constitutes the individual personality, by appealing to the notion of receptacle consciousness (ālaya-vijñāna). A receptacle consciousness (as the name suggests), can form the basis for the reception of consciousness traces (vijñānavāsanā), whereas a self, if conceived as a singular and immutable agent, is incapable of providing such a support. For Vasubandhu and all followers of the Yogācāra theory of consciousness, the analysis of intentionality cannot be properly conducted without reference to this receptacle consciousness, a subliminal form of cognitive awareness that serves as a basis for all the propensities, habits, and tendencies that inform and direct individual actions (see §5.4).

3.6 Attention

Nearly all discussions that focus on the type of consciousness that is associated with a specific perceptual occasion (e.g., visual consciousness with an instance of visual perception), seek to answer the question of causal priority (which is prior, sensation or cognitive apprehension?) by examining the nature of contact itself. Thus, whereas in the Nikāyas contact (sparśa) is the primary cause of the arising of cognitive awareness, in the Abhidharma it becomes a derivative aspect of empirical consciousness itself (or indeed a dharma in its own right) (see Visuddhimagga XVII, 223–225; AKBh ad III, 30). However, the mere presence of objects in the range of perception does not by itself give rise to cognitive awareness. For the content of experience to enter the domain of awareness, attention must be directed to whatever is sensed. For this reason, attention (āvartana), understood as the mind's turning toward a certain object, is not a key term in the canonical literature, where various cognitive functions are treated as distinct forms of consciousness. The term becomes significant in the Abhidharma, where the generality of consciousness is replaced with more concrete mental functions that perform specific tasks. However, Buddhaghosa in the Atthasālinī maintains that while consciousness can arise without attention, it cannot arise in the absence of an objective cognitive support (cf. Williams 1981, 230).

The role of attention in cognition becomes obvious if we take into account the fact that the mere coming together of object, sense faculty, and consciousness is not sufficient for a cognitive event to arise. Rather, cognition occurs only when consciously attending to a given object. In normal circumstances, the senses always process a steady and continuous stream sensory impressions. But this sense data becomes a concrete object of apprehension only when attention is directed toward specific regions of the perceptual field. Why is it that causation must be understood from the perspective of consciousness? Because, given the generally pragmatic concerns of the Buddhist explanatory account, consciousness is central to effecting the changes that are necessary for an individual engaged on the noble eight-fold path to make any real progress. Thus, whereas contact cannot be prevented so long as consciousness (citta) inhabits, and is conditioned by, the mental constituents (caitta, caittasika), feelings and perceptions that result from contact are within the purview of consciousness.

4. Mind and mental phenomena

In the Buddhist philosophical vocabulary there are at least three terms for what is ordinarily designated as ‘mind’: manas (‘mental power’ or ‘mental faculty’), vijñāna (‘discernment’ or ‘consciousness faculty’) and citta (‘mind’ or ‘thought’). The term that most generally translates as ‘mind’ in the Abhidharma traditions is citta. But citta also denotes thought and it is usually used in conjunction with the ‘mental constituents’ (caitta) with which it stands in a reciprocal relation. Thus, whereas citta denotes the subjective aspect of the mental domain (e.g., a state of pure awareness), caitta refers to specific cognitive states, such as sensations, perceptions, feelings, volitions, etc. These mental constituents are understood specifically as cognitive domains (āyatana) or as sensed textures that mold our experience and give it its qualitative aspects—the phenomenal character of “what it is like”. Note that in works such as Buddhaghosa's Visuddhimagga and Vasubandhu's Treasury of Higher Knowledge, manas, vijñāna, and citta are used more or less synonymously as designating the same mental reality (cf. Lamotte 1938, 15). However, in the Mahāyānasaṃgraha (I, 6), Asaṅga takes the three terms as designating different realities: citta is said to stand for the Yogācāra notion of receptacle consciousness (ālaya-vijñāna), manas refers to the mental domain and its afflictive tendencies, and vijñāna to the six types of cognitive awareness (bodily, sensory, apperceptive, etc).

4.1 The two dimensions of mind

The Buddhist analysis of mind and mental phenomena relies on the expansive taxonomies of the Abhidharma traditions, which seek to explain human experience by reducing it to its most fundamental elements. These elements or dharmas (e.g., sensations, volitions, etc.) are effectively the irreducible units of experience that any analysis of persons must ultimately reveal. Breaking every experience down to its irreducible constituents holds the key to understanding both the dynamics of the mental and the resulting activities that are associated with the karmic process. But the ultimate aim of this reductive analysis is its overriding soteriological (or even therapeutic) concern: mapping the mental domain so that afflictive tendencies (kliṣṭa-manas) may be properly identified and countered.

An important, and perhaps unintended, consequence of this project of reductive analysis is that momentariness is revealed to be not only a principle of the nature of reality, but also (and more significantly) of cognitive awareness itself. In the formula of dependent arising (quoted above in §3.3), the awareness that arises in conjunction with the activity of a given sensory system is itself impermanent and momentary: visual awareness and visual object, for instance, are both events within a mental stream of continuing relations. The question that Abhidharma philosophers must confront is precisely what accounts for the sense of recollection that accompanies these cognitive series. In other words, if discrete, episodic cognitive events are all that constitutes the mental domain, how does appropriation and grasping, for instance, occur? The causal account, it seems, gives only an incomplete picture of the mental, for even as the Sanskrit term for cognitive awareness, vijñāna, conveys the sense of differentiation and discernment, it is not exactly clear how such discernment also sorts between an inner and an outer domain of experience. Indeed, consciousness is not merely a faculty for discerning and sorting through the constitutive elements of experience, but itself an event in a series of interdependent causes and conditions. As we shall see below, it is only later with the development of the Yogācāra notion of reflexive awareness, that this issue is properly addressed.

This account of the mental in terms of the irreducible units of experience or dharmas is not without it problems (see Piatigorsky 1984, 181; Waldron 2003, 52). If what we take to be mind and mental phenomena are in fact discrete and momentary series of cognitive events, how are we to account for those elements in the mental stream that appear to subsist and continue? The dual use of vijñāna in the early Abhidharma literature to designate both a momentary discerning faculty and a persisting sentience, simply masks the problematic: a descriptive account of vijñāna in terms of a succession of momentary cognitive events, which alone are real and causally efficacious, cannot explain how past events outside the immediate causal series, can affect the present. In its second use as pure consciousness or pure sensation, vijñāna takes on the role of explanans. The possibility that this secondary sense of vijñāna could be mistakenly taken as suggestive of an abiding, enduring reality, explains in part why the Abhidharma psychological vocabulary includes terms such as pudgala (‘individual’ or ‘person’) and citta-santāna (‘mind-steam’).

4.2 Cognitive Support (ālambana)

In the canonical literature, afflictive tendencies resulting from the accumulation of karmic activities are seen as a pervasive aspect of the mental life even for the adept engaged on the Buddhist path to liberation. In the Majjhima-Nikāya (I, 433), for instance, we see the Buddha instructing his disciples about the latent nature of such afflictive underlying tendencies as the ‘self-view’ (Pāli sakkāyadiṭṭhi, Skt. satkāyadṛṣṭi). The example given here is that of an infant who has a latent tendency toward manifesting the view of personhood despite presently lacking such a notion. Using this example, the Buddha then contrasts the state of the infant with that of a mature person who, not having learned about the no-self doctrine, habitually holds the view that she is or has a personality.

Afflictive tendencies are not the only factors conditioning the arising of cognitive awareness. The Abhidharma tradition also identifies various types of limitations imposed upon the senses by virtue of their natural constitution and the natural constitution of their apprehended objects. Vasubandhu, for instance, describes three types of resistance by which objects limit the activity of a given sense (see AKBh ad I, 14):

  1. Resistance pertaining to obstructions (āvaraṇapratighāta), exemplified by the fact that a body or any of its anatomical parts obstruct the manifestation of a similar body in that very same place;
  2. Resistance pertaining to the object (viṣayapratighāta), exemplified in the case of vision by fact that its activity is impeded by the absence of light, as when night restricts vision. Interestingly, in his example, Vasubandhu refers to the supposed difference between the human and the bat eye: the absence of light might obstruct vision for humans, but it facilitates vision for bats. Obviously, Vasubandhu could not have been aware that bats navigate by means of a sonar system rather that some special type of night vision.
  3. Resistance pertaining to the causal support (ālambanapratighāta), exemplified by the fact that the mind and mental states are restricted by their objects (this refers to the fact that the mind can only apprehend abstract mental objects and not empirical entities).

As this account of the types of limitations that restrict cognition demonstrates, the Abhidharma tradition seems unambiguous about the ultimate basis for cognition: this is to be found in the sensory domain itself, given that cognitions change following modifications at the level of sense rather than in the mind (see AKBh ad I, 45ab). In the case where changes in the mental stream occasion in the absence of any sensory stimulus, these are said to be the result of unconscious traces of past experience rather than endogenous to mind itself.

The Abhidharma analysis of the proper basis for the arising of cognition reveals another important aspect of the Buddhist cognitive model: cognition follows the sense rather than the object (see AKBh ad I 28ab). This is obvious, for instance, in the specific terminology used to describe conscious cognitive activity: thus, a consciousness which accompanies seeing is designated as “visual consciousness” (cakṣurvijñāna) rather than “consciousness of the visible“ (rūpavijñāna). Seeing or having conscious visual experiences is the result of being endowed with a visual system even as the seeming transparency of the experience of seeing might suggest that visual awareness is of the object itself.

