Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Disjunction

1. We might formalize this "generalized" version of exclusive disjunction as a prefix quantifier that can range over any number of formulae, and is true if and only if exactly one of the formulae within its scope is true. This "quantifier exclusive-or" is certainly not the only option (contra McCawley [1978], 128–130) available to someone who seeks a semantic account of exclusive disjunction in natural language, and who wants merely to account for lists with more than two "exclusive disjuncts" in a way that avoids the "odd counting" feature of formulae composed exclusively of 0110 disjunctions. On this criterion, another suitable candidate is the truth function sometimes called ternary exclusive or. Ternary exclusive or may be thought of as the ternary instantiation of our quantifier exclusive-or; it takes three inputs and is true if and only if exactly one of them is true. Post's functional completeness theorem (Post [1941], and see also Pelletier and Martin [1990]) suggests that it is possible to define an n-ary "exactly one" quantifier for every n in terms only of compositions of ternary exclusive ors; and one such definition is offered in Pelletier and Hartline [2008].