#### Supplement to Actualism

## Problems with the Actualist Accounts

### Problems for New Actualism

New actualism is a powerful and elegant solution to the problem of
possibilism. It appears to have all the theoretical power of
possibilism without possibilism's commitment to mere possibilia;
everything there is is actual. However, one might argue that it is no
surprise that new actualism retains the theoretical power of
possibilism, because new actualism is nothing more than thinly veiled
possibilism: the new actualist's “actuality” is just
the possibilist's being, and contingent nonconcreteness is
nothing but the possibilist's mere possibility; nothing but
terminology distinguishes a mere
*possibile* from a possibly (but not actually) concrete
individual.

Even if this is all there were to new actualism, it would not be
insignificant. For, in that case, new actualism shows that the standard
definition of actualism has not gotten to the heart of the matter
— that actualism is not best characterized as the thesis that
everything there *is*, in any sense, is actual. For new
actualism demonstrates, at least, that there is a way of systematically
reclothing possibilist statements in actualist guise.

This might prompt the “classical” actualist to try to get at the
essence of her view in a slightly different way. The real target of the
claim that everything is actual is the possibilist's division of being
into two modes: actuality and mere possibility (i.e., contingent
nonactuality). The new actualist certainly denies *that*
division; there are indeed no mere *possibilia* for the new
actualist, no objects that are, but which fail to be actual. However,
the classical actualist would argue that the new actualist still
violates the spirit of actualism. The new actualist does indeed
maintain a single sense of being; but in place of the possibilist's
division of being into two modes — actuality and contingent
nonactuality — the new actualist substitutes a division of
actuality into two modes: concreteness and contingent nonconcreteness.
It is difficult not to see this as a mere relabeling of the
possibilist's distinction. Most classical actualists will, therefore,
regard new actualism as having the *form* of actualism without
having the content necessary to serve as a genuine solution to the
possibilist challenge.

For further debate on new actualism see Tomberlin [1996], the reply by Linsky and Zalta [1996], and Bennett 2006 and the reply by Nelson and Zalta [2009].

### Problems for Individual Essences

Plantinga's account is not without its problems. We will raise three that have appeared in the literature. Plantinga has reasonable responses to the first two. The third seems to be the most problematic.

*An Extravagant Ontology*

The first, a perhaps least pressing, problem of Plantinga's account is its commitment to a rich universe of fine-grained properties, relations, states of affairs, etc. However, the epistemological problems of platonism in general notwithstanding, abstract entities are largely recognized as, if perhaps not indispensible, extremely useful theoretical constructs, and are ubiquitous in contemporary philosophy of language, logic, mathematics, and linguistics, and in artificial intelligence. Hence, Plantinga's project is in no deeper water in this regard than many other well-regarded projects. For all but the most stringent nominalists, then, the only objection can be that the ontology is too rich, too fine-grained. However, once abstract entities are admitted at all, such a charge will stick only if the entities in question are not doing any reasonable philosophical work, and that is not the case in Plantinga's account; for all its richness, the elements of its ontology and their nature seem quite carefully chosen to play their respective roles. Hence, the objection here seems to boil down simply to a difference of philosophical taste. And that is not a serious objection.

*Uninterpretability of the Semantics*

Plantinga and Jager purport to be providing a genuine semantics for quantified modal languages, an account of the meaning of modal assertions. There are two related, and more serious, objections to their project, however. (These objections are based in part upon Linsky and Zalta [1994].)

First, Plantinga's modal semantics does not square with our basic semantic intuitions. In particular, on Plantinga's semantics, names denote, and quantifiers range over, individual essences. Intuitively, however (and also according to the current dominant theories of reference), names do no such thing; names denote individuals: ‘Quine’ denotes Quine, not his individual essence. Indeed, in order to denote haecceities, we resort to grammatically more complex constructions like gerunds that contain names referring to individuals, e.g., ‘being Quine’. The term ‘Quine’ here must be taken to refer to Quine, not an individual essence, lest the term denote, not an individual essence of Quine, but an individual essence of an individual essence of Quine.