The notion that cognition has its basis in the sense rather than the object is of tremendous philosophical import for the Sautrāntika and Yogācāra Schools, whose philosophical perspectives are best described as phenomenalism. Thus terms used to designate physical objects (viṣaya) are replaced with terms which designate cognitive aspects (ākāra). For the Yogācāras in particular, the denial of the existence of external objects may be interpreted simply as a rebuttal of the tendency to assign ontological status to empirical objects outside, or independent of, the cognitive events in which they are instantiated (cf. Lusthaus 2002, 121), a view reminiscent of Berkeley's likeness principle. Similar reasons are at work in the Yogācāra perspective of epistemologists like Dharmakīrti, who take the view that consciousness is inherently intentional, a position which has been recently termed ‘epistemic idealism’ (which is contrasted with ‘external realism,’ presumably the position adopted by the Sautrāntikas) (Dunne 2004, 59; see also Dreyfus 1997; 2007). However, insofar as Dharmakīrti is primarily concerned with epistemological issues, his commitment to the notion that we are immediately aware of our cognitive states holds regardless of whether he adopts an idealist or a phenomenalist stance (cf. Arnold 2008, 5 and passim).

5. Theories of Mind

The traditional model of mind found in canonical literature undergoes several systematic developments with the rise of the various Abhidharma schools. Among the most significant theories to emerge from these systematic appraisals are the Theravāda theory of the life-continuum mind (bravaṅga-citta), the Sarvāstivāda theory of appropriation in the mental stream (prāpti), the Sautrāntika theory of seeds (bīja) in the mental stream, and the Yogācāra theory of repository consciousness (ālaya-vijñāna). In addition, we will also look at Vasubandhu's critical response to the Pudgalavādins, and the issue of whether the reality of persons can be ascertained at the conventional level without undermining the metaphysical underpinings of the Buddhist no-self doctrine.

5.1 Mind and causation

As we saw above (§2.2) in the dynamic process of dependently arising phenomena that encompass the five aggregates, cognitive awareness (vijñāna) plays a double role: it is both the stream of conscious episodes that characterize the life of the mind and, at the same time, the principle of continuity of awareness, by virtue of which some sense of identity is maintained over time (cf. Johansson 1979, 63f; Krizer 1999, 195f). Thus cognitive awareness provides the basis for further cognitive activity, while also supporting the formative karmic activities (saṃskāra) of sensation, perception, volition, etc. that perpetuate the life cycle.

The double function of this cognitive awareness as a conditioned and conditioning factor within the overall dynamics of the five aggregates is explained in causal terms by means of an analysis of the underlying factors that play a role in the arising of each cognitive event. The list of the types of causes, conditions, and results in the Abhidharma discourse of causality vary only slightly from school to school. The classical Sarvāstivāda theory of causality, for instance, explains the patterns of conditioning through the intermediary of six causes (hetu) and four types of conditions (pratyaya), as follows (see AKBh ad II 49–73):


  1. connected (samprayukta)—ensure that each moment of mind is connected with its corresponding mental factors;
  2. simultaneous (sahabhū)—arise to simulataneously produce the same effect while also mutually interacting (such as when a latent disposition for joy and an external cause of joy, produce a succeeding moment of joy);
  3. homogeneous (sabhāga)—produce the experience of continuity or duration;
  4. pervasive (sarvatraga)—refers to ignorance about the true nature of things as the primary cause of cyclical existence;
  5. retributive (vipāka)—correspond to the global influence of past karmic activity;
  6. efficient or instrumental (kāraṇa)—gives rise to cognitive events following the coming together of sense, object, and corresponding type of cognitive awareness, such as in the visual experience of a patch of color.


  1. causal condition (hetupratyaya)—this includes all the causes mentioned above except for the instrumental cause;
  2. homogeneous and immediately antecedent condition (samanantarapratyaya)—which pertains to all past and present mental content;
  3. cognitive support condition (ālambanapratyaya)—this can be any mental object or mental factor;
  4. predominant factor condition (adhipatipratyaya)—this refers only to the instrumental cause.

Detailed accounts of causality such as this are usually followed by lengthy debates about the precise nature and role of these patterns of conditioning. For instance, on the model of the homogeneous and immediately antecedent condition (no. 2 above) a particular dharma conditions that arising of a dharma of a similar type: a moment of joy, therefore, may only give rise to another moment of joy. What this model cannot explain is how karmic maturation can arise from causes that are different, especially when the fruit of karmic activity is not the result of immediately succeeding causes but of a heterogeneous and temporally distant causal chain (see Waldron 2003, 65 and passim). It is precisely this sort of issues that precipitated the development of notions such as the mind-continuum (citta-santana) and receptacle consciousness (ālaya-vijñāna). More to the point, Abhidharma philosophers were pressed to counter the possibility that latent dispositions could persist in an unexplained way in the mental stream so that even skillful thoughts, for instance of generosity or loving-kindness, could not be free of them. The alternative scenario, in which the causal chain might be interrupted by a single thought, for instance of enlightenment, is no less puzzling: such an interruption could bring about sudden enlightenment.

Incidentally, developments in Chinese Buddhist thought linked with the Platform Sūtra would arrive at precisely such a conclusion: that enlightenment is not a gradual but an instantaneous process. Thus, advocates of the gradual path of cultivation (Skt. bhāvanā-krama, Chinese chien) would henceforth debate proponents of sudden enlightenment (Skt. yugapat, Chinese tun-wu) such as we find, for instance, in the Great Debate of Lhasa (ca. 792) between the Chinese and Korean Ho-shangs teachers and the highly scholastic Indian tradition of Yogācāra-Mādhyamaka represented by Śāntarakṣita and his disciple Kamalaśīla (see Demiéville 1947, 1952, Gomez 1987, Lai 1987, McRae 1987, Gregory 1987, Ruegg 1989).

5.2 Life-continuum mind

The challenge posed by the need to account for the continuity of mind in the absence of an enduring, substantive self, was met with mixed success by early Abhidharma authors. Thus, most Ābhidharmikas understood mind primarily as a species of mental cognition and, as such, explained the continuity of the mental stream as a successive series of cognitive events conditioned by such factors as karmic formations, appropriation, and mind itself.

The Theravāda authors extended this account of the continuity of the mental stream by introducing the notion of mind as factor of existence (bhava-aṅga). Thus, for the Theravādins, this life-continuum mind became just another factor conditioning the arising of cognitive awareness. The new formula for this dependent arising of cognitive awareness suggest a significant departure from the basic canonical account. As Buddhaghoṣa notes in the classical compendium of Theravāda Abhidharma, the Path to Purity (Visuddhimagga XV, 39), “mental awareness arises dependent on the life-continuum mind, mental content, and attention”. But continuity in the life-stream is also supported by the body, even though it is possible to assume the absence of bhava-aṅga in states of deep meditative absorption (cf. Collins 1982, 246). Outside these rare states of absorption, the bhava-aṅga-mind or mind as factor of existence is essential for continuity in the life-stream. The most common tropes used in this context are those of a stream or beads strung together on common thread. Collins sums up rather well the imagery used for explicating the function of the life-continuum mind:

The Theravāda concept of bhava-aṅga, then, is this: [...] the identity and continuity of one karmic unit—of one ‘person’ or ‘individuality’ within a lifetime, and of a single series of them [...] is guaranteed by the exitence of moments of bhava-aṅga-mind, which occur whenever there are no moments of mental process, of conscious functioning. Each of these bhava-aṅga-mind moments, of course, is itself a separate, temporally ‘atomic’ existent (1982, 247).

Modern interpreters have proposed that we regard the function of this life-continuum mind as being primarily subliminal, although its precise operations are not clearly specified. Thus, Cousins (1981, 28–30) and Nyayatiloka (1980, 27f) suggest that the principal function of bhava-aṅga may well be that of either accessing or carrying forth the dispositions, habits, and essential characteristics of the person. As such, it may not be a conditioning factor for the arising of cognitive awareness, but rather merely a subliminal level of mental processing.

5.3 Appropriation in the mental stream

In seeking to reconcile the Abhidharma analysis of mind, and its synchronic model of momentary cognitive events, with the diachronic phenomenon of karmic activity, the Abhidharma philosophers came up with different solutions. The Vaibhāṣika (also referred in the literature as the Sarvāstivādins), solved the problem of the continuity of karmic potential by proposing an ontology of the constitutive elements of reality (or dharmas) as existing in all three temporal dimensions: past, present, and future. On this ontological model, dharmas do not change, only their temporal condition does. The principal reason for adopting this peculiar ontology is the theory of the momentariness (kṣaṇikavāda) of all phenomena: if nothing endures for more than a moment how, then, can a cause that is no longer present lead to a manifest result? Similarly, if the accumulated karmic potential from past experience is no longer present, how could it affect the present condition? But in postulating the existence of the constituent elements of experience throughout the three temporal dimensions, the Sarvāstivādins simply shifted the Abhidharma problematic: having presumably explained what accounts for the efficacy of accumulated karmic potential, the question now is why a karmic result arises at one time rather than another? [for detailed discussions of Vaibhāṣika ontology and its analysis of mind see Williams 1981, Bastow 1994, and Cox 1995]

The Vaibhāṣika solution consists in the introduction of a new type of dharma, that of appropriation (prāpti), whose persistence in the mental stream is not due to any other factors, including the results of past actions, but rather to its own capacity to replicate itself. The presence of a factor of appropriation in the mental stream thus ensures the karmic efficacy of past causal chains. It also explains why mental factors and events remain associated with a given mental stream. This new dharma of appropriation is classified as being dissociated from thought and as neutral; it is also classified as being one of the determining factors for differentiating one mental stream from another (see AKBh ad II 35). Furthermore, it explains why certain dispositions, such as aversion, persist in the mental stream of one individual (because of an appropriation following the initial experience of a first moment of aversion), and how it is possible to overcome such dispositions (when appropriation is associated with factors that condition non-aversive states of mind). In both cases, the concept of appropriation provides an account of continuity in the mental stream that goes against the stipulations of the Abhidharmic principle of the momentariness of mental states. Thus, the Vaibhāṣika solution to reconciling the theory of causality with the theory of the momentariness of all phenomena rests on a notion that itself defies explanation, prompting traditional critics such as Vasubandhu to ask whether appropriation is a real entity or a merely conventional one, and in the end to dismiss it altogether (see AKBh ad II 36cd).

