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Everett's Relative-State Formulation of Quantum Mechanics

First published Wed Jun 3, 1998; substantive revision Thu Feb 20, 2003

Everett's relative-state formulation of quantum mechanics is an attempt to solve the measurement problem by dropping the collapse dynamics from the standard von Neumann-Dirac theory of quantum mechanics. The main problem with Everett's theory is that it is not at all clear how it is supposed to work. In particular, while it is clear that he wanted to explain why we get determinate measurement results in the context of his theory, it is unclear how he intended to do this. There have been many attempts to reconstruct Everett's no-collapse theory in order to account for the apparent determinateness of measurement outcomes. These attempts have led to such formulations of quantum mechanics as the many-worlds, many-minds, many-histories, and relative-fact theories. Each of these captures part of what Everett claimed for his theory, but each also encounters problems.

1. Introduction

Everett formulated his relative-state interpretation of quantum mechanics while he was a graduate student in physics at Princeton University. His doctoral dissertation (1957a) was recommended for publication in March 1957 and a paper reporting the results of his dissertation (1957b) was published in July of the same year. He also later published an extended discussion of his relative-state interpretation in the DeWitt and Graham anthology (1973). After graduating from Princeton, Everett worked as a defense analyst. He died in 1982.

Everett's no-collapse formulation of quantum mechanics was a reaction to problems that arise in the standard von Neumann-Dirac collapse formulation. Everett's proposal was to drop the collapse postulate from the standard formulation of quantum mechanics then deduce the empirical predictions of the standard theory as the subjective experiences of observers who are themselves treated as physical systems described by his theory. It is, however, unclear precisely how Everett intended for this to work. Consequently, there have been many, mutually incompatible, attempts at trying to explain what he in fact had in mind. Indeed, it is probably fair to say that most no-collapse interpretations of quantum mechanics have at one time or another been attributed to Everett.

In what follows, I will describe Everett's worry about the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics and his proposal for solving the problem as it is presented in his 1957 paper. I will then very briefly describe a few approaches to interpreting Everett's theory.

2. The Measurement Problem

Everett presented his relative-state formulation of quantum mechanics as a way of avoiding the problems encountered by the standard von Neumann-Dirac collapse formulation. The main problem, according to Everett, was that the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics required observers always to be treated as external to the system described by the theory. One consequence of this was that the standard collapse formulation could not be used to describe the universe as a whole since the universe contains observers.

In order to understand what Everett was worried about, one must first understand how the standard formulation of quantum mechanics works. The standard von Neumann-Dirac theory is based on the following principles (von Neumann, 1955):

  1. Representation of States: The possible physical states of a system S are represented by the unit-length vectors in a Hilbert space (which for present purposes one may regard as a vector space with an inner product). The physical state at a time is then represented by a single vector in the Hilbert space.
  2. Representation of Properties: For each physical property P that one might observe of a system S there is a linear (so-called projection) operator P (on the vectors that represent the possible states of S) that represents the property.
  3. Eigenvalue-Eigenstate Link: A system S determinately has physical property P if and only if P operating on S (the vector representing S's state) yields S. We say then that S is in an eigenstate of P with eigenvalue 1. S determinately does not have property P if and only if P operating on S yields 0.
  4. Dynamics: (a) If no measurement is made, then a system S evolves continuously according to the linear, deterministic dynamics, which depends only on the energy properties of the system. (b) If a measurement is made, then the system S instantaneously and randomly jumps to a state where it either determinately has or determinately does not have the property being measured. The probability of each possible post-measurement state is determined by the system's initial state. More specifically, the probability of ending up in a particular final state is equal to the norm squared of the projection of the initial state on the final state.

