#### Supplement to The Problem of Induction

## Two Lemmata

### Lemma 1

IfXis a large finite population in which the relative frequency of a characterRisr, it is necessarily true that the relative frequency ofRin most large samples from that population will be close tor.

Here is a simple example of a special but not atypical case of lemma
1. Let *X* be a large population of balls, red and black, in
which the proportion of red balls is *r*. Let *q* = 1
− *r*. Now consider sequences of length *k*
(‘*k*-sequences’) of draws from *X*.
Assume *X* to be large enough, and large enough in comparison
to *k*, that draws without replacement are approximated by
draws with replacement. Then for each *m* between zero
and *k* inclusive the proportion of *k*-sequences
with *m* reds and *k* − *m* blacks is

f_{k}(m) =( km) r^{m}q^{(k−m)}

The mean of this distribution is at *m* = *r* and its
standard deviation is √(*r**q*/*k*). The
proportion of *k*-sequences from *X* in which the
relative frequency of Red differs from *r* by more than a small
positive quantity ε (we say that such
samples *resemble* the population *X*) is always
exceeded by

rq/kε

When ε is appropriately fixed, sample size *k*
is large and *r* is close to neither zero nor one, this quantity is very small. Hence most
samples of size *k* will resemble *X* with respect to
the relative frequency of Red.

### Lemma 2: The proportional syllogism

When probability is symmetrical the probability that an individual in a finite population has a traitRis equal to the relative frequency of that trait in the population. (Proved in Carnap LFP, 495)

We can sketch a proof of a very simple special case of the
proportional syllogism in the finite single-predicate
language *L* of the entry on
interpretations of probability
and section 5.1.1 (of the main
entry). Think in particular as above of sequences of draws with
replacement from an urn containing red and black (= not red) balls. If
1, 2, … *k* are the distinct individual constants
of *L*, there are then 2^{k} state
descriptions of the form:

R′_{1}∧R′_{2}∧ … ∧R′_{k}

where each *R*′_{i} is either Red or
Black.

To keep things really simple, and for the present example only, we
look at the language *L*_{3} in which there are just
three individual constants, 1, 2, and 3. There are just eight state
descriptions in *L*_{3}, just four possible absolute
frequencies of *R* (numbers of unnegated
sentences *R*′_{i} in a state
description) 0, 1, 2 and 3, and four corresponding relative
frequencies of *R*: 0, 1/3, 2/3 and 1.

The statements of relative frequency in *L*_{3} are
structure descriptions of *L*_{3}; disjunctions of
isomorphic state descriptions. Let ‘*f*(*R*
| *X*) = *r*’ stand for the structure description
in each state description of which the proportion (1
− *r*) of *R*s is negated. Thus, for
example, *f*(*R* | *X*) = 1/3 is:

(R_{1}∧ ¬R_{2}∧ ¬R_{3}) ∨ (¬R_{1}∧R_{2}∧ ¬R_{3}) ∨ (¬R_{1}∧ ¬R_{2}∧R_{3})

Now let *c* (with associated *m*) be a symmetrical
probability (*c*-function) on the sentences
of *L*_{3}. Symmetry assures
that *c*[*R*_{i}
| *f*(*R* | *X*) = 1/3] is constant for i = 1, 2,
3 so we can calculate just one of
these, *c*[*R*_{1} | *f*(*R*
| *X*) = 1/3], and infer that the others are equal to it. There
are four cases, one for each frequency. Here we prove the case

c[R_{1}|f(R|X) = 1/3] = 1/3

the other cases are analogous.

(1)c[R_{1}|f(R|X)=1/3]

= m{R_{1}∧ [f(R|X) = 1/3]} /m[f(R|X) = 1/3]= m[R_{1}∧ (R_{1}∧ ¬R_{2}∧ ¬R_{3})] /m[f(R|X) = 1/3]= m(R_{1}∧ ¬R_{2}∧ ¬R_{3}) /m[f(R|X) = 1/3]

Symmetry implies that

(2)m(R_{1}∧¬R_{2}∧¬R_{}3) = 1/3m[f(R|X) = 1/3]

Therefore,

(3)c[R_{1}|f(R|X) = 1/3]

= (1/3) m[f(R|X) = 1/3] /m[f(R|X) = 1/3]= 1/3

And, again by symmetry, for each *i* = 1, 2, 3

(4)c[R_{i}|f(R|X) = 1/3]

= (1/3) m[f(R|X) = 1/3] /m[f(R|X) = 1/3]= 1/3

If *c* is a symmetrical probability defined on sentences of
the language *L*_{3}, then for each
individual *i*, and each relative frequency *r*
of *R* in state descriptions of *L*_{3},

c[R_{i}|f(R|X) =r] =r

The proof of the general case depends on the same principles.

Lemma 1 depends upon the substantive assumption of symmetry. That this is essential to the argument is evident in the equality:

m(R_{1}∧¬R_{2}∧¬R_{3}) =m(¬R_{1}∧R_{2}∧ ¬R_{3}) =m(¬R_{1}∧ ¬R_{2}∧R_{3})

which is essential to establishing that

m[R_{1}∧f(R|X) = 1/3]= m(R_{1}∧ ¬R_{2}∧ ¬R_{3})= (1/3) m(f(R|X) = 1/3)