5.4 Seeds in the mental stream

The theory of seeds (bīja) in the mental stream, which is associated with the Sautrāntikas, represents a direct response to the Vaibhāṣika efforts toward an unified account of causality and momentariness. A ‘seed’ in this case stands for two sets of phenomena: (1) latent dispositions underlying the karmic process; and (2) the capacity or power of certain causal chains to bring about a given result. Unlike the Sarvāstivāda concept of appropriation, the notion of seeds, is used here only in a conventional sense and thus does not designate any real element of existence whether associated with, or dissociated from, thought. Taking memory as an example, Vasubandhu explains the metaphorical use of the notion of seeds in the mental stream as simply designating “the capacity for recollection to arise originating from experiential knowledge” just as, for instance, sprouts have the capacity “to produce a grain of rice from a previous grain of rice” (AKBh ad V 1d-2a).

The theory of seeds in the mental stream thus provides a mode of talking about causality that does not exclude the notions of latency and disposition. By applying the imagery that is associated with seeds and sprouting to mind and mental phenomena the Sautrāntikas open the door for an understanding of mentation as a dynamic and creative process. A causal account of the mental conditioning has thus been supplemented by a dispositional account of mental states (even though ultimately these dispositions are not really true factors of existence). Furthermore, given the association of intentional mental states with consciousness or cognitive awareness, cognitive events are regarded as the main force sustaining and perpetuating the life cycle, even though Buddhist traditions also admit that in certain states of meditative absorption there is no mental activity. For the Sautrāntikas it is the body with its sense organs and various other conditioning factors that are appropriated in consciousness, ensuring thus that some type of mentation whether in a conscious, subliminal, or subtle mental form (viz., dreamless sleep), is always ongoing. A debate only arises when considering the causal mechanism that permits the emergence of consciousness from cessation.

The debate between the Vaibhāṣikas and the Sautrāntikas concerning the emergence of consciousness from the attainment of cessation casts further light on the theoretical positions of these two schools regarding mind and mental phenomena. Drawing from the canonical literature, Buddhaghosa describes the attainment of cessation (Pāli, nirodha-samāpatti) as “the non-occurrence of consciousness and its concomitants owing to their progressive cessation” (Path to Purity, 23, 18; Ñānamoli 1956, 824), in which progressive cessation stands for all three types of activities (viz., physical, mental, and verbal). The Vaibhāṣika position is that in the attainment of cessation there are no mental events. Given the Vaibhāṣika's commitment to the causal account of the homogeneous and immediately antecedent condition (samanantarapratyaya), which states that mental events have as the necessary condition for their occurrence an immediately preceding mental event within the same mental series, he must answer the following questions, clearly identified by Griffiths (1986, 61): Does the last moment of consciousness prior to the attainment of cessation “posses an immediately antecedent and homogeneous condition but is not itself one?” And, conversely, does the first moment of consciousness following the attainment of cessation occur “without an immediately antecedent and homogeneous condition while itself being one for the moment that follows it?”

The Vaibhāṣika answers this questions, again, by appealing to the theory of the trans-temporal existence of dharmas and the possibility of a temporal separation between an immediately antecedent condition and its effects: thus, even in the case of longer (that is, non-momentary) temporal discontinuities in the mental stream, the causal principle of the immediately antecedent condition ensures that consciousness arises again from an instance similar to the one that preceded the attainment of cessation (cf. Griffiths 1986, 63).

The main point of disagreement between the Vaibhāṣika and the Sautrāntikas concerns the possibility of causation at a distance: that is, whether it is possible for the cognitive awareness preceding the attainment of cessation to serve as the immediately antecedent condition for the arising of consciousness after cessation. In assuming that mental activity is absent in the attainment of cessation, the Vaibhāṣika explain continuity in the mental stream by appealing to the principle of causation at a distance, specifically by relying on their trans-temporal view of dharmas. Furthermore, for the Vaibhāṣikas, given that they accept the existence of past dharmas, the thought of cessation (samāpatticitta) becomes the immediately antecedent and homogeneous condition for the thought of awakening (vyutthānacitta).

For their part, the Sautrāntika accept neither causation at a distance, nor the existence of constitutive elements of experience in all three temporal dimensions. Rather, as Vasubandhu and his commentators Yaśomitra and Sthiramati argue, the consciousness that emerges immediately following the attainment of cessation has as its cause the physical body: this is because mind and body are in a constant and reciprocal relation of causation, that is, “the mind and the body with its perceptual systems mutually seed one another” (AKBh ad II 44d; Poussin 1980, vol. I, 212). Other Sautrāntikas, such as Vasumitra, content that in effect a subtle form of consciousness continues even after the attainment of cessation, for to assume otherwise would be equivalent to claiming that life can continue without consciousness (an untenable position for the Buddhist).

The Vaibhāṣika rebuttal to the notion that some subtle form consciousness persists even after the attainment of cessation points to the tripartite nature of the dependently arising cognitive phenomena: cognitive awareness, being inherently intentional, is always directed toward an object, and whenever there is contact with such an object there is feeling and apperception. In response, the Sautrāntika insists that not all contact leads automatically to sensation (as is the case with advanced contemplatives such as the Arhats) and furthermore that the notion of attainment itself (samāpatti) in fact implies the presence of a conscious state of the attainment of cessation. That state of attainment is not sustained by any substantive elements of existence (viz., the trans-temporal dharmas of the Vaibhāṣika) but rather by the thought of attainment itself (samāpatticitta). It is this thought of attainment that prevents, for as long as a meditator is able to sustain it, the arising of any other thoughts. The attainment of cessation, then, is simply a temporary state of non-mentation.

Neither the theory of appropriation nor that of seeds in the mental stream seem to offer a satisfactory account of non-mentation. The limitations of the two views are clearly spelled out by Sthiramati (see Ṭikā ad AKBh VIII, 33): First, in the case of the Vaibhāṣikas, consciousness or the arising of consciousness cannot have as its immediately antecedent and homogeneous condition the cessation of consciousness for that violates the causal principle itself, even assuming that body and sensory systems provide a basis for this arising. Second, by claiming that consciousness can indeed arise from the body and its sensory systems, the Sautrāntikas fall short of identifying the specific cause which assures (on the basis of the causal principle of the homogeneity of the species) that consciousness arises at precisely the right moment. Even assuming that mind and body seed each other prior to the attainment of cessation, there is no causal mechanism to explain why a particular type of consciousness arises and not another: in the absence of a cause that ensures the homogeneity of the species, with just the body and its sensory systems as the basis, any type of consciousness could arise, rendering the causal process random and arbitrary. The function of the causal principle of the homogeneity of the species is precisely that of ensuring that, say, when visual system and visible object come together, it is visual consciousness rather than auditory or olfactory consciousness that arises [for a detailed analysis of the complex issues surrounding the attainment of cessation, see Griffiths 1986, 66 and passim].

5.5 Repository consciousness

The theoretical developments that led to the notion of repository consciousness (ālaya-vijñāna), which is associated with the Yogācāra School, are already foreshadowed in these Abhidharma debates about how best to account for continuity in the mental stream and the efficacy of accumulated karmic potential. The notion of repository consciousness appears perhaps for the first time in Asaṅga’s encyclopedic work, Stages of the Practice of Yoga (Yogācārabhūmi, cf. Schmithausen 1987, 12, 18). The new type of consciousness, closely connected with the living body, retains much of the original use of vijñāna to designate both consciousness and cognition. The function of the repository consciousness is explained in a seminal Yogācāra work such as the Sutra Explaining the Profound Meaning (Saṃdhinirmocana-sūtra, V. 2, Lamotte 1935, 230) as having the primary function of ‘descending’ in the mother's womb, ‘appropriating’ the sensory systems and their respective cognitive support, and thus creating the predisposition toward mental proliferation (cf. Waldron 2003, 95 and passim).

The Yogācāra thus explains the cognitive process as a maturation of the flow of discrete elements of consciousness. This flow of consciousness, which the Sautrāntikas call mind-continuum (citta-santāna), ultimately supports all types of perceptual activity, including self-awareness. In its indeterminate state, this flow of consciousness is the repository of all non-aspectual types of cognitive awareness (nirvikalpa-jñāna). This repository mind is said to arise together with all the seeds, thus suggesting the imagery of a repository of all the elements of consciousness and cognition.

In the Compendium of the Great Vehicule (Mahāyānasaṃgraha; hereafter MSG), Asanga defines the receptacle consciousness (ālaya-vijñāna) as the basis or support of that which is cognizable (jñeyāśraya) and explains the term ‘receptacle’ (ālaya) as suggestive of a double function: (1) that of acting as a repository for the afflictive tendencies, and (2) that of providing the causal potentiality of the dharmas themselves (MSG I, 1–5). Furthermore, the receptacle consciousness is described as having the uncommon characteristic of being the seed for the sense spheres (MSG I, 59): the obvious implication here is that our experience of the world is as perception reveals it. And since the sense spheres are in effect seeded by this receptacle consciousness, the world we inhabit is ultimately a minded world.

