Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Bernard Bolzano

A Formal Reconstruction of Bolzano's Definitions of Logical Truth and Logical Consequence

Bolzano's Method of Idea-Variation

The formal basis of Bolzano's operation of idea-variation is a function which assigns — under certain conditions — to each proposition s, each sequence i of ideas i1, i2,…, in, and each sequence j of ideas j1, j2,…, jn a proposition s'; s' thereby results from s by replacing simultaneously and uniformly in s, for each k (1 ≤ kn), the idea ik with the corresponding idea jk. We will call s′ the ‘j/i-variant of s’ and use for it the notation ‘s(j/i)’. The following conditions must be fulfilled in order that s(j/i) is defined:

  1. Each of the iks (1 ≤ kn) must be simple (whereas the jks need not be simple). Since only for a few examples of ideas we know that Bolzano takes them to be simple, we must, at least for practical purposes, opt for the weaker requirement that the iks are “relatively” simple in the sense that in each particular context under consideration they are not further analyzed into parts but “taken” to be simple.
  2. None of the iks is a purely logical idea such as [to have] (or [to be]), [non] or [something] (whereas the jks can be purely logical).
  3. The iks are pair-wise distinct (whereas the jks need not be).
  4. Moreover, in order to keep the result of the replacement operation “well-formed”, i.e., a genuine proposition, we must require that each jk “fits” the corresponding ik, i.e., is of the same semantic category. (What it means that two ideas belong to the same semantic category is not precisely defined by Bolzano.)
  5. Finally, we must also require that at least one of the ideas ik must be contained in s as one of its parts so that the operation of replacement is never performed vacuously. (This requirement serves the purpose to avoid the usual stipulation that every j/i-variant of a proposition s is identical with s itself if none of the iks is contained in s; this stipulation has consequences that are incompatible with Bolzano's views.)

We will now define several auxiliary concepts:

A proposition s′ is an i-variant of a proposition s  =df
    ∃j(s′ = s(j/i)).

The form of a proposition s with respect to a sequence i of ideas (‘FP(s, i)’) is the set of all i-variants of s, i.e.,

FP(s, i)  =df  {s′ | ∃j(s′ = s(j/i))}.

By derelativization we get the more general concepts of a propositional i-form and of a propositional form:

F is a propositional i-form (‘P(F, i)’)  =df  ∃s(F = FP(s, i)).

F is a propositional form (‘P(F)’)  =df  ∃i(P(F, i)).

Intuitively, the form of a particular proposition s with respect to a sequence i of ideas seems to be a kind of property rather than a set of entities and should therefore be indicated more adequately by an open formula. An open formula, however, has no designatum. This was presumably the motive for Bolzano's quite modern view to identify the form of s with respect to i with a precisely specified object, namely the set of propositions that is characterized by our aforementioned definition.

Instead of saying that a j/i-variant of a proposition s is true (or that it is a true variant of s), Bolzano prefers to say: j macht s hinsichtlich i wahr, i.e.: j verifies s with respect to i (or, more literally: j makes s true with respect to i). In today's terminology this amounts to saying that s(j/i) is a model of s with respect to i. Let us abbreviate ‘proposition s is true’ by ‘Ts’, and ‘j verifies s with respect to i’ by ‘MT(j, s, i)’; we can then define:

MT(j, s, i)  =df  Ts(j/i).

We will now define first what it means for a propositional form to be universally valid (or contravalid), and then explain — by means of this concept — corresponding properties of single propositions. In addition to the symbols already introduced, we will use in what follows also ‘Es’ for ‘the subject idea of s is empty’. We will say — with Bolzano — of a propositional form that it is universally valid just in case all of its members are true. Hereby we have to keep in mind that in his analysis of the expressions ‘all’ and ‘every’ of the object language, Bolzano uses these expressions also in his metalanguage with existential import. The definition has thus to be stated formally in the following way:

A propositional form F is universally valid (‘UV(F)’)  =df
    ∃s(sFTs) ∧ ∀s((sF ∧ ¬Es) → Ts).