This last point illustrates the second and more difficult objection,
namely, that *Plantinga's semantics provides no way of interpreting
the basic definitions and principles of the semantics itself.*
According to the semantics, quantifiers range over individual essences
and atomic formulas express coexemplification. Yet the metalinguistic
quantifiers in the definitions of ‘individual essence’ and
‘coexemplification’ must, on pain of circularity, be taken
to range over individuals. Again, the crucial principle P4 of
Plantinga's semantics says that, necessarily, every object has an
individual essence. But clearly, the universal quantifier here cannot
itself be interpreted as a quantifier over individual essences, lest P4
express only the trivial proposition that, in every world
**w**, every individual essence that is exemplified in
**w** is coexemplified with the property **having an
individual essence**. So, while P4 is intended to guarantee that
there are enough individual essences, intepreted according to
Plantinga's own semantics P4 turns out to be true even if there are no
individual essences at all.

There are moves that one can imagine Plantinga and Jager making in
response to these difficulties. For instance, perhaps they could add a
domain of actual individuals to the semantics to serve as the referents
for names. Again, perhaps Plantinga intends the semantics not to
capture the denotation relation but rather only the relation of
*expressing* that he has argued holds between names and
individual essences (cf. Plantinga [1974]). The point, however, is
that, if the account of Plantinga and Jager is to be understood as a
genuine semantic theory as they seem to purport, numerous difficulties
must be addressed before the account can be considered viable. If their
semantics is to be understood in some other way, its nature and purpose
need significant clarification and, where appropriate,
modification.

*Conceptual Difficulties with Haecceitism*

More pernicious difficulties surround the notion of an individual
essence itself, and in particular the notion of a haecceity. To get at
the chief problem, first, define a property or relation to be
*logically simple* (*simple*, for short) if it is not
itself a negation, conjunction, disjunction, quantification,
modalization, etc. of any other properties or relations. (The idea
here, of course, is that logically simple properties correspond to
basic predicates in a language, and logically complex properties are
analogous to complex sentences. It is a bit difficult in fact to find
any uncontroversial examples of logically simple properties. Perhaps
certain fundamental mental states like happiness or physical states
like *being a quark* or *having mass* qualify. For
purposes here, however, we needn’t delve deeper.) Next, say that a
property **P** is *general* if it is possible both
that (i) something **x** exemplify **P** and
that (ii) possibly, something **y** distinct from
**x** exemplify **P**. Intuitively, then, a
property is general if it can be exemplified by more than one thing,
albeit perhaps only at different times or in different possible worlds.
The notion of generality can be extended to relations in an obvious
way.

Now, haecceities are either simple or they are not. Both options are problematic. Plantinga refers to haecceities by means of two types of gerunds: grammatically simple gerunds like ‘being Quine’, and grammatically more complex gerunds like ‘being identical with Quine’. Those of the former sort suggest that haecceities are logically simple, the latter that they are logically complex. We consider them in turn.

If haecceities are logically complex, the central question is: In
what does this logical complexity consist? An appealing and quite
popular answer dating back to Russell is that logical complexity, at
least in part, involves a certain type of metaphysical complexity: a
logically complex property, proposition, or relation is literally
*constituted* by less complex metaphysical parts. (See Frege
[1980], p. 169.) So, for example, the property **being human and
over 6 feet tall** is constituted by the properties
**being human** and **being over 6 feet
tall**. And, most relevantly, *singular* properties and
relations like **being a student of Quine** that involve
expressions for a relation and an individual are constituted by those
very entities, in this case, in this case, the relation **being a
student of** and *Quine himself*.

If this account is correct, then Quine is a literal metaphysical
component of the haecceity **being identical with Quine**.
If so, however, then it seems that haecceities are ontologically
dependent on their instances; no haecceity exists uninstantiated. For
Quine is the very component that distinguishes **being identical
with Quine** from every other haecceity, and hence he appears to
be essential to its identity. But if that is correct, then haecceities
cannot play the role of *possibilia*, for possibilia are, in a
certain sense, necessary beings. Though perhaps not *actual* in
every world, nontheless, for the possibilist, necessarily, for every
*possibile* **x** and every world
**w**, *there is* such a thing as
**x** at **w**. But if haecceities are
ontologically dependent upon their instances, then there are no
uninstantiated haecceities. In particular, then, there are no
haecceities that could be instantiated by Aliens, since, by hypothesis,
no actual individual is possibly an Alien. Hence, Plantinga's semantics
for (1) do not work, as they depend upon the existence of an
uninstantiated haecceity. Plantinga, of course, could (and, in fact,
does) just resist the idea that Quine is a constituent of **being
identical with Quine**. However, he identifies no other problems
with this conception of logical complexity, and provides no alternative
account. Hence, this response seems ad hoc.