In his analysis of consciousness in the Thirty Verses (Triṃśikā-kārikā, I, 1) Vasubandhu treats apprehending subject and apprehended phenomena are emergent properties of the threefold transformation of consciousness (vijñānapariṇama). This transformation begins when the maturating seeds of consciousness take the form of perception and thought processes. Following this process of maturation and in dependence upon the repository consciousness there evolves a reflective awareness whose object is none other than this subliminal or repository consciousness itself. This theory of cognitive emergence presumably provides a better account of the role that the residual forces of past cognitions play in ‘seeding‘ the repository consciousness. It is the dynamics of these residual forces which ultimately generates the intentional forms of cognitive awareness that support all other forms of cognitive activity.

5.6 Persons: reductionism and supervenience

One group of Buddhist philosophers, the Pudgalavādins (lit. personalists), usually identified with the Vātsīputrīyas, seem to have advocated the view that persons can be said to conventionally exist, insofar as they are conceived in dependence upon the five aggregates and the six types of cognitive awareness (cf. Priestley 1999). The Pudgalavādins took persons to be as real as the collection of aggregates and regarded them as neither identical nor different from the aggregates. Direct accounts of the Pudgalavāda doctrine survive primarily in the critiques of their opponents (and in three short texts preserved only in Chinese and in the Saṃmitīyanikāyaśāstra).

Vasubandhu offers what is perhaps the most detailed account of the personalist theory in his Treasury of Higher Knowledge, along with a refutation of the Brahmanical view of persons advocated by the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophers. The relevant section of the text, the Treatise on the Negation of the Person (AKBh IX), begins with the standard warning that clinging to any substantive view of the self is detrimental to one's progress toward liberation. Insofar as the notion of “self” or “person” is retained this should not be taken to designate anything other than the aggregates.

The arguments that the Pudgalavādins advance in support of the reality of persons may be summarized as follows:

  1. Persons, which exist in dependence upon the aggregates are real, just like fire, which is conceived in dependence upon fuel, is real.
  2. The reality of persons is ascertained by means of perception, or more specifically, by the apperception that accompanies each apprehension of an object. That persons are real is demonstrated by means of an unexplainable perception, since persons are perceived.
  3. Things such as persons can be real without having a separate identity, that is, without having either substantive existence or being conceptually established upon substantive entities (viz., the aggregates).
  4. Persons exist ultimately insofar as they are dependent upon the aggregates, which are ultimately real.

In introducing the views of the personalists, Vasubandhu draws a distinction between the substantive and the conceptual view of the self. Thus, if ‘person’ (pudgala) is taken to designate a substantive entity that is separate from the bundle of the five aggregates and unconditioned, then that cannot be the Buddhist view (per contra that is the Brahmanical view of the self). On the other hand, if the notion of ‘person’ designates a collection of aggregates, then it is admissible to talk about persons being conventionally real (for detailed discussions of Vasubandhu's critique of the personalist view see Duerlinger 1993, 2003). Drawing on some contemporary discussions in the philosophy of mind, Siderits (2003: 89–96) makes a good case for taking the Pudgalavādins as proposing something analogous to the notion that persons non-reductively supervene on the aggregates.

6. Mind and Metaphysics

6.1 Dialectics and the No-self view

A common stylistic feature of the Buddhist canonical literature is the use of similes and parables, of which perhaps the best known is the simile of the raft. In the Middle Length Discourses, the Buddha is seen explaining to an old man that his body of teachings is like a raft: it serves the purpose of crossing over (viz., from the shore of afflictions to that of nirvāṇa) and should be abandoned once the crossing has been effected (Majjhima Nikāya, III, 22; Ñānamoli & Bodhi 1995, 228f). The simile of the raft marks the pragmatic (Jayatilleke (1963, 357) calls it ‘utilitarian’) approach of the Buddha's teachings, and is also suggestive of a core aspect of Buddhist praxis: the notion of expedient means (upāya-kauśalya). Ganeri has recently proposed that we identify the nature of Buddha's discourses as being essentially protreptic, similar to the Stoic exhortation which invites the adept to reconsider and rethink her ethical and metaphysical position (cf. Ganeri 2007, 100 and passim). Thus, the notion of expedient means—this specifically Buddhist protreptic—operates as a cautionary device against the tendency to assume that Buddhist doctrines may be seen as articulating a particular type of metaphysics whose principles are to be examined without any appeal to context or target audience.

It is primarily in response to the Buddha's use of expedient means (and the expansion of the Buddhist canonical literature with the advent of Mahāyāna sūtras) that Abhidharma traditions develop the hermeneutics of two truths: depending on scholastic affiliation, doctrinal positions are henceforth classified as either in need of interpretation (neyārtha) or as already possessing the definitive meaning (nītārtha) (see Lopez 1988, and contributions therein).

The hermeneutics of two truths is central to Madhyamaka dialectics and its deconstructive analysis of key metaphysical concepts, including those of causation, essence, and the self. In the Fundamental Wisdom of the Middle Way (Mūlamadhyamakakārikās; hereafter MMK), Nāgārjuna extends the notion that phenomena lack intrinsic existence (svabhāva) to apply to the self, which is usually conceived in dependence upon the five aggregates (MMK, IX, 12). While considering various ways of conceiving of the self (viz., as distinct from the psychophysical aggregates, as unchanging, as a unifying principle, or as an agent), Nāgārjuna concludes that none of them actually make sense on account of the fact that nothing can be said to be prior to the cognitive activities of seeing, hearing, etc. (MMK, IX, 7, 10). A metaphysical self, conceived as an abiding and substantive entity, is therefore inconceivable.

However, the mistaken apprehension of a self in a stream of causally interconnected cognitive events does not preclude endorsing a conventional notion of self for ordinary individuals who lack a proper understanding of actions and their consequences. Indeed, Āryadeva (ca. 150 C.E.), an immediate disciple of Nāgārjuna, invokes the expedient means device to endorse precisely such a view: for certain classes of individuals adherence to a conventional view of self is more profitable than the denial of self. The no-self view, claims Āryadeva, is primarily reserved for those of a superior disposition, who alone can grasp the definite meaning of the Buddha's teachings (cf. Catuḥśataka, 12.12-14). However, ultimately the Buddha's teachings are interpreted as endorsing not any specific view, but rather the relinquishing of all views—which is only possible in a non-positional awareness that captures the paradoxical nature of the Madhyamaka dialectic (detailed discussions of the Madhyamaka dialectic of emptiness as applied to the self are found in Sprung 1979, Huntington 1989, Tillemans 1990, Garfield 1995, and Westerhoff 2009).

6.2 Realism

Although all Abhidharma schools admit the ultimate reality of dharmas, only the Vaibhāṣika (or Sarvāstivāda) School contends that dharmas exist in all three temporal dimensions (past, present, and future). The main arguments for this view are found in the Vijñānakāya and the Mahā-Vibhaṣā, as well as in Vasubandhu's Abhidharmakośa, where they are systematically debated and refuted. In all, three types of arguments are put forward to support the notion that the past and future basic units of existence (dharmas) are presently real:

  1. The argument from cognition: Past and future dharmas exist because of our ability to make past and future events the object of our cognitive awareness.
  2. The dispositional argument: The presence of dispositions (as habituations resulting from past intentional acts) implies that past and future dharmas associated with these dispositions must be presently manifest.
  3. The causal argument: past dharmas must be real and present for otherwise they would lack causal efficacy in bringing about a present effect.

A plausible rationale for the Sarvāstivādin’s assertion of the continuing existence of past and future dharmas concerns the first and third arguments: it is impossible to conceive of a non-existent intentional object or the causal efficacy of a non-existent dharma. Given the principle of momentariness, which states that things exist only as point instants, it would be impossible to explain the arising of a particular type of cognitive awareness in the absence of an already existing preceding cause. Cognitive awareness, which arises in dependence upon the object and the corresponding sense faculty, would lack support if past dharmas were unreal. In his commentary to the verse portion of the Treasury of Higher Knowledge, Vasubandhu explains the standpoint of the Sarvāstivādin as follows:

Cognitive awareness (vijñāna) occurs only if the objective correlate exists, not otherwise. If past and future were nonexistent then the object of cognitive awareness would be a nonexistent cognitive support (ālambana). Therefore consciousness would not occur if its objective support does not exist. Furthermore if the past is nonexistent then how could there be in the future the effect of good and bad deeds? For the present cause of its fruition no longer exists at the time when the effect arises. Therefore the Vaibhāṣika maintain that past and future exist (AKBh ad V, 25; Poussin 1980, vol. IV, p.51).

For the Vaibhāṣikas the justification for maintaining the existence of dharmas in all three temporal dimensions is provided by their causal theory of cognition: since cognitive awareness cannot arise in the absence of an objective support, the cognition must be causally related to object. The object, therefore, must be real, for nonexistent objects lack causal efficacy (as we discussed in §5.1).

6.3 Nominalism

Nominalism is primarily associated with a specific philosophical position adopted by the Buddhist philosophers of the logico-epistemological tradition concerning the ontological status of universals. However, long before the development of Buddhist Nominalism, Buddhist philosophers had adopted what might be properly termed as a nominalist stance in regards to the nature of composite entities, including persons. Thus, discussions about the ontological status of the various elements of experience in the early Abhidharma traditions were already framed by the distinction between things that existed substantively (dravyasat) versus those that has only nominal or conventional existence (prajñaptisat).

In the celebrated dialogue between the Buddhist philosopher Nāgasena and King Milinda (often identified with the Greco-Bactrian King Menander I, ca. 150 B.C.E.), we come across one of the first references to the notion that an individual exists only as an appellation or conventional designation (Pāli paññatti, Skt, prajñapti). As Nāgasena declares in response to the King's question about who he is or what is he known as: “Nāgasena and so on—is only a generally understood term, a designation in common use. For there is no permanent individuality (or self) involved in the matter” (Questions of King Milinda, II, 1, 25). Nāgasena's claim frames the nominalist tendency that is already at work in the Buddhist canonical literature: just as words such as ‘chariot’ are used only when certain parts are arranged together to form a spatio-temporal entity we ordinarily designate as such, so also an individual (satto) is nothing but a conventional designation that applies to the five aggregates.