According to the eigenvalue-eigenstate link (Rule 3) a system would typically neither determinately have nor determinately not have a particular given property. In order to determinately have a particular property the vector representing the state of a system must be in the ray (or subspace) in state space representing the property, and in order to determinately not have the property the state of a system must be in the plane (or subspace) orthogonal to it, and most state vectors will be neither parallel nor orthogonal to a given ray (or subspace). Further, the deterministic dynamics (Rule 4a) typically does nothing to guarantee that a system will either determinately have or determinately not have a particular property when one observes the system to see whether the system has that property. This is why the collapse dynamics (Rule 4b) is needed in the standard formulation of quantum mechanics. It is the collapse dynamics that guarantees that a system will either determinately have or determinately not have a particular property whenever one observes the system to see whether or not it has the property. But the linear dynamics (Rule 4a) is also needed to account for quantum mechanical interference effects. So the standard formulation of quantum mechanics has two dynamical laws: the deterministic, continuous, linear Rule 4a describes how a system evolves when it is not being measured, and the random, discontinuous, nonlinear Rule 4b describes how a system evolves when it is measured.

But what does it take for an interaction to count as a measurement? Unless we know this, the standard formulation of quantum mechanics is at best incomplete since we do not know when each dynamical law obtains. Moreover, and this is what worried Everett, if we suppose that observers and their measuring devices are constructed from simpler systems that each obey the deterministic dynamics, then the composite systems, the observers and their measuring devices, must evolve in a continuous deterministic way, and nothing like the random, discontinuous evolution described by Rule 4b can ever occur. That is, if observers and their measuring devices are understood as being constructed of simpler systems each behaving as quantum mechanics requires, each obeying Rule 4a, then the standard formulation of quantum mechanics is logically inconsistent since it says that the two systems together must obey Rule 4b. This is the quantum measurement problem in the context of the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics. See the entry on measurement in quantum theory.

In order to preserve the consistency of quantum mechanics, Everett concluded that the standard collapse formulation could not be used to describe systems that contain observers; that is, it could only be used to describe a system where all observers are external to the described system. And, for Everett, this restriction on the applicability of quantum mechanics was unacceptable. Everett wanted a formulation of quantum mechanics that could be applied to any physical system whatsoever, one that described observers and their measuring devices the same way that it described every other physical system.

3. Everett's Proposal

In order to solve the measurement problem Everett proposed dropping the collapse dynamics (Rule 4b) from the standard collapse theory and proposed taking the resulting physical theory as providing a complete and accurate description of all physical systems whatsoever. Everett then intended to deduce the standard statistical predictions of quantum mechanics (the predictions that depend on Rule 4b in the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics) as the subjective experiences of observers who are themselves treated as ordinary physical systems within the new theory.

Everett says:

We shall be able to introduce into [the relative-state theory] systems which represent observers. Such systems can be conceived as automatically functioning machines (servomechanisms) possessing recording devices (memory) and which are capable of responding to their environment. The behavior of these observers shall always be treated within the framework of wave mechanics. Furthermore, we shall deduce the probabilistic assertions of Process 1 [rule 4b] as subjective appearances to such observers, thus placing the theory in correspondence with experience. We are then led to the novel situation in which the formal theory is objectively continuous and causal, while subjectively discontinuous and probabilistic. While this point of view thus shall ultimately justify our use of the statistical assertions of the orthodox view, it enables us to do so in a logically consistent manner, allowing for the existence of other observers (1973, p. 9).

Everett's goal then was to show that the memory records of an observer as described by quantum mechanics without the collapse dynamics would somehow agree with those predicted by the standard formulation with the collapse dynamics. The main problem in understanding what Everett had in mind is in figuring out how this correspondence between the predictions of the two theories was supposed to work.

In order to see what happens, let us try Everett's no-collapse proposal for a simple measurement interaction. One can measure the x-spin of a physical system. More specifically, a spin-1/2 system will be found to be either "x-spin up" or "x-spin down" when its x-spin is measured. So suppose that J is a good observer who measures the x-spin of a spin-1/2 system S. For Everett, being a good x-spin observer means that J has the following two dispositions (the arrows below represent the time-evolution described by the deterministic dynamics of Rule 4a):

equation 1

equation 2

If J measures a system that is determinately x-spin up, then J will determinately record "x-spin up"; and if J measures a system that is determinately x-spin down, then J will determinately record "x-spin down" (and we assume, for simplicity, that the spin of the object system S is undisturbed by the interaction).