A somewhat stronger move for Plantinga is to deny that haecceities
are logically complex and take them instead to be logically simple, as
suggested by grammatically simple gerunds like ‘being
Quine’ that do not involve reference to identity or any other
property or relation. Now, the fact that one still has to refer to
Quine in order to refer to his haecceity might suggest that
**being Quine** is no less ontologically dependent upon
Quine than is **being identical with Quine**. The
important difference in this case, however, is that there is no
apparent logical complexity that needs explaining: **being
Quine** — or perhaps better, **quineity**
— as it happens, simply holds essentially and uniquely of Quine.
True enough, we can only refer to Quine's haecceity by referring, at
least obliquely, to Quine. However, all that follows from that is that
if Quine hadn’t existed, it would not have been possible to refer to
his haecceity, at least, not by means of a gerund involving a proper
name of Quine. The haecceity itself is, arguably, no more ontologically
dependent upon Quine than is the number 2. Hence, there is no reason to
deny that logically simple haecceities, like other logically simple
properties, are necessary beings, and hence no reason to think that
they cannot play all of the metaphysical roles demanded of them in
Plantinga's account.

The chief objection to this move now, however, is whether Plantinga
has distinguished his own view sufficiently from possibilism. On his
account, haecceities are logically simple but non-general properties.
But this seems a very odd combination. Intuitively, at first blush
anyway, properties and relations are common, general, repeatable
characteristics of, or connections between, things — redness,
wisdom, humanity, marriage, adjacency, etc. Recognition of shareability
among many particulars, awareness of a one over many, is what gave rise
to the concept of a property in the first place. In fact, of course,
not all properties are general. But, intuitively again, non-generality
comes about by virtue of logical complexity, by virtue of the manner in
which the components of a complex property are “woven together”
logically, e.g., **being smaller than every other prime
number**, **possibly being the father of
Xantippe**, or **being identical with Quine**.
Hence, it follows from these intuitions that, necessarily, all
logically simple properties are general. However, Plantinga flouts
these intuitions in order to introduce an entirely new class of simple
property whose sole function is to serve as an actualist counterpart to
*possibilia*. But given their oddity, it is far from clear that
there is any greater philosophical virtue in postulating logically
simple but essentially non-general properties than in postulating that
there are objects that are not actual. So whatever victory Plantinga
can claim for actualism here seems Pyrrhic at best. (Some readers may
be interested in the supplementary document
Qualitative Essences and a Final Defense for Plantinga.)

### Problems for Prior's *Q*

Since BF, NE, and CBF are no longer theorems, one might think that Prior
had succeeded in finding the correct modal logic for actualism. However,
few actualists have adopted this logic. There are a number of reasons for
this. First, Prior never actually provided a formal semantics for *Q*.
While the underlying ideas are evocative, indeed rather compelling, they
are never formally developed. Consequently, there are no soundness and
completeness theorems for the logic, which puts the defender of *Q* at a
significant formal and philosophical disadvantage.

As for the logic itself, the interdefinability of possibility and
necessity is widely considered both too intuitive and too elegant to
abandon — it seems to capture something deep about the logical
relationships among our modal beliefs. This raises strong concerns about
the philosophical viability of Prior's account (though ones he
admittedly attempts to address). Second, Prior's somewhat plausible
explanations notwithstanding, it is undeniably awkward that
¬◊¬*E!t* is theorem of *Q* for any term *t* and
hence that one cannot consistently assert in *Q* that it is
impossible that a given contingent being fail to exist. As Deutsch
observes, “... surely there is a sense in which ‘Prior
exists’ might have been *false*; and there is no way to
express this in Prior's system” ([1990], 92-93).

