Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Frege's Logic, Theorem, and Foundations for Arithmetic

First Derivation of the Contradiction

[Note: We use εF to denote the extension of the concept F. We use the expression ‘FG)’ to more clearly express the fact that the extension of the concept G falls under F.]

The λ-expression which denotes the concept being the extension of a concept which you don't fall under is

xF(x = εF & ¬Fx)]

As we saw in the text, we know that such a concept as this exists, by the Comprehension Principle for Concepts. Let ‘P’ abbreviate this name of the concept. So εP exists, by the Existence of Extensions principle. Now suppose PP), i.e., suppose

xF(x = εF & ¬Fx)](εP)

Then, by the principle of λ-conversion, it follows that

FP = εF & ¬FP)]

Let H be an arbitrary such concept. So we know the following about H

εP = εH & ¬HP)

Now given Law V, it follows from the first conjunct that ∀x(PxHx). So since ¬HP), it follows that ¬PP), contrary to hypothesis.

So then suppose ¬PP). Then, again by λ-conversion, we know

¬∃FP = εF & ¬FP)],


FP = εFFP)]

But by instantiating this universal claim to P, it follows from the self-identity of εP that PP), contrary to hypothesis.