Now consider what happens when J observes the x-spin of a system that begins in a superposition of x-spin eigenstates:

equation 3

The initial state of the composite system then is:

equation 4

Here J is determinately ready to make an x-spin measurement, but the object system S, according to Rule 3, has no determinate x-spin. Given J's two dispositions and the fact that the deterministic dynamics is linear, the state of the composite system after J's x-spin measurement will be:

equation 5

On the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics, somehow during the measurement interaction the state would collapse to either the first term of this expression (with probability equal to a squared) or to the second term of this expression (with probability equal to b squared). In the former case, J ends up with the determinate measurement record "spin up", and in the later case J ends up with the determinate measurement record "spin down". But on Everett's proposal no collapse occurs. Rather, the post-measurement state is simply this entangled superposition of J recording the result "spin up" and S being x-spin up and J recording "spin down" and S being x-spin down. Call this state E for Everett. On the standard eigenvalue-eigenstate link (Rule 3) E is not a state where J determinately records "spin up", neither is it a state where J determinately records "spin down". So the puzzle for an interpretation of Everett is to explain the sense in which J's entangled superposition of mutually incompatible records is supposed to agree with the empirical prediction made by the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics. The standard collapse theory, again, predicts that J either ends up with the fully determinate measurement record "spin up" or the fully determinate record "spin down", with probabilities equal to a-squared and b-squared respectively.

Everett confesses that a post-measurement state like E is puzzling:

As a result of the interaction the state of the measuring apparatus is no longer capable of independent definition. It can be defined only relative to the state of the object system. In other words, there exists only a correlation between the states of the two systems. It seems as if nothing can ever be settled by such a measurement (1957b, p. 318).

And he describes the problem he consequently faces:

This indefinite behavior seems to be quite at variance with our observations, since physical objects always appear to us to have definite positions. Can we reconcile this feature of wave mechanical theory built purely on [Rule 4a] with experience, or must the theory be abandoned as untenable? In order to answer this question we consider the problem of observation itself within the framework of the theory (1957b, p. 318).

Then he describes his solution to this determinate-record (determinate-experience) problem:

Let one regard an observer as a subsystem of the composite system: observer + object-system. It is then an inescapable consequence that after the interaction has taken place there will not, generally, exist a single observer state. There will, however, be a superposition of the composite system states, each element of which contains a definite observer state and a definite relative object-system state. Furthermore, as we shall see, each of these relative object system states will be, approximately, the eigenstates of the observation corresponding to the value obtained by the observer which is described by the same element of the superposition. Thus, each element of the resulting superposition describes an observer who perceived a definite and generally different result, and to whom it appears that the object-system state has been transformed into the corresponding eigenstate. In this sense the usual assertions of [the collapse dynamics (Rule 4b)] appear to hold on a subjective level to each observer described by an element of the superposition. We shall also see that correlation plays an important role in preserving consistency when several observers are present and allowed to interact with one another (to ‘consult’ one another) as well as with other object-systems (1973, p. 10).

To this end Everett presents a principle that he calls the fundamental relativity of quantum mechanical states. On this principle, one can say that in state E, J recorded "x-spin up" relative to S being in the x-spin up state and that J recorded "x-spin down" relative to S being in the x-spin down state. But this principle cannot by itself provide Everett with the determinate measurement records (or the determinate measurement experiences) predicted by the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics. The standard formulation predicts that on measurement the quantum-mechanical state of the composite system will collapse to precisely one of the following two states:

equation 6

and that there is thus a single, simple matter of fact about which measurement result J recorded. On Everett's account it is unclear whether J ends up recording one result or the other or perhaps somehow both.

