Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to The Kyoto School

1. Japanese names are written here in the Japanese order of family name first, followed by given name. Exceptions are in the cases of authors such as Masao Abe (Abe Masao in Japanese) and D. T. Suzuki (Suzuki Daisetsu in Japanese) who write their given names first for their publications in Western languages.

2. Keeping in mind that all the Kyoto School thinkers drew inspiration from multiple religious traditions, it is nevertheless possible to see the School's generations of chair holders at Kyoto University as loosely alternating between primarily Zen Buddhism (Z) oriented thinkers and primarily Shin Buddhism (S) oriented thinkers: Nishida (Z); Tanabe (S); Hisamatsu Shinichi and Nishitani Keiji (Z); Takeuchi Yoshinori (S); Tsujimura Kôichi and Ueda Shizuteru (Z); Hase Shôtô and now Keta Masako (S).

3. Frederick Frank's edited volume, The Buddha Eye: An Anthology of the Kyoto School (1982), is often singled out for criticism in this regard. While the book certainly provides us with an important anthology of modern Japanese religious philosophy, it is misleading to portray the Shin Buddhist thinkers Kiyozawa Manshi and Soga Ryôjin, and the Zen master Kobori Sôhaku Nanrei, as members of the Kyoto School. D. T. Suzuki is also normally not included under strict definitions of the Kyoto School.

4. There are other shared pivotal ideas of the Kyoto School that could have been chosen. For example, one could focus on the search for a new logic: a logic of “the self-identity of absolute contradictories,” a “logic of soku-hi (is and is not),” or an “absolute dialectic.” Or one could focus on the idea of “self-awakening” or “self-awareness” (jikaku), which is not the self-consciousness of a subjective ego but rather a “seeing without a seer,” an “acting-intuition,” or the non-dualistic awareness of a “self that is not a self” (see Heisig 2001; and Davis 2002, 158ff.). Alternatively, one could focus on the manner in which many of the Kyoto School thinkers radically problematize the relation between “philosophy” and “religion,” that is to say, the way their thought calls into question accustomed ways of thinking the relation between reason and thought on the one hand, and experience, practice, and faith on the other (see Davis 2004b and 2006a). For the purposes of this article, however, I think it best to focus on what is generally accepted as the major philosophical thesis and theme of the Kyoto School: their idea, or rather ideas, of Absolute Nothingness.

5. Plato's highest Form, that of the Good, is said to be “beyond being” (see The Republic 509b). Plotinus interprets Plato's Good as “the One,” but for him this is not only beyond being, but also beyond all form as such. In this respect, at least, as well as in the idea that the soul too must become formless in order to return to this formless One beyond being, Plotinus' One is closer than Plato's Good to some of the Kyoto School's ideas of Absolute Nothingness (however, see section 3.4 below for Tanabe's critique of Nishida's alleged affinity with Plotinus, and for Nishida's response to this critique). The following comment by Paul Friedländer on the difference between Plotinus and Plato is revealing in this context: “That the Highest must be without form or shape, that the soul must become formless in order to comprehend it—there is nothing like this in Plato. … It never did or could enter the mind of Plato, a citizen of so form-conscious a world, to let the soul be dissolved in formlessness” (Friedländer 1969, 83).

6. Nishitani reportedly admitted much later in conversation with Graham Parkes that “the parallels between Nietzsche's thinking and his own run farther than he was prepared to allow in Religion and Nothingness” (Parkes 1996, 381). For my own treatment of Nishitani's sympathetic critique of Nietzsche, see Davis 2010b. For a defense of Heidegger from Nishitani's critique, and a reading that sees a great deal of harmony in their thoughts of Nothingness, see Dallmayr 1993.

7. A full explication of the different notions of śûnyatâ in the various schools of Mahâyâna philosophy, and an investigation into their relation to the Kyoto School's philosophies of Absolute Nothingness, are tasks that lie beyond the scope of this article. It would be fruitful to compare, for example, the early Nishida's philosophy of “pure experience” and his later philosophy of the enveloping place of Absolute Nothingness, not only with the Mâdhamaka stress on the emptiness of any self-subsistent “own-being” in individual entities, and hence the emptiness of linguistic concepts that inevitably isolate and reify and thus fail to grasp things, but also with the Yogâcâra idea of śûnyatâ as the emptiness of the subject/object distinction in the enlightened experience of the flow of dependent origination, and with the Tathâgatagarbha idea of śûnyatâ as the emptiness of defilements, that is, as an expression for the original purity of the Buddha-womb or Buddha-nature. For a good introduction to these Mahâyâna schools, see Williams 1989. For a good introduction to philosophical Daoism, see Moeller 2004. It should be noted, however, that Moeller critically downplays the Wang Bi metaphysical interpretation of the Daoist wu (according to which Nothingness is an infinite and ineffable source of finite beings), while it is this interpretive tradition that may have exerted a significant influence on at least the topological metaphysics of mu in Nishida's middle period writings. For a lucid and insightful introduction to the Mâdhamaka and Daoist philosophies of śûnyatâ and wu, and to their synthetic developments in the Zen tradition, see Kasulis 1981.