Third, a serious formal shortcoming in Prior's account is that there
is simply no formal semantics. Prior justifies the axioms and rules
of *Q* on purely intuitive grounds; he provides no
real *logic* for which *Q* is a complete (or even incomplete)
proof theory. Finally, perhaps the most awkward consequence of
Prior's logic, however, is the fact that logical contradictions that
aren’t necessarily statable turn out to be weakly possible! As note, in
response to the previous problem, Prior would emphasize that the
contingency of a contingent being *a*, i.e., the contingency of the
proposition [*E!a*, is properly expressed by the fact that *E!a*
is not necessarily true (since it is not necessarily statable). However,
if that is what it is to say that a fact is contingent, then any literal
contradiction involving *a* will be contingent! For example, the
contradiction *Pa* & ¬*Pa* is not necessarily true,
since neither is statable in a world where *a* doesn’t exist. So this
contradiction, on Prior's telling, becomes contingent. Indeed, if we
suppose that ¬□¬φ (using Prior's defined sense of
□) defines a weak sense in which φ is possible, it turns out
that both the intuitively contingent ¬*E!a* and the contradictory
*Pa* & ¬*Pa* are possible in exactly this sense. As
described elsewhere (Menzel [1991], 348), Prior's modal logic
“cannot distinguish the expression of [*a*'s] contingency
from the possibility of manifest repugnancies”.

### Problems for World Stories

Though promising and intuitive, Adams' account, like Plantinga's, suffers from some serious objections.

One of the traditional strengths of possible worlds semantics is that it provides a compositional semantics for modal notions. A virtue of the Plantinga/Jager approach is that it preserves compositionality. Haecceities, however, are the key to their approach. Adams’ account by contrast, with its rejection of haecceities, sacrifices compositionality. Notably, the semantics of (1) must stop at:

(1*) The proposition expressed by ‘∃ xAx’ (i.e.,There are Aliens) is true at some world story.

For, because there are in fact no Aliens, the proposition **There are
Aliens** that is expressed by
‘∃*xAx*’ has no witnesses, no objects that, by virtue of their
actual or possible properties, make it true. Hence, unlike
compositional accounts, one cannot further analyze (1*).

*The Iterated Modalities Objection*

However, perhaps the sacrifice of compositionality is not too high a
price for the strong actualist to pay. After all, we
*understand* quantification well enough from standard, nonmodal
Tarskian semantics. And given strong actualism, it is no surprise that
(1*) should be unanalyzable, for there *are* no possible Aliens to
serve as witnesses to (1*). The real goal of a semantics of modality is to
provide a truth conditional analysis of our ordinary use of *modal*
operators: specifically, to supply, for each sentence of our ordinary
modal discourse, truth conditions expressible solely in terms of worlds
and propositions in which no such modal operators occur. From that
perspective, the unanalyzability of (1*) is unproblematic, as the
important work has been done in analyzing the modal operator in (1).

However, at this point Adams falls victim to the iterated modalities objection. Recall the following proposition:

(7) Joseph Ratzinger could have had a son who could have become a priest

that is, formally,

(8) ◊∃ x(Sxp& ◊Px).

On Adams’ semantics, (8) is true if and only if

(12) ‘∃ x(Sxp& ◊Px)’ (i.e., the propositionRatzinger has a son who could have become a priestthat is expresses) is true at some worldw.

The problem now is that, if we stop the analysis of (8) with (12), the
semantic prize noted above — the analysis of our ordinary modal
locutions in terms of possible worlds — is lost, as (12) contains
an embedded modal operator that cannot be analyzed in terms of world
stories. For to do so, unlike the case of (1*), one must produce a
witness for ‘∃*x*(*Sxp* &
◊*Px*)’ about whom it is true at some world that
*he* is a priest. That is, in order to analyze the embedded
modal operator, (12) seems to require analysis along the following
lines:

(13) For some some individual x, the proposition expressed by ‘Sxp& ◊Px’ (i.e.,) is true at some worldxis a son of Ratzinger andxcould have become a priestw,

which then enables us to analyze the embedded modal operator:

(14) For some some individual x, the proposition expressed by ‘Sxp’ (i.e.,) is true at some possible worldxis a son of Ratzingerwand, for some possible worldu, the proposition expressed by ‘Px’ (i.e.,) is true atxis a priestu.

But by strong actualism, there is no such instance *x*, as the pope
has no children and, assuming that one's actual parents are necessarily
one's parents (provided one exists), nothing actual could have been the
pope's child. Hence, given strong actualism, there is no information about
any such *x*, no singular proposition that is directly about any
such *x*. Hence, there is no proposition of the requisite
form ** x is a son of Ratzinger** specified in (14) to
be true at some possible world, that is, to be a member of some world
story. Granted, there

*could*be such a proposition, but, given strong actualism, there isn’t in fact. Hence, Adams’ account fails to provide the sort of truth conditional analysis of our ordinary modal discourse that it purports to provide. Rather, at least some ordinary modal statements with iterated modal operators will not have truth conditions expressible solely in terms of worlds and propositions in which no such modal operators occur.