The problem is that there is a gap in Everett's exposition between what he sets out to explain and what he ultimately ends up saying. He set out to explain why observers get precisely the same measurement records (experiences) as predicted by the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics in quantum mechanics without the collapse dynamics, but he ends up with an account where it is unclear what if any determinate records an observer has after a typical measurement interaction. Since it is unclear exactly how Everett intends to explain an observer's determinate measurement records (experiences), it is also unclear how he intends to explain why one should expect one's determinate measurement records to exhibit the standard quantum statistics. This gap in Everett's exposition has led to many mutually incompatible reconstructions of his account of quantum mechanics. Each of these reconstructions can be taken as presenting a different way of explaining how one's records can be determinate (or appear to be determinate to an observer, or why it should not matter whether or not they are determinate) in a post-measurement state like E.

4. The Bare Theory

Albert and Loewer's bare theory (Albert and Loewer, 1988, and Albert, 1992) is arguably the wildest interpretation of Everett's theory around. On this reading, one supposes that Everett intended to drop the collapse dynamics but to keep the standard eigenvalue-eigenstate link.

So how does the bare theory account for J's determinate experience? The short answer is that it doesn't. Rather, on the bare theory, one tries to explain why J would falsely believe that he has an ordinary determinate measurement record. The trick is to ask the observer not what result he got, but rather whether he got some specific determinate result. If the post-measurement state was:

equation 7

then J would report "I got a determinate result, either spin up or spin down". And he would make precisely the same report if he ended up in the post-measurement state:

equation 8

So, by the linearity of the dynamics, J would falsely report "I got a determinate result, either spin up or spin down" when in the state E:

equation 9

Thus, one might argue, it would seem to J that he got a perfectly determinate ordinary measurement result even when he did not (that is, he did not determinately get "spin up" and did not determinately get "spin down").

The idea is to try to account for all of J's beliefs about his determinate experiences by appealing to such illusions. Rather than predicting the experiences that we believe that we have, a proponent of the bare theory tells us that we do not have many determinate beliefs at all and then tries to explain why we nonetheless determinately believe that we do.

While one can tell several suggestive stories about the sort of illusions that an observer would experience, there are at least two serious problems with the bare theory. One problem is that the bare theory is not empirically coherent: If the bare theory were true, it would be impossible to ever have empirical evidence for accepting it as true. Another is that if the bare theory were true, one would most likely fail to have any determinate beliefs at all (since on the deterministic dynamics one would almost never expect that the global state was an eigenstate of any particular observer being sentient), which is presumably not the sort of prediction one looks for in a successful physical theory (for more details on how experience is supposed to work in the bare theory and some the problems it encounters see Bub, Clifton, and Monton, 1998, and Barrett, 1994, 1996 and 1999).

5. Many Worlds

DeWitt's (1971) many-worlds interpretation (also called the splitting-worlds theory) is easily the most popular reading of Everett. On this theory there is one world corresponding to each term in the expansion of E when written in the preferred basis (there are always many ways one might write the quantum-mechanical state of a system as the sum of vectors in the Hilbert space; in choosing a preferred basis, one chooses a single set of vectors that can be used to represent a state and thus one chooses a single preferred way of representing a state as the sum of vectors in the Hilbert space). The theory's preferred basis is chosen so that each term in the expansion of E describes a world where there is a determinate measurement record. Given the preferred basis (surreptitiously) chosen above, E describes two worlds: one where J (or perhaps better J1) determinately records the measurement result "spin up" and another where J (or J2) determinately records "spin down".

DeWitt and Graham describe their reading of Everett as follows:

[Everett's interpretation of quantum mechanics] denies the existence of a separate classical realm and asserts that it makes sense to talk about a state vector for the whole universe. This state vector never collapses and hence reality as a whole is rigorously deterministic. This reality, which is described jointly by the dynamical variables and the state vector, is not the reality we customarily think of, but is a reality composed of many worlds. By virtue of the temporal development of the dynamical variables the state vector decomposes naturally into orthogonal vectors, reflecting a continual splitting of the universe into a multitude of mutually unobservable but equally real worlds, in each of which every good measurement has yielded a definite result and in most of which the familiar statistical quantum laws hold (1973, p. v).