8. In his helpful remarks on the Eastern intellectual history behind the Kyoto School's idea of Absolute Nothingness, Whalen Lai writes: “Of the eighteen forms of śûnyatâ (emptiness) in Mahâyâna, two have captured the Chinese imagination more than the others: śûnyatâ-śûnyatâ (the emptiness of emptiness, a double negation that reaffirms the real); and atyanta-śûnyatâ … or ‘ultimate emptiness’. The latter is a total Emptiness all around, and in that sense, is a precursor to [the Kyoto School's] absolute nothingness” (Lai 1990, 258). Indeed, if the notion of atyanta-śûnyatâ can be seen as a precursor to its topological aspect, the notion of śûnyatâ-śûnyatâ can be understood to prefigure the dialectical and kenotic (self-emptying) aspect of the Kyoto School's Absolute Nothingness.

9. I hyphenate “in-finite” here to stress that the infinite Nothingness of the Dao is found only in the midst of the natural flow of finite things. Mahâyâna notions of śûnyatâ (as śûnyatâ-śûnyatâ) and the Kyoto School notions of Absolute Nothingness can be said to share this double sense of “in-finity.” In other words, the truly infinite is found only in the very midst of the finite.

10. Some scholars prefer to translate “basho” as “locus” or “topos.” Along with Plato's chora as the “receptacle of forms” (see Timaeus 49; NKZ IV, 209, 315; XI, 73) and Aristotle's soul as the “topos of forms” (see De Anima 429a.15; NKZ IV, 213), Nishida makes reference to Husserl's notions of “region” (Region) and the “field of consciousness” (Bewusstseinsfeld) in working out his own idea of place (basho) (see NKZ IV, 210). Since for Nishida the place of Absolute Nothingness completely enfolds both subjective (noetic) and objective (noematic) polarities, he comes to view Husserl's phenomenological notion of the Region as implying only its noetic aspect (see NKZ V: 237). For a detailed account of these and other philosophical sources that Nishida critically appropriated when developing his logic of basho, see Jacinto 2001.

11. An English translation of key sections of "Basho" is forthcoming in Heisig/Kasulis/Maraldo. For a German translation, see Elberfeld 1999. For studies of Nishida's philosophy in English, see Carter 1997, Wargo 2005, and Wilkinson 2009.

12. On the question of whether Nishida's philosophy of “self-awareness” precludes a genuine relationship with the interpersonal other, see Heisig 2001, 82–83; and Davis 2002, 158ff.

13. More recently, Masao Abe has been an outspoken proponent of the idea of the kenosis or “self-emptying” of God as Absolute Nothingness. While Abe inherits this interpretation of kenosis from Nishida and Nishitani (see NKZ XI, 398–99; NKC X, 65; Nishitani 1982, 59), he provocatively develops it in dialogue and debate with leading Western theologians and philosophers of religion (see Cobb/Ives 1990; Ives 1995; and Davis 2005).

14. Takeuchi Yoshinori understands Tanabe's thought to have gone through three transitions with regard to the question of the relation of philosophy to religion (see Takeuchi 1999, Vol. 5, 47–65). According to James Heisig's explication, Takeuchi “lays out three patterns for the philosophy of religion: a clear separation of the religious experience from philosophical reflection, the pursuit of a kind of thinking which sees philosophical thinking as at the same time belonging to religious experience, and the search for a unity in the tension between these two positions. These three patterns are then shown to represent transitions in Tanabe's own philosophy” (Heisig 2001, 324–25).

15. On Nishitani's three-field topology of the step back through nihilism, see Davis 2004a, 155ff.

16. In an uncharacteristic mistranslation Arisaka renders the phrase “our world” as “the world,” giving the passage a far more ethnocentric meaning (see Arisaka 1999, 242).

17. In other words, Nishida would be accused of promulgating a Japanese version of what Derrida criticizes as the “logic of the example” used by Eurocentric universalists such as Husserl, where Europe is the particular that reveals the universal, the example that manifests the rule (see Derrida 1992).

18. It should be kept in mind that both of these assertions mirror ones frequently made in “the West,” which has—as Edward Said and other critics of “Orientalism” have demonstrated—maintained its own identity and sense of superiority in large part by positing an ultimately degrading image of its “Other” as “the East” or “the Orient” (see Said 1978 and 1993). The idea that one culture can provide the place for all cultures to progress towards is found, for example, in the claim that American style liberal democracy and free-market capitalism mark the teleological “end of history” (see Fukuyama 1992). It is also found in the claim that the true evolution of society lies in finishing the “unfinished project of [Western] modernity,” which involves articulating universal rules of discourse for communication between cultures (Habermas 1979). It is also paradoxically found in the claim that “unity in diversity,” not imperialistic hegemony, is the “true heritage of Europe,” a heritage that needs to be “spread to all cultures around the world” (Gadamer 1989; also see Gadamer's statement quoted in Dallmayr 1996, xiii).

19. It is hardly surprising that Heidegger would show a keen interest in East Asian thought, given that he wished to think that (i.e., das Nichts) which he felt was unthinkable within the Western tradition of philosophy as onto-theology.