*No Formal Semantics*

Finally, while a fairly definite logic appears to emerge from
Adams’ world story semantics, no genuine *formal* semantics
is forthcoming; things are left at a purely intuitive, philosophical
level. Notably, Adams provides no formal account of propositions and
hence no formal understanding of worlds. Hence, Adam's account
provides no formal semantics for defining of entailment, consistency,
and the like, and no basis for proving the soundness and completeness of
his logic. Consequently, regardless of the philosophical advantages
Adams’ strict actualism has over Plantinga’ haecceitism, as
it stands Adams’, unlike Plantinga's (as formalized by Jager
[1982]), does not provide a viable formal alternative to SQML and the
logic of Kripke's semantics.

### Problems for Role Semantics

*Intuitive Problems with De Re Modality*

McMichael's semantics seems reasonably successful in coping with the
problems facing the semantics of Plantinga and Adams. The account is
actualist, but neither requires haecceities nor falls prey to the
compositionality and iterated modalities objections. However, the
success of the account comes at a fairly steep intuitive price, as it
abandons strong intuitions about *de re* modality. McMichael
would have us understand (9), the statement that Socrates could have
been foolish, to be expressing a fact about a complex, abstract
property, a role, that bears some sort of accessibility relation to
another role that is exemplified by Socrates. actual role of Socrates.
Similarly, (8) expresses a fact about a role accessible to the Pope's
actual role. But one still wonders: what do such facts about roles and
their accessibility to one another have to do with the properties
*Socrates* could have had? What, in particular, is the
connection between the accessibility of one role to another and the
modal properties of individuals? What we’d like to say is that a role
**S** is accessible to, say, Socrates’ actual role
**R _{s}** just in case it is a role Socrates could
have exemplified. But, in McMichael's semantics, to say that Socrates
could have exemplified any given property

**P**(a role in particular) is only to say that some role that includes

**P**is accessible to

**R**, and we are back where we started with no insight into the connection between accessibility and the modal properties of Socrates. On this score, both possibilism and haecceitism account far more satisfactorily for our modal intuitions.

_{s}
*No Proof Theory*

A formal problem for McMichael's account is that, unlike Plantinga,
Prior, the model-theoretic actualists, and (to a lesser extent) Adams, he
provides no proof theory for his semantics, no set of logically true
axioms which one could, ideally, prove to be sound and complete with
respect to the semantics. This is a severe liability, as McMichael's
account does not provide the actualist the means genuinely to *do*
modal logic. This puts the account at a severe practical disadvantage
compared to SQML and the other actualist accounts.

### Problems for Model-Theoretic Actualism

Perhaps the central problem for the no-world account is that is
abandons traditional ideas about truth and modality. The no-worlder
counts his eschewal of worlds as a virtue. However, as Linsky and Zalta
[1996] note, this is problematic for several reasons. For if we abandon
possible worlds, we must also abandon the “seminal insight”that
necessary truth is truth in all possible worlds. And this is
problematic for several reasons, for it not only undermines the
elegant, extensional characterization of the truth conditions of modal
claims, but also dismisses the intuition so strongly evident in
ordinary thinking about modality that there exist alternative *ways
the world might have been*. For the no-worlder, however, there are
no worlds, and hence no intended model whose indices are genuine
possible worlds. There are instead only purely formal intended* models
that possibly model the structure of modal reality. But, Linsky and
Zalta ask,

… surely there is something more to modal truth than this; surelynecessityandpossibilityare about something besides the structure of intended* models, something whichgroundsmodal truth and which is modeled by an intended model. ([1994], 444)

But intended* models are not really *models* of
any*thing*. At best they have the property of being actual
objects that *possibly* model the *structure* of modal
reality. But a model of the pure structure of modal reality, the
objection might continue, is not the same as a genuine model of modal
reality. On the no-worlds approach,

...we cannot say that modal discourse is in partaboutthe objects over which the quantifiers range, at least not in the same way that we can say that nonmodal language is about these objects. (Linsky and Zalta, [1994], 444)

And if not, it is hard to see in what sense the no-worlds approach accounts for modal truth at all.