We could replace the first conjunct of the definiens by ∃s(sF ∧ ¬Es). In order to formulate our definitions uniformly and keep them close to Bolzano's own words, we choose the alternative version.

A propositional form F is universally contravalid
    (‘UC(F)’)  =df  ∀s(sF → ¬Ts).

A proposition s is universally valid with respect to i
    (‘UV(s,i)’)  =df  ∃F(P(F,i) ∧ UV(F) ∧ sF).

A proposition s is universally contravalid with respect to i
    (‘UC(s,i)’)  =df  ∃F(P(F,i) ∧ UC(F) ∧ sF).

A proposition s is analytic with respect to i
    (‘Analytic(s,i)’)  =df  UV(s,i) ∨ UC(s,i).

A proposition s is synthetic with respect to i
    (‘Synthetic(s,i)’)  =df  ¬Analytic(s,i).

A proposition s is analytic =df  ∃i(Analytic(s, i)).

A proposition s is synthetic  =df  ∃i(Synthetic(s,i)).

Bolzano's Definition of Logical Truth

From a logical point of view, the most interesting results will turn up if all extra-logical parts of a proposition, which are simple (or — as explained before — “relatively” simple), are taken to be variable (WL II, 84). This restriction results in the concept of the logical form of a proposition: The logical form of a proposition s (‘LFP(s)’) is the set of all propositions which result from it when all of its non-logical simple parts are replaced by arbitrary but “fitting” ideas. To simplify matters, we will assume for what follows that for any proposition s there is always fixed a certain alphabetic order of all extra-logical simple ideas contained in it; thereby, for every proposition s, a sequence is of all extra-logical ideas contained in s is uniquely determined. We can then define:

LFP(s)  =df  FP(s, is), i.e. {s′ | ∃j(s′ = s(j/is))}.

A logical propositional form is a set of propositions which is the logical form of a proposition:

F is a logical propositional form (‘LP(F)’)  =df 
    ∃s(F = LFP(s)).

Another way to characterize a logical propositional form is to say that it is a propositional form such that every idea contained in any of its members is purely logical in nature. This results in the following alternative definition of a logical propositional form:

F is a logical propositional form (‘LP(F)’)  =df  P(F) ∧
    ∀i(∀s(sF → i ∈ Content(s)) → i is purely logical).

If a propositional form is a logical propositional form and all of its members are true, provided their subject idea is non-empty, Bolzano will say that it is logico-universally valid or (put briefly) logically valid.

A propositional form F is logically valid (‘LV(F)’)  =df 
   LP(F) ∧ UV(F).
A propositional form F is logically contravalid (‘LC(F)’)  =df 
    LP(F) ∧ UC(F).

By means of these definitions of properties of a propositional form we can now define the corresponding properties of a single proposition:

A proposition s is logically true (‘LT(s)’)  =df 
    ∃F(P(F) ∧ LV(F) ∧ sF).
A proposition s is logically false (‘LF(s)’)  =df 
    ∃F(P(F) ∧ LC(F) ∧ sF).
A proposition s is logically analytic (‘LA(s)’)  =df 
    LT(s) ∨ LF(s).
A proposition s is logically synthetic (‘LS(s)’)  =df 

We have already come to know an example of each of these kinds of propositions such as the logically true proposition [Kant is German or non-German], the logically false proposition [Kant is German and non-German], and the logically synthetic proposition [Kant is a German philosopher].

This reconstruction gives priority to the logical validity of a propositional form and defines by means of it the logical truth and related properties of a proposition. If — as in the majority of reconstructions — a logically true proposition is directly defined as a proposition s all of whose logical variants (i.e., all of its variants with respect to is) are true (provided their subject idea is non-empty), we get a problem with purely logical propositions. A proposition is purely logical if all of its parts are purely logical. Examples of purely logical propositions are the following ones: [There is something], [There is something or there is nothing], [There is something and there is nothing], i.e. in the language of first order quantification theory with identity, [∃x(x = x)], [∃x(x = x) ∨ ¬∃x(x = x)], and [∃x(x = x) ∧ ¬∃x(x = x)].