DeWitt admits that this constant splitting of worlds whenever the states of systems become correlated is counterintuitive:

I still recall vividly the shock I experienced on first encountering this multiworld concept. The idea of 10100 slightly imperfect copies of oneself all constantly spitting into further copies, which ultimately become unrecognizable, is not easy to reconcile with common sense. Here is schizophrenia with a vengeance (1973, p. 161).

But while the theory is counterintuitive, it does (unlike the bare theory) explain why observers end up recording determinate measurement results. In the state described by E there are two observers, each occupying a different world and each with a perfectly determinate measurement record. There are, however, other problems with the many-worlds theory.

A standard complaint is that the theory is ontologically extravagant. One would presumably only ever need one physical world, our world, to account for our experiences. The idea behind postulating the actual existence of a different physical world corresponding to each term in the quantum-mechanical state is that is allows one to explain our determinate experiences while taking the deterministically-evolving quantum-mechanical state to be in some sense a complete and accurate description of the physical facts. But again one might wonder whether the sort of completeness one gets warrants the vast ontology of worlds.

Perhaps more seriously, in order to explain our determinate measurement records, the theory requires one to choose a preferred basis so that observers have determinate records (or determinate experiences) in each term of the quantum-mechanical state as expressed in this basis. The problem is that not just any basis will do this. Making the total angular momentum of all the sheep in Austria determinate by choosing such a preferred basis to tell us when worlds split, would presumably do little to account for the determinate memory I have concerning what I just typed. But this is the problem, we do not really know what basis would make our most immediately accessible physical records, those records that determine our experiences and beliefs, determinate in every world. The problem of choosing which observable to make determinate is known as the preferred-basis problem.

One might hope that the selection of a preferred basis would work the other way around: that the biological evolution of observers would select for observers who record their measurement results in whatever physical observable is in fact determinate. The idea is that observers would either start recording their measurement results in whatever physical observable is in fact determinate or face some sort of failure in action for not having determinate measurement records. The full explanation for why this does not work in a straightforward way is subtle, but the basic idea is simple: in a no-collapse theory, there is no decreased fitness for a good observer who fails to have determinate measurement records. Suppose that only the position of particles is in fact determinate, as in Bohm's theory, but that an observer nonetheless tries to record his measurements in terms of the x-spin of particles in his brain. Such an observer would typically not have any determinate measurement records, but it would be difficult for anyone to tell. The observer would himself not know because, for bare theory reasons, he would falsely believe that he had determinate measurement records. But neither would other observers typically know that he failed to have determinate records, for as soon as the observer's brain state becomes quantum-mechanically correlated with the position of anything, the observer would have an effectively determinate measurement record by dint of this correlation in the physically preferred quantity. The evolutionary upshot of this is that, as soon as there is the possibility of a determinate failure in action, a good observer would have precisely those determinate dispositions that would lead to successful action regardless of whether he started with a determinate measurement record. While such an observer eventually has something that serves the dispositional role of a measurement record, his belief that he had a determinate measurement record before he correlated his brain state with the state of the determinate preferred observable was simply false. (See Albert's 1992 discussion of measurement records in GRW for more details on the formation of effectively determinate records from an observer's dispositions to act.)

Given the constraints on property ascription posed by the Kochen-Specker theorem, one might argue that we do need to select a preferred basis in order to have any significant set of physical properties determinate. (See the article The Kochen-Specker Theorem.) Among the facts that one would want to have determinate are the values of our measurement records. But saying exactly what a preferred basis must do in order to make our most immediately accessible measurement records determinate is difficult since this is something that ultimately depends on the relationship between mental and physical states and on exactly how we expect our best physical theories to account for our experience. The preferred basis problem involves quantum mechanics, ontological questions concerning the philosophy of mind, and epistemological questions concerning the nature of our best physical theories. It is, consequently, a problem that requires special care.

Another problem with a splitting-worlds theory concerns the statistical predictions of the theory. The standard collapse theory predicts that J will get the result "spin up" with probability a-squared and "spin down" with probability b-squared in the above experiment. Insofar as there will be two copies of J in the future, J is guaranteed to get each of the two possible measurement results; so, in this sense, the probability of J getting the result "spin up", say, is one. But that is the wrong answer. A principle of indifference might lead one to assign probability ½ to each of the two possible measurement outcomes. But such a principle would be difficult to justify, and probability ½ is the wrong answer anyway. The moral is that it is impossible to get the right answer for probabilities without adding something to the theory.

