Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Feminist Bioethics

1.. Many bioethics texts include a section on the historical origins of bioethics, particularly the abuses that led to its initial formation. See, for instance, Teays and Purdy, 2001. The British Medical Association Handbook (2001) includes more extended discussion of medical abuses.

2. In the past few years some mainstream bioethicists are finding common ground with feminists. For an illuminating look at this literature see Eckenwiler and Cohn’s 2007 anthology.

3. Alison Jaggar’s 2001 encyclopedia article, “Feminist Ethics,” provides an excellent summary of many of the key features of second wave feminism that have influenced feminist bioethics.

4. For a more comprehensive review of this history and references to the extensive literature on the women’s health movement, note Dresser 1996. On recent developments in midwifery see Hermer 2003.

5. Best known for its national best-selling paperback, Our Bodies, Ourselves: A Book By and for Women (originally published in 1970 and now in its eighth edition).

6. The struggle for more equitable representation of women in clinical research continues. For recent work on women, sex, and gender in biomedical research see Rogers and Ballantyne 2008 and the issue of The International Journal of Feminist Approaches to Bioethics devoted to this theme 1:2, 2008.

7. For diverging views see Dweyer and Tooley (1996) and Wolf-Devine, Devine, and Jaggar (2009). The latter compares a liberal “pro-choice” approach, a communitarian “pro-life” view, and a gender justice perspective.

8. For notable exceptions see Whitbeck 1981 and Young 1980).

9. Over the past decade the market for more feminist-friendly texts has grown considerably and publishers have been responsive. Note Jecker, Jonsen and Pearlman, 1997; Nelson and Nelson 1999; Boetzkes and Waluchow 2000; Teays and Purdy 2001; Fulford, Dickenson and Murray 2002; Baylis, Downie, Hoffmaster, and Sherwin 2004; and Singer and Viens 2008.

10. Detailed information about the history and ongoing activities of the International Network for Feminist Approaches to Bioethics is available at

11. Conferences in China have often dealt with Chinese women’s responses to governmental abortion policy. On this issue see Greenhaigh 2001 and Nie 2005.

12. Evidence-based medicine attempts to apply evidence obtained through scientific methods to specific medical practices. It aims to assess the quality of evidence relevant to the risks and benefits of specific treatments or, in some instances, to nontreatment.

13. For related historical and personal reflections on breast cancer see the contributions to Rawlinson 2006.

14. The most widely cited exponents of such a theoretical framework are Tom Beauchamp and James Childress. The sixth edition of their work appeared in 2009.

15. For an overview of feminist relational approaches see Mackenzie and Stoljar 2000.] Some press for an ethic that stresses caring relations; others emphasize considerations of justice that address patterns of domination and oppression. I now turn to these approaches.

16. Other collections juxtaposing supporters and critics of care ethics have followed, e.g. Held 1995].

17. Note also the two special issues of Hypatia 16:4, 2001 and 17:3, 2002 for further work on disability that intersects feminist bioethics.

18. A good place to get an initial grasp of interconnections between different standard interpretations of autonomy and the informed consent process is the article “Four Models of the Physician-Patient Relationship” (Emanuel and Emanuel 1992). I also consider this issue in my 2008 article.

19. Laura Purdy describes in detail a situation where a medical institution allowed women to opt for prenatal reduction of three or more fetuses but not reduction to just one (2006).

20. The term biopower was coined by Foucault to refer to the organization of power by modern states which is exercised indirectly by disciplining bodies and regulating populations.

21. Mackenzie and Stoljar include in their anthology a comprehensive introduction that sorts out feminist critiques of autonomy and constructive reformulations in more detail (2000).

22. The commentary of Lisa Eckenwiler and her colleagues is available in Eckenwiler 2008. It can also be read at A version is also available in BMJ 2008;337:a2128 where it is accompanied by an editorial by Michael Goodyear, Lisa Eckenwiler, and Carolyn Ells.