Since each part of such a proposition is of a purely logical nature, no part of such a proposition could be replaced by means of the variation method due to qualification ii; and due to qualification v the operation of idea-variation is not even defined for such cases. If we would give up qualification v, each of these propositions would be its own only variant. If it is true (such as [∃x(x = x) ∨ ¬∃x(x = x)]), it will therefore be logically true, if false (such as [∃x(x = x) ∧ ¬∃x(x = x)]), it will be logically false. What, however, about [∃x(x = x)]? Since it is obviously true, it had to be logically true — contrary not only to our intuition but also to Bolzano's view, according to which it is a truth of logic but not a logical truth (WL II, 375). This is also the result of the reconstruction presented here: [There is something] is a true purely logical proposition, but not a logically true proposition; rather, it is a synthetic proposition. (The same result can be reached within the traditional reconstruction by regarding [something] as not purely logical in nature; this, however, would be in clear contradiction to Bolzano.)

Bolzano's Definition of Material Consequence and of Logical Consequence

We have explained Bolzano's method of idea-variation above (as well as in Section 4.6 of the main text) with respect to single propositions. In order to apply it also to arguments, we have now to extend our original definitions to whole sets of propositions. In applying the operation of variation to a set σ of propositions, each member of σ is replaced by its corresponding variant; this turns σ into another set σ(j/i), i.e., the j/i-variant of σ, that can be defined as follows:

σ(j/i)  =df  {s′ | ∃s(s ∈ σ ∧ s′ = s(j/i))}.

We will say of a set of propositions that it is true iff all of its members are true:

σ is true (‘Tσ’)  =df  ∃s(s ∈ σ ∧ Ts) ∧ ∀s(s ∈ σ → Ts).

Thus we can say — by analogy to single propositions — also for a whole set σ of propositions that it is verified (or “made true”) by a sequence j of ideas with respect to another sequence i of ideas:

MT(j, σ, i)  =df 
    Tσ(j/i), i.e., ∃s(s ∈ σ ∧ Ts(j/i)) ∧∀s(s ∈ σ → Ts(j/i)).

Analogously to the form and the logical form of a single proposition, the form and the logical form of a set of propositions can be defined as follows:

The i-form of a set σ of propositions (i.e., the form of σ with respect to a sequence i of which at least one is contained in at least one member of σ, briefly: ‘FS(σ, i)’) is the set of all i-variants of σ, i.e.,
    FS(σ, i)  =df  {σ′ | ∃j(σ′ = σ(j/i))}.
F is a form of a set of propositions with respect to i (‘S(F, i)’) iff for some set of propositions σ, F is the i-form of σ, i.e.,
    S(F, i)  =df  ∃σ(F = FS(σ, i)).
F is a form of a set of propositions (‘S(F)’) iff for some i, F is a form of a set of propositions with respect to i, i.e.,
    S(F)  =df  ∃i(S(F, i)).
The logical form of σ (‘LS(σ)’) is the iσ-form of σ (where iσ is the — alphabetically ordered — sequence of all extra-logical simple ideas contained in the members of σ), i.e.,
    LS(σ)  =df  S(σ, iσ).