Although Abhidharma philosophical views on the kinds of entities that have only nominal existence range widely, it is generally agreed that persons or individuals are always to be taken as nothing more than merely conventional designations established on the basis of the five aggregates, the domains of perceptual activity, and their respective elements. Note, however, that Abhidharma philosophers do not deny the physical reality of aggregated entities and persons. Indeed, materiality or form (rūpa), which is also one of five collections of aggregates, is generally considered to be an external, non-mental reality. Rather, the two-tiered approach to the existence of phenomena, which distinguishes between substantial and nominal existents, is meant to reject not the existence of extra mental entities proper, but rather the existence of all partite entities such as chairs, pots, and tables (cf. Kapstein 2001, 90 and passim; Siderits 2003, 33 and passim).

In the Abhidharma ontology only the atoms that compose the four elements are ultimately real. Thus, the theory of two levels of existents implies a philosophical perspective that is best described as reductionism. On this view, only partless entities (i.e., atoms) can be said to properly exist. The property-particulars of phenomenal experience (the svalakṣaṇas) are real only insofar as their atomic configurations provide a causal basis for the arising of perceptual apprehension. But the Buddhist reductionist, as Siderits (2003, 13 and passim) has clearly argued, is not an eliminativist. Unlike the eliminative materialist who regards conventional, folk-psychological discourse about persons as unsupported by, say, neuroscientific data (and is thus willing to dispense with a theory of persons altogether), the Buddhist reductionist merely points to the conventional nature of persons as ordinarily conceived. Whether we consider the view of Buddhist personalists such as the Vātsīputrīyas (or Pudgalavādins), who hold that persons non-reductively supervene upon the psychophysical aggregates, or that of Buddhist reductionists who treat persons as conventional designations, a theory of persons is retained.

6.4 Idealism

The Yogācāra school, which is associated with the works of Asaṅga and Vasubandhu, its founders and principal exponents, is often identified by later Buddhist doxographers as the Mind-only or Cognition-only School (Cittamātra or Vijñaptimātra), on account of its internalist epistemology. In texts such as Vasubandhu's Twenty Verses: A Demonstration on Existence of Consciousness Only (Viṃśatikā Vijñaptimātratāsiddhi; hereafter VVS) and Dignāga's Investigation of the Cognitive Support (Ālambanaparīkṣā; and its Vṛtti; hereafter APV) we are presented with a metaphysical picture of cognitive awareness or consciousness as the only ultimately existing reality.

In the Twenty Verses, Vasubandhu offers an elaborate defense of idealism. His arguments may be summarized as follows: Because non-existing entities can be consciously apprehended, consciousness must have ontological priority (VVS I, 1). The typical realist objection concerns the causal function of perception: indeed, if mental content can be said to consciously arise without any reference to external objects, then why does it arise at a specific time and place and not everywhere and at any given moment? (VVS ad 2) In his response, Vasubandhu appeals to the dream argument: objects in a dream appear as having determined spatio-temporal coordinates without there being any correspondence to external realities. As he explains, dream objects arise in dependence upon the transformation of residual impressions (vāsanās), stock examples of which include the phenomenon of nocturnal emission of semen (VVS ad 3–4). Similarly, to the objection that cognition must have a basis (āyatana) for its arising, Vasubandhu responds by appealing to the theory of seeds in the mental stream: the physical object and the cognitive faculty which together provide the basis for the arising of a particular type of cognitive awareness are now seen as an object-oriented cognitive aspect and its internal representation. It only seems as though a patch of color and the visual system which processes it are the basis for color qualia. In reality, claims Vasubandhu, it is the residual traces (viz., the transforming seeds) in the mental stream that take the form of tangible object and tactile sense (VVS ad 9).

A stronger objection, however, pertains to certain aspects of doctrine: if consciousness has the capacity to appear as bearing the characteristics of material objects, then what purpose do canonical teachings about the material bases for the arising of consciousness serve? The answer to the second objection is twofold: first, Vasubandhu appeals to the hermeneutical strategies of Buddhist schools such as Madhyamaka and Yogācāra, which distinguish between direct and indirect meaning (thus interpreting earlier teachings as having only an implied meaning (neyārtha), which is only made explicit (nītārtha) in the latter texts of the Mahāyāna, and in particular of the Yogācāra tradition); second, Vasubandhu, relies on the dual aspect theory of cognition with its internalist perspective (which regards the appearance of objectual aspects in cognition as the result of residual traces stemming from the receptacle consciousness) (see VVS ad 10).

However, Vasubandhu's most compelling proof for idealism appeals to the method of mereological reduction: wholes, being merely collections of minimal parts, do not actually exist as perceived. But wholes, which are extended objects, must necessarily be made of parts, the ultimate building blocks of which are the atoms. And since atoms, conceived as partless point-instant are ultimately insubstantial, the realist argument for the existence of material objects as conglomerates of parts must be false (VVS ad 11–14; for detailed discussion of some of these arguments, see Kapstein 1988; Tola & Dragonetti 2004, 98–110; Gold 2006).

Vasubandhu's refutation of the reality (and causal efficacy) of external objects as spatio-temporal entities raises some important mereological issues and has a number of consequences for perception:

  1. For an external entity to be an object of cognition it must (i) either be a whole (avayavin) made of parts but be more than its parts put together, (ii) or be a non-combined set of contiguous atoms, (iii) or be a combined set of cohesive atoms.
  2. Vasubandhu rejects both wholes and combined sets (whether cohesive or merely contiguous). Wholes are rejected by appealing to the Buddhist reductionist principle which says that only the component parts of an entity are real (aggregated wholes, on this view, are not).
  3. The rejection of combined sets rests on the refutation of Vaibhāṣika atomism. For the Vaibhāṣika, who are realists, atoms are both indivisible and also capable of aggregation (specifically, in sets of seven atoms, with one at the center, and the other six arranged so as to correspond to the six cardinal points) (see AKBh ad I, 43).
  4. In his refutation of atomism, Vasubandhu explains that for combinations of atoms to form partite aggregated entities, the atoms would have to be contiguous, and as contiguous atoms would be confounded with one another. Two or more atoms in contact would appear to have parts, which is by definition impossible (since atoms are partless entities) (see AKBh ad I, 43). Thus, connection among atoms implies loss of indivisibility, and since atoms by definition cannot have (connection enabling) parts, so too aggregated wholes must lack connection among their constitutive parts (it is assumed that the connecting relation is transitive).
  5. For Vasubandhu, thus, an ontology of impartite atoms cannot explain connection. In other words, the reduction of compounded entities to their component parts, and of those parts to their own pars, is not logically supported by atomism. Thus, Vasubandhu concludes (VVS ad 11) that admitting the existence of partless entities as the ultimate building blocks of reality would make it in effect impossible to explain the specific natures of aggregated phenomena. Consequently, only partite entities exist.
  6. Other objections to atomism include the argument from mutual obstruction: lacking parts, an atom could obstruct other atoms from impinging on it, leading to the unwarranted conclusion that all atoms could occupy the same region of space.
  7. Thus, neither composite entities made of indivisible parts, nor the indivisible parts themselves can provide a basis for cognitive awareness. Physical objects (the collection of mid-size dry goods that populate the realist's ontology) cannot exist as perceived and must therefore be a product of conceptual elaboration (vikalpa, kalpanā).
  8. Since atoms either alone or combined cannot provide a basis for cognitive awareness, the perception of aggregated entities must be the product of imagination (parikalpa).
  9. The division of perception into direct (nirvikalpa, a bare awareness without any discrimination) and indirect (savikalpa, what we ordinarily call a percept, involving some level of cognitive determination of the object), helps clarify Vasubandhu's argument: at the level of bare awareness there is no perception of composite entities; at the level of discriminating awareness perception reveals a world of objects as wholes with specific properties. Indirect perception, arises at a moment when the external cause that occasioned the perceptual experience is not longer present.
  10. So by invoking the momentary nature of phenomena, and the two-tier process of perception, Vasubandhu is able to demonstrate that the determinate objects of awareness in fact lack an external cognitive support.

In his Investigation of the Cognitive Support Dignāga takes up, as the title suggests, one of the specific issue debated by Vasubandhu in his Twenty Verses: what exactly should count as an object of cognition? Dignāga's definition of the cognitive support invokes the principle of the concomitance of cause and effect (kāryakāraṇabhāva). Thus, for an object to count as a support (ālambana) for cognitive awareness it must (i) produce a cognition, and (ii) that cognition must take the form of the object (see APV ad Iad). In large measure Dignāga follows Vasubandhu's line of argumentation in his refutation of the realistic atomism of the Vaibhāṣikas (and of the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika tradition). His innovations consist mainly in appealing to the principle of the coexistence of cause and effect and to the Yogācāra theory of mental aspects. As proof that internal aspects, which provide a basis for cognition, arise simultaneously with cognition itself, Dignāga cites the principle of the concomitance of cause and effect (kāryakāraṇabhāva): although the causal relation is understood sequentially, by virtue of the necessary dependence of cause and effect, whenever a cause is present its effect must also be present. The theory of cognitive aspects serves to further demonstrate that it is the appearance of an internally cognizable aspect that is the actual cognitive support. Because cognitions which arise taking the form of an apparently external object are the determining factor for the arsing of subsequent cognitions, the external object (say, a visible entity) and the sense faculty (visual sense) are merely projective aspects of this initial aspectual cognition (APV ad VII b).