In order to get a better idea concerning what one would have to add to get the right probabilities here, one might note that the question "What is the probability that J will record the result ‘spin up’?" is strictly speaking nonsense if one cannot identify which of the future observers is J. That is, if one does not have transtemporal identities for the observers in a theory, then one cannot assign probabilities to their future experiences. So in order to get probabilities out of the many-worlds theory, the first step is to provide an account of the transtemporal identity of observers. Since there is no rule telling us which worlds are which at different times, the splitting-worlds theory cannot, as it stands, make any statistical predictions whatsoever concerning an observer's future experiences. And not being able to account for the standard quantum probabilities is a serious problem since it was the successful statistical predictions of quantum mechanics that made quantum mechanics worth taking seriously in the first place. See the entry on the many-worlds interpretation of quantum mechanics for more details concerning splitting-worlds and the many-worlds theory. For more on the metaphysics of many worlds see Geroch (1984), Stein (1994), Healey (1984), Bell (1987), Butterfield (1995), Albert and Barrett (1995), Clifton (1996), Saunders (1997, 1998), Barrett (1999) and Wallace (2002).

6. Many Minds

Everett said that on his formulation of quantum mechanics "the formal theory is objectively continuous and causal, while subjectively discontinuous and probabilistic" (1973, p. 9). Albert and Loewer (1988) have captured this feature in their many-minds theory by distinguishing between the time evolution of an observer's physical state, which is continuous and causal, and the evolution of an observer's mental state, which is discontinuous and probabilistic.

Perhaps the oddest thing about this theory is that in order to get the observer's mental state in some way to supervene on his physical state, Albert and Loewer associate with each observer a continuous infinity of minds. The physical state always evolves in the usual deterministic way, but each mind evolves randomly (with probabilities determined by the particular mind's current mental state and the evolution of the global quantum-mechanical state). On the mental dynamics that they describe, one should expect a-squared of J's minds to end up associated with the result "spin up" (the first term of E) and b-squared of J's minds to end up associated with the result "spin down" (the second term of E). The mental dynamics is also stipulated to be memory-preserving.

An advantage of this theory over the many-worlds theory is that there is no physically preferred basis. To be sure, one must choose a preferred basis in order to specify the mental dynamics completely (something that Albert and Loewer never completely specify), but as Albert and Loewer point out, this choice has absolutely nothing to do with any physical facts; rather, it can be thought of as part of the description of the relationship between physical and mental states. Another advantage of the many-minds theory is that, unlike the many-worlds theory, it really does make the usual probabilistic predictions for the future experiences of a particular mind (this, of course, requires that one take the minds to have transtemporal identities, which Albert and Loewer do as part of their unabashed commitment to a strong mind-body dualism). And finally, it is one of the few formulations of quantum mechanics that is manifestly compatible with special relativity. (For a discussion of why it is difficult to solve the quantum measurement problem under the constraints of relativity see Barrett 2000 and 2002, for discussions of locality in the many minds theory, see Hemmo and Pitowski, 2001, and Bacciagaluppi, 2002, and for the relationship between relativity and the many worlds theory see Bacciagaluppi 2002.)

The main problems with the many-minds theory concern its commitment to a strong mind-body dualism and the question of whether the sort of mental supervenience one gets is worth the trouble of postulating a continuous infinity of minds associated with each observer. Concerning the latter, one might well conclude that a single-mind theory, where each observer has one mind that evolves randomly given the evolution of the standard quantum mechanical state, would be preferable. (See Albert, 1992, Donald, 1997 (in Other Internet Resources section), and Barrett, 1995 and 1999, for more details and criticism; for a broader discussion see Lockwood, 1989 and 1996.)