The form and the logical form of an argument can then be defined as follows:

The j/i-variant of an argument <σ, s> (‘<σ, s>(j/i)’) is the argument <σ′, s′>, where σ′ is the j/i-variant of σ and s′ is the j/i-variant of s, i.e.,
    <σ, s>(j/i)  =df  <σ(j/i), s(j/i)>.
<σ′, s′> is an i-variant of an argument <σ, s> iff <σ′, s′> is a j/i-variant of <σ, s> for some sequence j, i.e.,
    <σ′, s′> is an i-variant of an argument <σ, s>  =df 
        ∃j(σ′ = σ(j/i) ∧ s′ = s(j/i))
The i-form of an argument <σ, s> (‘FA(<σ, s>, i)’) is the set of all of its i-variants, i.e.,
    FA(<σ, s>, i)  =df  {<σ′, s′> | ∃j(σ′ = σ(j/i) ∧ s′ = s(j/i))}.
F is an i-form of an argument (‘A(F, i)’)  =df  there is a set of propositions σ and a proposition s such that F is the i-form of the argument <σ, s>, i.e.,
    A(F, i)  =df  ∃σ∃s(F = FA(<σ, s>, i)).

Correspondingly, an argument form is an i-form of at least one argument for at least one sequence i of ideas:

F is an argument form (‘A(F)’)  =df  ∃i(A(F, i)).

An argument form F is deductively correct (‘D(F)’) iff each of its members is such that if all of its premises are true then its conclusion is likewise true, i.e., formally (keeping in mind the existential import of ‘each’, ‘every’ and ‘all’):

D(F)  =df 
    ∃σ∃s(<σ, s> ∈ FTσ) ∧ ∀σ∀s((<σ, s> ∈ FTσ) → Ts).

The first conjunct of the definiens of this definition guarantees that, in order for an argument to be a member of a deductively correct argument form (and to be deductively correct itself), the set of its premises must be satisfiable or (semantically) consistent. The set of premises of such an argument must therefore be compatible with its conclusion. Consequently, Bolzano treats (logical) consequence as a special case of (logical) compatibility (WL II, 113, 475). This, again, is typical for Bolzano's approach in which the words ‘each’, ‘every’ and ‘all’ have existential import also in the meta-language.

An argument form F is deductively correct with respect to a sequence i of ideas (‘D(F, i)’) iff F is an i-form of an argument, and F is deductively correct:

D(F, i)  =df  A(F, i) ∧ D(F).

A proposition s follows from (or is a consequence of) a set σ of propositions with respect to a sequence i of ideas (‘Consequ(s, σ, i)’)  =df  ∃F(A(F, i) ∧ D(F) ∧ <σ, s> ∈ F).

We can say that an argument <σ, s> is deductively correct with respect to i iff s is a consequence of σ with respect to i.

The logical form of an argument <σ, s> is the set of all of its iσ∪{s}-variants, and a logical argument form is the logical form of at least one argument:

LFA(<σ, s>)  =df  FA(<σ, s>, iσ∪{s}), i.e.,
    {<σ′, s′> | ∃j(σ′ = σ(j/iσ) ∧ s′ = s(j/is))}.

F is a logical argument form (‘LAF(F)’)  =df  ∃σ∃s(F = LFA(<σ, s>)).

An argument form F is logico-deductively correct or (briefly put) logically correct (‘LD(F)’) iff F is a logical argument form and F is deductively correct, i.e.,

LD(F)  =df  LAF(F) ∧ D(F).

A proposition s follows logically from a set σ of propositions, i.e., s is a logical consequence of σ (‘L-Consequ(s, σ)’) iff there is a logically correct argument form F, and <σ, s> is a member of F:

L-Consequ(s, σ)  =df  ∃F(LD(F) ∧ <σ, s> ∈ F).

For example, the proposition [Kant is German] is a logical consequence of the set {[Kant is Austrian or German], [Kant is non-Austrian]}.

Similar as before with single propositions and their logical truth, we gave also here priority to the argument form and its deductive and logical correctness and defined in terms of it consequence in general (or “material” consequence) and logical consequence. We could thereby avoid the result that each of two true purely logical propositions, i.e., true propositions that do not contain any extra-logical idea, is a logical consequence of the other one, thus, e.g., not only [There is at least one thing] being a logical consequence of {[There are at least two things]} but also vice versa [There are at least two things] being a logical consequence of {[There is at least one thing]} — quite contrary to our intuition and also to Bolzano's view.