Thus, Dignāga effectively argues that cognition arises bearing two aspects: that of the object and that of the cognition itself, such that cognition and cognized object are not different: they are both manifestations of cognitive awareness itself.

Whether the Yogācāra ontology of mind is idealist or can be interpreted as a type of phenomenalism depends of course on how one interprets one of its key technical concepts: the vijñapti-mātra (lit. ‘cognition only’ or ‘nothing but cognition.’). May (1971) and Schmithausen (1973) are among the strongest proponents of an idealist interpretation of the Yogācāra ontology of mind. However, as Schmithausen points out the idealist formulation arose not out of purely theoretical or doctrinal concerns, but rather as a generalization based on the insights derived from meditative practice. In an innovative metaphilosophical essay on Western idealism as seen from a Yogācāra perspective, Garfield (1998) argues that idealism is a contrastive ontology, in which mind and mental constituents are assigned a fundamental reality that is denied to external objects. Thus, while Berkeley, Kant, Hegel, Schopenhauer, and Bradley may hold different views on the nature of mind, they all presumably agree on its ontological primacy. Likewise, claims Garfield, regardless of how Yogācārins like Vasubandhu conceive of the mind, to the extent that they ascribe to it any sort of ontological primacy over external objects, they are idealists in this contrastive ontological sense.

Wayman (1965) is perhaps the first scholar to have challenged the idealist interpretation of vijñapti-mātra routinely applied to Yogācāra by both historical opponents, such as the Mādhyamikas and orthodox Brahmanical philosophers, as well as by early generations of modern translators and commentators. His argument is that Yogācārins like Vasubandhu do not really deny the reality of external objects; rather, they simply content that cognitive activity can arise even in the absence of an external object. Wayman's critique (reprised in Wayman 1996) has set the platform of an entire generation of scholars who have argued against the idealist interpretation of Yogācāra ontology (see Kochumutton 1982; Kalupahana 1987; Powers 1996; Lusthaus 2002; Dunne 2004). There is no general consensus at present on how best to represent the metaphysical position of the Yogācāras: proposals vary from realistic pluralism, to pragmatism, neutral monism, epistemic idealism, to a realist phenomenology on the model of Husserl and Merleau-Ponty. Alternative interpretations include the notion that Yogācāra is best understood as a system outlining a “therapeutic course of action (ācāra) rooted in meditation (yoga)” (Anacker 1984, 194) or as providing an account of the “unconscious structuring of experience” (Waldron 2002; 2003: xi).

6.5 Phenomenalism

Something analogous to a phenomenalist stance is adopted by the Sautrāntikas. Vasubandhu, who in the commentary portion to the Treasury of Higher Knowledge, argues from the perspective of the Sautrāntikas, provides a phenomenalist account of experience. On this view, form does not refer to the material aspect of an independently existing entity but rather to how it is phenomenally disclosed in perception. Form is thus defined as something that can either be disrupted by impact or as something that opposes resistance (pratighāta). However, these properties do not extend to the atoms themselves, which form the building blocks of materiality. Although as monadic units the atoms are seen as devoid of any formal properties, as atomic compounds (saṃghātastha, saṃcita) the atoms are subject to the same properties of resistance and destruction as any other material entities.

The difficulty of reconciling atomism—a fundamental tenet of Buddhist ontology—with the phenomenology of perception is apparent in early Abhidharma debates between Realists (chiefly the Vaibhāṣikas) and the Phenomenalists (the Sautrāntikas). The debate between the Vaibhāṣikas and the Sautrāntikas on the issue of whether the sensible qualities of objects (viz., color, shape, etc.) supervene on the atoms is a telling point. For the Vaibhāṣikas, secondary properties such as color (varṇa) are in fact substances (dravya) similar to the four great elements. For the Sautrāntikas, color is a derived property that lacks the elemental nature of primary dharmas like fire, water, etc. Rather, secondary properties are treated by the Sautrāntikas as potentialities that reside in aggregated entities. Moreover, the Sautrāntikas conceive of atoms not as substantial impartite entities, but rather as the most subtle collection of material elements (see AKBh ad II, 22ab).

On this Sautrāntika view, as presented by Vasubandhu, perceived material properties, both primary (e.g., solidity) and secondary (e.g., color) are in fact emergent properties of subtle collections of elements whose phenomenal properties reflect the constitution and function of the perceptual systems. For instance, fluidity in the case of water may be classified both as a primary property of water atoms and also as a secondary property reflecting a specific configuration of water atoms. The same atoms of water, when configured as ice, may produce the sensation of hardness instead of that of fluidity.

A phenomenal object is such that it affects an individual by occasioning different types of experience. For example, water causes the experience of wetness and fluidity, rocks the experience of resistance or hardness, irregular surfaces the experience of roughness, etc. The material aspect of the experienced object as experienced, although arising in dependence upon the activity of the corresponding sense sphere, at the same time obstructs and limits it: a wall limits movement, night restricts vision, etc. This is the typical phenomenological stance: physical entities are mind independent, but we have no way of knowing how they are in themselves apart from the way we perceive and conceive them.

An often quoted passage from the Abhidharma literature reads: “One sees the blue, but one does not see ‘it is blue’.”[2] This statement captures an essential aspect of Buddhist phenomenalism: indirect perception, rather than providing a definitive picture of the content of non-conceptual awareness, instead distorts and misrepresents this content. The Buddhist preoccupation with the pure datum of experience is in large measure motivated by a deep suspicion of “any sort of theorizing about the world that we experience” (Matilal 1986, 315). This is one of the main reasons why philosophers of the logico-epistemological tradition invite us to go beyond our ordinary language intuitions.

7. Mind and Epistemology

Neither the canonical literature nor the early Abhidharma schools provide detailed accounts of the means by which we may discriminate between veridical and non-veridical states of cognitive awareness. Works such as the Kathāvatthu (ca. 150 C.E.) do concern themselves with the rules and the various types of debate and consider a wide range of views, but there is no systematic account of the criteria that ensure certainty. For systematic treatments of the epistemological import of various states of cognitive awareness we must turn to the Buddhist logico-epistemological tradition (pramāṇavāda) initiated by Dignāga (ca. 480–540) and Dharmakīrti (ca. 600–660) [I will refer to these two thinkers, and to their followers, as ‘epistemologists’ so as to highlight that their concerns are primarily epistemological]. It is generally agreed that this tradition sprang out of a growing preoccupation with issues of logic and language among those Buddhists who regarded polemical engagement with their Brahmanical opponents as vital to their philosophical enterprise (see Frauwallner 1959, Hattori 1968, Hayes 1988, Matilal 1998). In spearheading his model of epistemological inquiry Dignāga (and following him, Dharmakīrti) significantly changed the course of Buddhist philosophy in India.

The two most influential works of the Buddhist logico-epistemological tradition are Dignāga’s Collection on Valid Cognition (Pramāṇasamuccaya; hereafter PS) and Dharmakīrti’s Commentary on Valid Cognition (Pramāṇavārttika; hereafter PV). Dharmakīrti’s work, essentially a commentary on Dignāga’s, is to be singled out as one of the most outstanding contributions to Indian Buddhist thought, presenting a definite account of what later generations of philosophers in India took to be the normative Buddhist view. Dharmakīrti influenced the views of later Buddhist philosophers such as Śāntarakṣita (725–783), Kamalaśīla (740–795), Jñānagarbha (8th century), Dharmottara (750–810), Jñānaśrīmitra (ca. 975–1050), Ratnakīrti (11th century) Ratnākaraśānti (11–12th century) and Mokṣakaragupta (1150–1202).

7.1 Two sources of reliable cognition

The Buddhist logico-epistemological enterprise rests on two major viewpoints: (i) the domains of language and conceptual thought are identical; and (ii) direct perception can in fact provide access to the simple, further irreducible, data of experience or the particular as such (the svalakṣaṇa). It is debatable, however, whether this position on the intrinsic validity of perceptual cognitions implies that the Buddhist epistemologists pursue a kind of epistemic foundationalism (akin to that of modern sense datum theorists) or, rather, that they are concerned with the intentional character of the phenomenal contents of experience (see Siderits 2004, Dreyfus 1996, Tillemans 1999, 2003, Coseru 2009a).

Philosophers of the Abhidharma traditions had argued that our cognitive propensities are beginningless, each thought being merely the continuation of an endless series of previous thoughts, which constantly inform, influence, and direct the cognitive process (see AKBh ad III, 19). They maintained that these cognitive propensities are most vividly manifest in traces of memory and in the activity of conceptual thought. The Buddhist epistemologists, however, came to reject both memory (sṃrti) and conceptual elaboration (kalpanā) as reliable sources of knowledge. These cognitive modalities were completely dissociated from direct perception, the only type of cognitive awareness that Dignāga regarded as warranted.

The Buddhist epistemologists adopt a parsimonious epistemology: only two sources or instruments of cognition (pramāṇa) are accepted are reliable: perception (pratyakṣa) and inference (anumāna). Dignāga gives a most basic reason why we ought to accept only these two sources as warranted: that is, because there are only two types of objects, those bearing their own characteristic mark (i.e., particulars) and those whose characteristic is that of universality (i.e., universals), each corresponding to a specific mode of apprehension (PSV ad I, 2; Hattori 1968, 24, 79). What we have here is an attempt to translate the two fundamental categories of particular and universal back to their specific knowledge source: particulars to perception and universals to inferential reasoning. Dignāga, thus, appears to be claiming that all objects of cognition, whether external or internal, cannot be properly understood if separated from the types of cognitive events in which they are instantiated, a view best described as phenomenalism.

