Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to God and Other Necessary Beings

1. The sort of necessity I have in mind here and throughout is necessity of the metaphysical or broadly logical sort (see Plantinga 1974a).

2. Unless otherwise specified, the abstract objects of which I speak in this essay are of the sort that exist necessarily (as opposed to, say, sets with contingent members).

3. There is some possible nuance in the Cartesian position I ignore here. In particular, it might be claimed not that what it “necessarily true” could have been false on Descartes picture, but that what's necessarily true isn't necessarily necessarily true. See Plantinga (1980) for discussion of this.

4. See Plantinga (1980), Stump and Kretzmann (1985), Mann (1982), and Wolterstorff (1991).

5. See also Zagzebski (1990).

6. This is the sort of account that Thomas Morris and Christopher Menzel adopt, and they are the foremost contemporary proponents of the view that abstract objects depend on God. See Morris (1987a, ch. 7) and Menzel (1990).

7. See Morris 1987a, p. 184.

8. Or, we might make sense of the claim that a proposition depends on its constituents in the same sort of manner, if its constituents are properties, relations, and the like.

9. Necessarily, a property p is an individual essence iff (a) it is possible that p is exemplified; and (b) Necessarily, if there is an x that exemplifies p, then (i) Necessarily, if x exists, x exemplifies p and (ii) Necessarily, if there is a y which exemplifies p, then x = y.