A basic prerequisite for Bolzano's definition of logical consequence as well as for his definition of logical truth is the distinction between simple ideas that are purely logical and those that are not so. Bolzano explicates the distinction only by means of examples, his favorite examples for simple and purely logical ideas being [has], [non], and [something] (WL II, 84). Beyond that he frankly confesses that the distinction is not “scharf begrenzt” (sharply delineated) but rather “schwankend” (unsteady). In the German original of his paper on logical consequence (Tarski 1936), Alfred Tarski used almost the same German words to circumscribe exactly the same problem Bolzano had pointed out quite clearly almost exactly 100 years before.

Our reconstruction of Bolzano's definitions is not particularly affected, however, by this problem, since in the examples used in support of the reconstruction presented here, only ideas were used (such as negation, conjunction, disjunction, and emptiness of an idea) whose logical status seems more or less uncontroversial (as is similar in the case of the corresponding connectives, of the quantifiers and of the identity symbol in a formal language).

Logical consequence is not the only important logical relation Bolzano has defined by means of his method of idea variation. In a similar way, he defines many other logical concepts, such as the properties of satisfiability and unsatisfiability of a set of propositions and the relations of compatibility and incompatibility between propositions or sets of propositions, and, above all, various concepts of probability.

Concluding Remarks

Bolzano's introduction of ideas and propositions into logic was, in spite of their problematic ontological character, historically inestimable in its value, for it allowed for the clear separation of logic from psychology. Although this presupposition was extremely important for himself for obtaining new insights in the realm of logic and for defining basic concepts in an objective manner, most of these new insights and definitions do in fact not depend on the ontological presupposition of a World 3 (as important as it was for Bolzano himself in the context of his discoveries). The theory of idea-variation is perhaps Bolzano's most important and fruitful achievement, which could not be appreciated until the 20th century. (It was for the first time in Łukasiewicz 1913 that — despite some critical remarks — the value of Bolzano's innovation was recognized.) Bolzano develops his method of idea-variation with respect to ideas and propositions, but one can easily apply his notions and definitions also to linguistic expressions. Their scope and value is therefore not bound to the problematic presupposition of his World 3. (For this purpose, of course, we need linguistic expressions not only in the form of tokens but also in the form of types.) In transferring Bolzano's concepts and doctrines from World 3 to the level of language, however, we have to face a serious problem that is widely discussed in modern logic: Whereas Bolzano could light-heartedly assume that for every object x there is an idea of which x is the only object, this is definitely not true on the level of language: not everything has a name in a language. (Thus, the objection brought forward in Tarski 1956, 415f., against Carnap's definition of logical consequence in his Logical Syntax of Language, does not apply to Bolzano's approach.) There is therefore not a simple 1-1-transformation of Bolzano's views to the sphere of language; his basic insights, however, can be transferred in a modified form.

Only from the perspective of modern logic was it possible fully to appreciate the significance of Bolzano's work in logic. No wonder, therefore, that prominent representatives of modern logic were attracted by Bolzano's logical achievements (as is witnessed by publications listed in the bibliography whose authors are, e.g., Bar-Hillel, Beth, Church, Löwenheim, Łukasiewicz, and Scholz).

Only with the help of the precise tools of modern logic was it possible moreover to reconstruct Bolzano's logic in an appropriate way. This was done in an exemplary way by Jan Berg (in Berg 1962, and later in his introductions to the edition of the Theory of Science in BGA I, 11–14); most of the recent publications on Bolzano's logic, including the preceding survey, are based — explicitly or implicitly — on Berg's work.

The present survey of Bolzano's logic was restricted to formal questions. Questions of philosophical logic were excluded from this survey, although Bolzano made many interesting contributions in this field, in particular in deontic logic (see section 6.4), epistemic logic, and above all in alethic modal logic. (A survey of Bolzano's contributions to philosophical logic can be found in Morscher 1974 and 2007.)