7.2 Epistemic accounts of perception

The Buddhist epistemologists limit warranted perception to direct, unmediated experience only. Perception is regarded as necessarily involving contact (sparśa, sannikarṣa) between the sense and the object. Dignāga (following Vasubandhu) notes that perception is named after the sense rather than after the object (see AKBh ad I, 45ab). Thus perception, following the sense rather than the object, cognizes inexpressible particularities or the object as a particular domain of experience. Indirect perception, which is usually understood as involving some degree of conceptual discrimination (vikalpakajñāna) is not treated as perception proper. Unlike their principal opponents, the Naiyāyikas and the Mīmāṃsākas, the Buddhist epistemologists do not regard indirect perception as an essential step in the transition from pure sense data to full blown conceptual apprehension.

In his principal work, the Collection on Valid Cognition (PS I, k5a-6cd; Hattori 1968, 27) Dignāga discusses what appear to be three distinct types of cognition under the rubric of perception: sense perception, mental perception, and perception of the yogi. Dignāga also admits self-awareness (svasaṃvedana) as a distinct type of cognition, although there is some debate about whether this is to be interpreted as a type of perception (see §7.2 for a discussion of svasaṃvedana). The disagreement centers on whether self-awareness should be understood as a dual aspect cognition (Nagatomi 1979) or as a new type of perception. Wayman (1991), following Hattori (1968), argues that it should, whereas Franco (1986, 1993) argues to the contrary. Franco bases his argument on a piece of textual evidence that appears to endorse the view that Dignāga takes the self-apprehension of internal states such as desire to be a case of mental perception. Drawing from the commentarial literature on Dignāga preserved in Chinese, Yao (2004) offers some compelling arguments as to why scholars, from traditional commentators such as Prajñākaragupta (ca. 800) to Franco appear to have consistently misunderstood the relationship between self-awareness and mental perception. Yao maintains that the resolution to the question of whether Dignāga does or does not accept four types of perception depends on correctly understanding the function of mental perception, which he takes to apply only to the direct apprehension of mental objects (2004, 63). Thus, for Yao mental perception (manasa-pratyakṣa) and the mental faculty of cognitive awareness (mano-vijñāna) are to be clearly differentiated, the first being just an aspect of the latter. Likewise, self-awareness and yogic perception too are taken to be just different states of this mental cognitive awareness (see Tillemans 1989; Steinkellner 1978, 1982, 1999; and Dunne 2006 for discussions of this issue).

Both Dignāga and Dharmakīrti take objects of perception to have causal efficacy (see e.g., PV III, 3). What is generally termed perception is said to consist in a series of distinct cognitive events that are causally related. On this model of perception, contact between sense and object gives rise to a perceptual image (ākāra) which represents the specific characteristics of that object. The relationship between the perceptual image and the empirical object is one of similarity (sādṛśya). The perceptual image is causally determined by the object, but the manner of its appearance is determined by factors that are intrinsic to cognition itself (see, e.g., PV III, 333–338). Although both Dignāga and Dharmakīrti appear to adopt an empirical standpoint in regards to the status of external objects, their analysis of perceptual aspects reflects an internalist epistemology that denies the ultimate reality of external objects (see PV III, 301–319; 333–341; and Dunne 2004, 84–91). Dharmakīrti's position regarding the reality of external objects is highly ambivalent depending on whether he operates from a Sautrāntika perspective, which admits the existence of external objects, or from a Yogācāra perspective, which denies their existence (for detailed discussions of this aspect of Dharmakīrti's thought see Dreyfus 1998, 83, 99; Dunne 2004, 53 and passim).

There is some dispute as to whether or not Dharmakīrti retains the causal model of perception in the case of internal objects. Thus, Dreyfus (1997, 336f) takes the view that Dharmakīrti is effectively compelled to admit that for a perceptual aspect to acquire cognitive status it must be interpreted. As such, it acquires the status of an internal mental representation, which Dreyfus claims to be “a highly unconfortable position” for Dharmakīrti given his commitment to the view that perception must be foundational for knowledge.

In examining Dharmakīrti’s causal model of perception, Dunne (2004, 100) singles out numerical correspondence as the main issue in establishing how perceptual images come to correspond to the material objects they represent: the perceptual image of the object is singular, but the object, as an extended entity, is made of an infinitesimal number of particles in accord with the atomistic ontology to which Dharmakīrti subscribes. Thus, identifying the precise causal mechanism by which percepts relate to their corresponding empirical objects is further complicated by Dharmakīrti’s view of particulars. In maintaining that particulars (svalakṣaṇa) are partless, Dharmakīrti is forced to admit that in perception we apprehend a particular in its entirely, something that of course is not borne by empirical data: ordinarily, in perceving a given object, say a dragonfly, we only perceive its visible parts from our unique vintage point; we do not perceive it in its entirety.

In the Commentary on Valid Cognition (PV III, 194–224) Dharmakīrti’s addresses the issue of whether perception is to be admited as having a conceptual aspect, thus as having determinate content, or we must instead admit that wholes and aggregated entities cannot be perceptually apprehended. Neither of these positions is accetable, for Dharmakīrti, as is well know, follows Dignāga in admiting only direct, non-conceptual types of cognitive awareness under the rubric of perception, and in rejecting the reality of wholes. Dunne notes that in rejecting these two positions, Dharmakīrti effectively undermines his antirealist critiques of the notion that perception can apprehend real aggregated objects (2004, 102). In response to the objections of his realist (chiefly the Naiyāyika) opponents that by admitting the perception of aggregates as unitary wholes, he is thus forced also to admit the perception of universals, Dharmakīrti replies that “aggregation” does not refer to the particular proper. Rather, it refers to a configuration of particles such that it can causally support the arising of a perceptual image without that image being in any way related to an external object that supervenes on those particles (see discussion of this issue in Dunne 2004, 103 and passim).

As we noted above, Dignāga and, following him, Dharmakīrti restrict perception to types of cognitive awareness that lack conceptual determination (kalpanāpoḍha). But even direct perception is not always warranted, given the possibility of perceptual illusions. For this reason, Dharmakīrti adds a further constraint, by admitting as reliable only those perceptions that lack conceptual determination and also are non-erroneous (abhrānta) (see Pramāṇaviniścaya I, 252). In fact, by adding the qualifier ‘non-erroneous’ Dharmakīrti is simply following an established tradition of excluding from perception instances of perceptual illusions of the sort produced by, say, the rapid rotation of a firebrand, or cases of sensory impairment as in cataracts. For perceptions to be reliable their object must be causally effective. The Buddhist epistemologist solves the problem of the efficacy of perceptions by adopting a representationalist stance: perception can only reveal its object by assuming its form. Thus, an intermediary realm of cognitive aspects (ākāra) is posited between perception and conception.

Attempts to define the nature of these cognitive aspects and their cognitive function are the origin of a lengthy dispute that cuts across doctrinal and scholastic boundaries. Thus Dignāga and Dharmakīrti follow the Sautrāntika and Yogācāra Buddhists who maintain that cognitive awareness has an aspectual character: that is, cognition takes the form of whatever object it cognizes (a position known as sākārāvāda). The Vaibhāṣikas and some Mādhyamikas take the opposite view: consciousness is mirror-like in its nature, reflecting an object without being modified by it (cf. Kajiyama 1965, 428; Moriyama 1984; Tillemans 1990, 41f). The representational model of cognition adopted by the epistemologists resembles Western variants of representationalism as proposed by, among others, Descartes and Locke.

For Dignāga and Dharmakīrti the apprehension of a resemblance (sādṛśya) between different objects, which marks the transition from an indistinct perceptual experience to a distinct cognitive awareness, is in itself a form of conceptual elaboration. In keeping with the Abhidharma traditions, the epistemologists admit that perception is mediated by our internal propensities as well as by the range of our perceptual systems. However, they do not accept the reality of resemblance relations, even though they admit that cognitive aspects (specifically those by which an object is apprehended) are pragmatically effective. A difficulty arises when attempting to explain extension in the case of empirical objects, which are apprehended by means of a cognitive aspect. This difficulty is overcome by adopting the Yogācāra perspective on the self-revealing (svaprakāśa) nature of cognitive awareness. On this perspective, each instance of cognitive awareness has a dual aspect: that of a subjective appearance (svābhāsa) and that of an objective appearance (viṣayābhāsa) (see Collection on Valid Cognition, PS I, k9a; Hattori 1968, 28). The subjective aspect (grāhakākāra) denotes the sense of intimation that accompanies each cognitive event, while the objective aspect (grāhyākāra) captures the intentional character of cognition or its object-directedness. This dual aspect theory of cognitive awareness endorses the existence of a meta-cognitive level of analysis, which explains why cognition does not happen “in the dark”; rather, it is always accompanied by self-intimation, by an experience of “what it is like” to be apprehending a given object (cf. Ganeri 1999).

7.3 Reflexive awareness and intentionality

Buddhist authors are divided on the issue of the possibility of reflective awareness (svasaṃvedana). In general, philosophers of the Dignāga-Dharmakīrti school accept the reality of reflective awareness in the classical Yogācāra sense of self-luminosity (svaprakāśa) and support their arguments with the example of a lamp that illuminates itself while at the same time revealing other objects. However, this notion that consciousness or cognitive awareness is self-reflective is rejected by Mādhyamika authors such as Candrakīrti (ca. 600–650) and Śāntideva (fl. 8th century), who contend that consciousness cannot be thought of as self-reflective, even on a conventional level, since that would imply that consciousness is self-validating (see e.g., Madhyamākavatāra VI, 74–75). Candrakīrti takes issue in particular with the characteristically Yogācāra view that the object of cognition is not extrinsic to cognition, but is an aspect of that cognition itself.