Both the single-mind and many-minds theories can be thought of as hidden-variable theories like Bohmian mechanics. (See the entry on Bohmian mechanics.) But instead of position being made determinate, as it is in Bohm's theory, and then hoping that the determinate positions of particles will provide observers with determinate measurement records, it is the mental states of the observers that are directly made determinate here, and while this is a non-physical parameter, it is guaranteed to provide observers with determinate measurement records.

7. Many Histories

Gell-Mann and Hartle (1990) understand Everett's theory as one that describes many, mutually decohering histories. The main difference between this approach and the many-worlds interpretation is that, instead of stipulating a preferred basis, here one relies on the physical interactions between a physical system and its environment (the way in which the quantum-mechanical states become correlated) to effectively choose what physical quantity is determinate at each time for each system.

One problem concerns whether and in what sense environmental interactions can select a physically preferred basis for the entire universe, which is what we presumably need in order to make sense of Everett's formulation. After all, in order to be involved in environmental interactions a system must have an environment, and the universe, by definition, has no environment. And if one considers subsystems of the universe, the environment of each subsystem would presumably select a different preferred physical observable (at least slightly different for each decohering system). Another problem is that it is unclear that the environment-selected determinate quantity at a time is a quantity that would explain our determinate measurement records and experience. Proponents who argue for this approach often appeal to biological or evolutionary arguments to justify the assumption that sentient beings must record their beliefs in terms of the environment-selected (or decohering) physical properties. (See Gell-Mann and Hartle, 1990, and Zurek, 1991, for this sort of argument.) The short story is that it is not yet clear how the account of our determinate experience is suppose to work when one relies on decoherence to select a preferred basis. (See Dowker and Kent, 1996, for an extended discussion of some of the problems one encounters in such an approach.)

It is worth noting that if one allows oneself the luxury of stipulating a preferred basis (more specifically a basis where every observer's measurement records are in fact determinate, whatever that is), one can construct a many-histories theory from Albert and Loewer's many-minds theory even without the requirement that the histories mutually decohere. Take the trajectory of each of a specific observer's minds to describe the history of a possible physical world. One might then stipulate a measure over the set of all possible histories (trajectories) that would represent the prior probability of each history actually describing our world. These prior probabilities might then be Bayesian updated as one learns more about the actual history of our world. This is a version of something called the many-threads theory in Barrett (1999). Since such worlds (and everything in them) would have transtemporal identities, unlike the many-worlds theory, there would be no special problem here in talking about probabilities concerning one's future experience — the quantum probabilities in such a theory might naturally be interpreted as epistemic probabilities.

It is instructive to consider the relationship between a no-collapse hidden-variable theory like Bohmian mechanics and a many-worlds theory like the many-threads theory. In Bohmian mechanics the wave function always evolves in the usual deterministic way, but particles are taken to always have fully determinate positions. For an N-particle system, the particle configuration can be thought of as being pushed around in 3N-dimensional configuration space by the flow of the norm squared of the wave function just as a massless particle would be pushed around by a compressible fluid (the compressible fluid here is the probability distribution in configuration space given by the standard wave function). Here both the evolution of the wave function and the evolution of the particle configuration are fully deterministic. Quantum probabilities are the result of the distribution postulate. The distribution postulate sets the initial prior probability distribution equal to the norm squared of the wave function for an initial time. One learns what the new effective wave function is from one's measurement results, but one never knows more than what is allowed by the standard quantum statistics. Indeed, Bohm's theory always predicts the standard quantum probabilities for particle configurations, but it predicts these as epistemic probabilities. Bohm's theory is supposed to give determinate measurement results in terms of determinate particle configurations (say the position of the pointer on a measuring device). See Barrett (1999) and the entry on Bohmian mechanics for more details about Bohmian mechanics.

