Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Contradiction

1. Leibniz regarded the Law of Identity (“Everything is what it is”, i.e. A=A or "∀x(x=x)) as a more basic formulation than the Law of Non-Contradiction because the former is an affirmative principle while the latter, which rules out an A which is not an A, can only be the most basic of the negative truths. Leibniz's assumption that LNC can be derived from the Law of Identity is not generally accepted.

2. One may reject the basic criterion of contradictory opposition, viz. “that the denial is false whenever the affirmation is true, and the affirmation is false whenever the denial is true”, believing instead “that all speak alike falsely and truly”. But such a man, however noble and generous his spirit, “can neither speak nor mean anything”: “If he has no belief of anything, how would he differ from a plant?” (Metaphysics 1008a35-b12). Some of the argumentation in Metaphysics Gamma can be—and has been—questioned (Barnes 1969; cf. also Dialetheism). Lukasiewicz, for one, sought to show that LNC does not have the primacy it receives in the Metaphysics; its value, he submits, is not “logical” but “ethical”, serving as “a weapon against error and falsehood”, and in particular as a useful tool for a defendant seeking to establish his innocence in a criminal proceeding (Lukasiewicz 1910/1971: 508). Even this lukewarm endorsement of LNC would be rejected by skeptics, neo-Sophists, and others who have chosen (out of perversity or error, Aristotle would insist) to march to the beat of a different drummer. Some of the arguments of these conscientious objectors to the LNC are surveyed below.

3. For Aristotle, even terms like “green” and “non-green” would not be in contradictory opposition; as with “sick” and “well” discussed in the text below, neither of the two terms applies to non-existent objects and neither applies to those not falling naturally within the range of objects that can be colored (e.g. to abstract concepts). Santa Claus and sincerity are neither green nor non-green, which entails that the terms are contrary and not contradictory opposites.

4. The rejection of LEM cannot take the form of ¬(Φ ∨ ¬Φ), since this amounts by the usual De Morgan equivalence to the conjunction (¬Φ & ¬¬Φ), which in turn by LDN reduces to (¬Φ & Φ), a direct rejection of the LNC. A rejection of LEM should be understood instead as a denial that LEM is necessary, i.e. as a negation of (3b) below; no violation of LNC thereby ensues.

5. And allowing, as well, its own group of dissenters, including Kierkegaard, for whom Christ both is a man and is not a man (at the same time, and presumably in the same respect). Yet this proposition can only constitute the serious paradox Kierkegaard intends if LNC is generally valid.

6. Matters are not quite so simple. On some versions of dialetheism (e.g. Priest 1998) the LNC is not necessarily repudiated as such, given the distinction between the denial of a proposition and the assertion of its negation. Strictly speaking, we can accept every statement reducible to the form ¬(Φ & ¬Φ) and thereby affirm a version of the LNC, while at the same time accepting some (although of course not all) contradictions of the form (Φ & ¬Φ). (I am indebted to an anonymous reader for clarifying this point.)

7. For example: “The property of true and the property of false, which are contradictory, could not apply to one and the same thing” (Kumarila, Mîmâmsâ 16.43ab).

8. Cf. Balcerowicz 2003 for a parallel point concerning the status of LNC and LEM in Jaina logic.