Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Frege's Logic, Theorem, and Foundations for Arithmetic

Proof of the Law of Extensions

[Note: We use εF to denote the extension of the concept F.]

We want to show, for an arbitrarily chosen concept P and an arbitrarily chosen object c, that c ∈ εPPc.

(→) Assume c ∈ εP (to show Pc). Then, by the definition of ∈, it follows that

HP = εH & Hc)

Suppose that Q is such a property. Then, we know

εP = εQ & Qc

But, by Basic Law V, the first conjunct implies ∀x(PxQx). So from the fact that Qc, it follows that Pc.

(←) Assume Pc (to show c ∈ εP). Then, by the Existence of Extensions principle, P has an extension, namely, εP. So by the laws of identity, we know εP = εP. We may conjoin this with our assumption to conclude

εP = εP & Pc

Now by existential generalizing on the concept P, it follows that

HP = εH & Hc)

Thus, by the definition of ∈, it follows that c ∈ εP.