If one chooses position as the preferred physical observable and adopts the particle dynamics of Bohm's theory, then one can construct a version of the many-threads theory by fixing a single Hamiltonian and by considering every possible initial configuration of particles to correspond to a different thread (world). Here the prior probabilities are given by the distribution postulate in Bohm's theory, and these probabilities are Bayesian updated on the results of measurements. The updated epistemic probabilities yield the effective Bohmian wave function. So the only difference between Bohm's theory and the associated many-threads theory is that the many-threads theory treats all possible Bohmian worlds as simultaneously existing worlds, only one of which is ours. A many-threads theory can be constructed for virtually any determinate physical quantity just as one would construct a hidden-variable or a modal theory. (See the entry on modal interpretations of quantum theory.)

If something like the many-minds theory or the many-thread theory is what it takes to get determinate measurement records and the standard quantum probabilities in a formulation of Everett, then fixing Everett amounts to adding a hidden-variable to quantum mechanics, mental states in the former theory and the preferred observable in the latter. It is the determinate value of this so-called hidden variable that determines our determinate measurement records, and it is the dynamics of this variable together with the prior probabilities that yields the standard quantum statistics. But Everett himself presumably did not intend a hidden-variable theory.

8. Relative Facts, Correlations without Correlata, and Relational Quantum Mechanics

Perhaps the approach closest in spirit to Everett's relative-state formulation would be simply to deny that there are typically any absolute matters of fact about the properties of physical systems or the records, experiences, and beliefs of observers. (See Saunders, 1995, and Mermin, 1998, for examples of how this might work.) In the experiment above, quantum mechanics would not describe J as believing that his result was "spin up", and it would not describe J as believing that his result was "spin down"; rather, on this sort of theory all quantum-mechanical facts would be relative and all quantum probabilities would describe basic correlations, not the correlata on which one might have thought the correlations would supervene. Here quantum mechanical facts are not relative to a particular world, mind, or history, but relative to each other: Here J believes that his result was "spin up" relative to S being x-spin up and J believes that his result was "spin down" relative to S being x-spin down. But, one might ask, what is the state of S then? Well, S is x-spin up relative to J believing that his result was "spin up", etc. Again, on this sort of theory there are typically no absolute matters of fact about the properties of individual physical systems. (For a related approach, which however does not imply a multiplicity of properties, see Rovelli, 1996, and the entry on relational quantum mechanics.)

Here, rather than account for determinate measurement records, one simply denies that there is any matter of fact concerning what an observer's measurement record is. Which means that insofar as one believes that there really is a simple matter of fact about what one got in a particular measurement, a relative-fact formulation of quantum mechanics provides no account of one's experience. Similarly, one cannot make sense of the usual statistical predictions of quantum mechanics insofar as one takes these to be predictions concerning the probability that a particular measurement outcome will in fact occur. Again, there are typically no such simple facts in such a theory. This is why, on this view, all quantum probabilities concern correlations, not correlata. But it is difficult to interpret probabilistic claims about correlations in the context of a theory that denies that there are determinate correlata to be correlated. That is, one might have thought that any coherent talk about the probabilistic correlations between events presupposes that there are determinate matters of fact concerning what events occur.

One reply to such objections would be to claim that accounting for our determinate measurement records is simply outside the proper domain of quantum mechanics. Since our measurement results are presumably recorded in the states of physical systems, this would be to take quantum mechanics to not apply to all physical systems. But to take this view would be to fall prey to Everett's initial complaint about the external collapse formulation of quantum mechanics not being applicable to systems containing measuring devices. Or one might reply that there really are no determinate measurement records. But this would require an explanation for why we seem to have fully determinate measurement records. Also, we presumably want a physical theory that is empirically coherent: As we saw with the bare theory, if one does not have reliable access to determinate measurement records, then it is unclear how empirical science is possible.

9. Summary

Such are some of the ways of understanding Everett's relative-state formulation of quantum mechanics. It will probably never be entirely clear precisely what Everett himself had in mind, but his goal of trying to make sense of quantum mechanics without the collapse postulate was heroic. And even in light of the problems one faces, puzzling over how one might reconstruct Everett's theory continues to hold promise.


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quantum mechanics | quantum mechanics: Bohmian mechanics | quantum mechanics: many-worlds interpretation of | quantum mechanics: modal interpretations of | quantum mechanics: relational | quantum theory: measurement in