Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Pragmatic Arguments for Belief in God

1. Translated by W.K.C. Guthrie.

2. Some commentators read the Will-to-Believe essay as advancing a truth-dependent argument.

3. My analysis here is influenced by (Gale 1990: 358).

4. On the many-gods objection to Pascal's Wager, see (Jordan 2002: 219-23).

5. I do not suggest that this brief argument is a complete summary of Gale's detailed objection to James.

6. This is obvious to consequentialist eyes, and, arguably, plausible (even if not obvious) to any who hold that moral duties are defeasible.

7. See (Somerville 1995: 1, 76-94).

8. This point is made in (Stove 2003: 34).

9. Is (12) well supported? Two commentators (neither of whom could be called theistic apologists) characterize the relevant social science literature as “…a huge, and growing literature that finds religion to be a reliable source of better mental and even physical health… regardless of the age, sex, race, ethnicity, nationality, or time period of the population being studies”. (Stark and Fink 2000: 31-2). See also (Koenig, McCullough, and Larson 2001).

10. For a discussion concerning the various kinds of rationality and the relations among them, see (Moser 1985: 211-38); for an objection to this idea see (Feldman 2000: 693-95).