Those Buddhist who take consciousness to be reflexive are generally classified in the doxographical literature as Sākāravādins. Following Śāntarakṣita's Ornament of the Middle Way (Madhyamakālaṃkāra 11–92) five epistemological positions may be identified on the nature of consciousness and the subject-object relation (see Kajiyama 1968; 1978, 117–132; Blumenthal 2004, 91 and passim):

Sarvāstivāda dharmas, external objects, and mental representations are real;
Sautrāntika the external world exists but it is imperceptible; physical objects exist only as a support for cognition, which can only apprehend mental representations;
Satyākāravāda-Yogācāra cognition does not apprehend external objects but only perceptual and mental aspects, which are real modifications of the mental stream; cognition is inherently reflexive;
Alīkākāravāda-Yogācāra only the reality of reflexive awareness can be ascertained; that of cognitive aspects resulding from modifications in the mental stream cannot;
Madhyamaka neither reflexive awareness, nor internal cognitive aspects, nor external objects can in any way be established as possessing their characteristics intrinsically; all dharmas lack inherent existence.

It suffices to mention that the epistemologists, who adopt an ontological position that is most closely aligned with the Sautrāntikas take consciousness as being inherently reflexive and describe it not with the aid of mirror metaphors—consciousness as a mirror reflecting back the nature of perceived phenomena—but rather with plastic metaphors in which consciousness is said to assume the form of whatever object it cognizes.

It is generally agreed that the main argument for reflexive awareness is offered by Dignāga. As we saw above, Dignāga, following Vasubandhu, adopts the dual-aspect theory of cognition. Ultimately, the adoption of this theory reflects his commitment to an internalist epistemology, which he develops at length in his Investigation of the Cognitive Support. But unlike his Brahmanical opponents (chiefly the Naiyāyikas and the Mīmāṃsākas), Dignāga is also committed to the view that the instruments or sources of knowledge themselves (the pramāṇas) are not different from the ensuing cognitions (a view known as pramāṇa-vyavasthā or ‘the separation between the two sources of cognition’). This view is motivated, at least in part, by the a radical and essential separation of sensation from conception. For Dignāga, as for all Buddhist epistemologists, only perception can provide an empirical foundation and a neutral ground for ascertaining the nature of particulars (svalakṣaṇas).

Dignāga's views may be summarised as follows (after his Collection on Valid Cognition):

  1. The phenomenological content of a perceptual event is just the internal aspect (ākāra) of that cognitive awareness arising as the apprehension of external objects. The instrument or source of cognition (pramāṇa), in this case perception, is not different from the object apprehended. Rather, as Dignāga claims: “that which appears in cognition, is the known object (prameya), the reliable cognition (pramāṇa) and its result, are [respectively] the subjective aspects [of the cognition] and the cognition [itself]” (PS I, 10; Hattori 1968, 97).
  2. Each cognition arises having a double aspect: it appears as an apprehending subject and as an apprehended objected. In terms of its appearance to itself, cognition manifests as self-awareness (svasaṃvitti), which (as we saw above in §7.1) is one of the four modes of cognitive awareness under the rubric of perception.
  3. This subjective aspect of cognition (grāhakākāra) is just the individual's self-awareness as a cognizing agent, while the objective aspect (grāhyākāra) captures the intentional character of cognition or its object-directedness. Thus, for Dignāga, just as or Husserl, perception is ultimately constituted by intentional content.
  4. In its double aspect as (i) evidential ground for knowledge and as (ii) as a direct means for the apprehension of objects, perception is ultimately the only warranted type of cognitive awareness.

The epistemologists who follow Dignāga's account of perception thus agree that cognitive awareness is a self-revealing type of cognition. As such it accompanies (by virtue of arising together with) each perceptual event. And perception, specifically any type of perception lacking conceptual elaboration (kalpanāpoḍha), is associated with knowledge of particulars. It is precisely this aspect of Dignāga's theory of perception that is an object of criticism by Mādhyamika philosophers like Candrakīrti (see Madhyamākavatāra VI, 72–78), even if only indirectly: Candrakīrti's arguments target primarily the Yogācāra doctrine of three natures. As explained in works such as Vasubandhu's Trisvabhāvanirdeśa and Madhyāntavibhāgabhāṣya, the three natures or forms of existence are:

For the Yogācāras all phenomena and all aspects of the mental domain can be subsumed under these there natures (cf. Nagao 1991, 62 and passim). Similarly, Dignāga's understanding of direct perception (nirvikalpa-pratyakṣa) as lacking any conceptual elaboration captures the sense of the perfected nature.

An axiomatic principle of all Madhyamaka philosophy, following Nāgārjuna's Foundation of the Middle Way, is that all things, including all cognitive episodes, by virtue of being the product of cause and conditions, lack inherent existence (svabhāva) and are thus empty (śūnya). That is, nothing truly exits on its own, and no entity or mental state has its characteristics intrinsically. Candrakīrti's critique of reflexive awareness, then, targets this notion that there is a class of cognitive events that are essentially self-characterizing: they reveal their own content without recourse to an additional instance of cognitive awareness. More specifically, Candrakīrti rejects the notion that reflexive awareness has this unique property of giving access to the pure datum of experience (as Tillemans (1990: 49, n.109) observes, Candrakīrti does not seem to want to concede that there is a difference between ‘seeing’ and ‘seeing as,’ and rests his criticism of reflexivity on the notion that all seeing is in effect seeing as).

It is precisely with the intention of answering critics like Candrakīrti that Śāntarakṣita identifies the character of cognition as being contrary to insentient objects: “Cognitive awareness arises as something that is excluded from all insentient objects. This reflexive awareness of that cognition is none other than its non-insentience” (Tattvasaṃgraha 2000). In effect, Śāntarakṣita simply follows Dharmakīrti's critique of the materialist claim that consciousness arises from the four elements. Dharmakīrti rejects the materialist view on the grounds that if the four elements, or a special transformation thereof, are the ultimate basis of consciousness, then consciousness ought to arise whenever the elements occur, which is to say everywhere (see Prajñākagupta's PVBh ad II, 35; Franco 1997, 171f). Even if consciousness were said to arise at a particular point in time, claims Dhamakīrti, it cannot arise from something that it not sentient.

Similarly, Dharmottara, as an innovative interpreter of epistemologists’ account of the reflexive nature of awareness, clarifies the issue by invoking in his Commentary on Dharmakīrti's Drop of Reasoning (Nyāyabinduṭikā; hereafter NBṬ) the intentional character of cognition: what sets apart the occasioning of a cognitive event is that it accomplishes more that the causal process by which it arises allows for it—that is, it accomplishes its goal by revealing the object as the pragmatic outcome of cognition (NBṬ ad I, 1, 4.1). Dharmottara contrasts the intentional character of cognitive awareness with merely causal accounts of generation, such as is the case with seeds and sprouts: “Sprouts are not established [as the result] though their production is invariably concomitant with [causes like] seeds. Thus, even though a cognition arises as establishing a given object, it has the function of causing it to arrive at [its object] necessarily, by means of which its goal is accomplished.” (NBṬ ad I, 19, 14.21). Elsewhere, Dharmottara explains that the relation between cognition and object cognized is unlike that of elements in a causal chain, which exist as the relation between producer and produced. Rather, it is like the relation between the establishing factor and what it has established (vyavasthāpravyavasthāpakabhāva), that is, between reflexive awareness and the intentional object as intended (NBṬ ad I, 19, 15.3).

For the epistemologists, then, consciousness as reflexive awareness is not just another phenomenon in the chain of dependently arising phenomena: rather, it is precisely that which has the unique function of disclosing itself in the process of revealing the other. For as Dharmakīrti declares in the Ascertainment of Valid Cognition (PVin I, 55): “If ascertaining were not itself [directly] perceived, the perception of objects would not be established.”

The Indian Buddhist account of reflexive awareness has also been interpreted as corresponding to certain positions in Western philosophy. Thus, Paul Williams (1998, 234f) notes that Śāntarakṣita's assertion of the unity of consciousness as reflexive awareness goes against the sort of reductive explanation of cognition that discriminates between agent, act, and object or cognizer, cognized, and cognizable. As such, it parallels Aristotle's view of reflexivity as found in De Anima and, more recently, the views of Brentano and Sartre, who contend that to talk about consciousness as lacking self-intimation effectively amounts to altogether denying the possibility of conscious awareness itself [for a defense of the Madhyamaka critique of the notion of reflexive awareness, drawing primarily from the reception of this debate in Tibet see Garfield 2006]. Similarly, Arnold (2005a, 88; 2005b, 78) proposes that the Indian philosophical debates concerning the nature of svasaṃvedana, which he translates as apperception, parallel Kant's discussion of the transcendental unity of apperception, and indeed post-Kantian debates on the precise meaning of this doctrine. Contrasting Dharmakīrti's views on reflexive awareness with Husserl account of intentionality Dreyfus (2007, 109) argues for the notion that perception, at least in meditative states, displays something like a phenomenal type of intentionality. Recently, I have argued that Dignāga's understanding of reflexive awareness can be interpreted as being analogous to the notion of embodied self-awareness developed by Merleau-Ponty in his phenomenological account of perception (Coseru 2009b). On this view, the intentional character of reflexive awareness may be understood as corresponding to the immediate sense of embodied agency that is characteristic of internal states such as desire, pain, etc.


Given the voluminous number of works that discuss consciousness, intentionality, perception, and related topics, the following list is confined to those especially relevant to the present article. The list of primary sources includes translations, mostly into English, French, and German of the works cited or mentioned above. Several works listed in the secondary bibliography also include substantive translations from primary sources.

References in this article use the following abbreviations:

A. Primary Sources

B. Secondary Sources

Other Internet Resources

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Abhidharma | Asaṅga | Buddha | consciousness: and intentionality | consciousness: representational theories of | consciousness: unity of | Dharmakīrti | embodied | Madhyamaka | qualia | Yogācāra