Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to The Problem of Induction

Two Lemmata

Lemma 1

If X is a large finite population in which the relative frequency of a character R is r, it is necessarily true that the relative frequency of R in most large samples from that population will be close to r.

Here is a simple example of a special but not atypical case of lemma 1. Let X be a large population of balls, red and black, in which the proportion of red balls is r. Let q = 1 − r. Now consider sequences of length k (‘k-sequences’) of draws from X. Assume X to be large enough, and large enough in comparison to k, that draws without replacement are approximated by draws with replacement. Then for each m between zero and k inclusive the proportion of k-sequences with m reds and km blacks is

fk(m) = ( k
) rmq(km)

The mean of this distribution is at m = r and its standard deviation is √(rq/k). The proportion of k-sequences from X in which the relative frequency of Red differs from r by more than a small positive quantity ε (we say that such samples resemble the population X) is always exceeded by


When ε is appropriately fixed, sample size k is large and r is close to neither zero nor one, this quantity is very small. Hence most samples of size k will resemble X with respect to the relative frequency of Red.

Lemma 2: The proportional syllogism

When probability is symmetrical the probability that an individual in a finite population has a trait R is equal to the relative frequency of that trait in the population. (Proved in Carnap LFP, 495)

We can sketch a proof of a very simple special case of the proportional syllogism in the finite single-predicate language L of the entry on interpretations of probability and section 5.1.1 (of the main entry). Think in particular as above of sequences of draws with replacement from an urn containing red and black (= not red) balls. If 1, 2, … k are the distinct individual constants of L, there are then 2k state descriptions of the form:

R1R2 ∧ … ∧ Rk

where each Ri is either Red or Black.

To keep things really simple, and for the present example only, we look at the language L3 in which there are just three individual constants, 1, 2, and 3. There are just eight state descriptions in L3, just four possible absolute frequencies of R (numbers of unnegated sentences Ri in a state description) 0, 1, 2 and 3, and four corresponding relative frequencies of R: 0, 1/3, 2/3 and 1.

The statements of relative frequency in L3 are structure descriptions of L3; disjunctions of isomorphic state descriptions. Let ‘f(R | X) = r’ stand for the structure description in each state description of which the proportion (1 − r) of Rs is negated. Thus, for example, f(R | X) = 1/3 is:

(R1 ∧ ¬R2 ∧ ¬R3) ∨ (¬R1R2 ∧ ¬R3) ∨ (¬R1 ∧ ¬R2R3)

Now let c (with associated m) be a symmetrical probability (c-function) on the sentences of L3. Symmetry assures that c[Ri | f(R | X) = 1/3] is constant for i = 1, 2, 3 so we can calculate just one of these, c[R1 | f(R | X) = 1/3], and infer that the others are equal to it. There are four cases, one for each frequency. Here we prove the case

c[R1 | f(R | X) = 1/3] = 1/3

the other cases are analogous.

(1) c[R1 | f(R | X)=1/3]
    = m{R1 ∧ [f(R | X) = 1/3]} / m[f(R | X) = 1/3]
    = m[R1 ∧ (R1 ∧ ¬R2 ∧ ¬R3)] / m[f(R | X) = 1/3]
    = m(R1 ∧ ¬R2 ∧ ¬R3) / m[f(R | X) = 1/3]

Symmetry implies that

(2) m(R1 ∧¬R2 ∧¬R3) = 1/3m[f(R | X) = 1/3]


(3) c[R1 | f(R | X) = 1/3]
    = (1/3) m[f(R | X) = 1/3] / m[f(R | X) = 1/3]
    = 1/3

And, again by symmetry, for each i = 1, 2, 3

(4) c[Ri | f(R | X) = 1/3]
    = (1/3) m[f(R | X) = 1/3] / m[f(R | X) = 1/3]
    = 1/3

If c is a symmetrical probability defined on sentences of the language L3, then for each individual i, and each relative frequency r of R in state descriptions of L3,

c [Ri | f(R | X) = r] = r

The proof of the general case depends on the same principles.

Lemma 1 depends upon the substantive assumption of symmetry. That this is essential to the argument is evident in the equality:

m(R1 ∧¬ R2 ∧¬R3) = mR1R2 ∧ ¬R3) = mR1 ∧ ¬R2R3)

which is essential to establishing that

m[R1f(R | X) = 1/3] = m(R1 ∧ ¬R2 ∧ ¬R3)
= (1/3)m(f(R | X) = 1/3)