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Original Position

First published Tue Feb 27, 1996; substantive revision Tue Apr 8, 2003

The idea of the original position is perhaps the most lasting contribution of John Rawls to our theorizing about social justice. The original position is a hypothetical situation in which rational calculators, acting as agents or trustees for the interests of concrete individuals, are pictured as choosing those principles of social relations under which their principals would do best. Their choices are subject to certain constraints, however, and it is these constraints which embody the specifically moral elements of original position argumentation. Crudely, the rational calculators do not know facts about their principals which would be morally irrelevant to the choice of principles of justice. This restriction on their reasoning is embodied, picturesquely, in Rawls's so-called veil of ignorance, which occludes information, for instance, about principals’ age, sex, religious beliefs, etc. Once this information about principals is unavailable to their agents, the plurality of interested parties disappears, and the problem of choice is rendered determinate. (Because each individual's trustee has the same information and motivation as every other individual's trustee, the original position is a situation of choice, not of "negotiation" between a plurality of distinct individuals.) According to Rawls, agents so situated would choose two principles of justice, lexically ordered, affirming the equality of basic rights and an approach to social inequalities governed by the difference principle, according to which inequalities are unjust unless removing them would worsen the situations of the worst-off members of society. Original position argumentation is an example of contemporary contractualism, involves a pure-proceduralist approach to the determination of moral principles, and is framed by reflective equilibration with widely agreed principles of public morality. It also illustrates the pragmatism of Rawls's approach to political theorizing.

1. Reflective Equilibrium

There are epistemological and political interpretations of the original position.

On the epistemological reading, the original position is a methodological device for ridding the ethico-political observer of hindrances to h/er clear and distinct perception of ethico-political facts. Just as it may be necessary to employ prosthetic sensory devices to make observations of distant or minute objects or to use techniques of controlled experimentation to eliminate the influence of "noise" and theoretically irrelevant confounding variables, so too, on this reading, might it be necessary, in order clearly to observe the ethico-political facts, to use some such device as the original position. Indeed, the original position might be well adapted to such a task. Eliminating knowledge of personal characteristics eliminates the possibility of bias in favor of those characteristics and thus enforces the kind of impartiality or disinterestedness that is held to be integral to a moral perspective. (In this regard, as Rawls himself recognized, the original position device resembles that of ideal spectator theorists.)

This epistemological reading was nevertheless not the interpretation of the original position favored by Rawls himself. Although he did not repudiate the kind of ethico-political realism that is presupposed by this reading, he believed that, since realism in this sense is a reasonably disputed doctrine, a practical approach to the task of political justification must prescind from the realism/non-realism debate within political meta-theory. Since there is reasonable disagreement about realism, we cannot presuppose it in the context of public political disputation. (On account of the burdens of judgment, we cannot expect to resolve the debate about realism to the (reasonable) satisfaction of every reasonable person; this doctrine therefore cannot provide a basis for political theorizing.)

On the political reading, the original position is a device of representation. Specifically, it represents, in the veil of ignorance, widely accepted constraints on the choice of principles of justice. More concretely, the veil of ignorance embodies the concept of justice--i.e. the idea that distributions should not be based on morally irrelevant features. (Those who reject this concept--and what it implies for original position argumentation--are, in other words, not part of our moral community.) The information occluded by the veil of ignorance is, precisely, the community's understanding of what features are morally irrelevant to the choice of principles of justice. Although members of a given community may disagree about many matters relevant to issues of justice, they share--or are alleged or assumed to share--an understanding of justice that, while insufficiently concrete or detailed to provide on its own a workable conception of justice, is adequate to the task of framing the choice of such a conception. Working within the framework defined by the veil of ignorance and derived from this widely shared concept of justice, rational calculators choose principles of justice on the basis of their fiduciary duty to the concrete individuals whom they represent. Their choice is not of an objectively correct conception of justice; it is, rather, of that conception which is best fit to play a certain kind of social role in the community whose members are represented in the original position.

Rawls's idea of reflective equilibrium expressed this political understanding of justification, though in rather a more complicated way than is usually thought. How are we to justify the claim that some particular conception of justice is the appropriate one? We are to do so, according to Rawls, by finding that conception which is best fit to play the role of adjudicating competing claims on scarce social resources (and of facilitating mutually beneficial exchanges). And how are we to judge fitness for this purpose? No conception of justice can play such a role unless there is widespread "up-take" of its basic principles and deliverances. Hence, we see, for each candidate conception, whether its implications can be brought into reflective equilibrium with the considered judgments of justice which are current in a particular community. If they cannot, then up-take will not be secured and the conception cannot mediate conflict and facilitate mutual benefit. (This is what distinguishes principled reasoning about justice, even in a "pragmatic mode" from the modus vivendi argumentation that Rawls himself repudiated.) Of course, the process of reflective equilibration is dialectical. The main moments of the process are these.

These operations are repeated until eliminable divergence is at a minimum; this is the state of reflective equilibrium. Individuals' concrete and specific judgments about justice are in equilibrium with those of other individuals, and all individuals in the community share both an abstract concept of justice (embodied in the veil) and a workable public conception of justice.

Early discussants assumed that the method of reflective equilibration was to be understood epistemologically. Even in A Theory of Justice, there was much textual support for the alternative political reading, but, whatever the situation in the early 1970s, it soon became clear that Rawls's preferred reading was indeed the political one. There are two stories about the development of Rawls's thinking. On the one hand, some commentators believe that Rawls had adopted an epistemological, specifically Kantian, approach to ethico-political justification in his earlier work, at least up to A Theory of Justice, which he then abandoned under the pressure of communitarian, specifically Hegelian, criticism at the hands, in particular, of Michael Sandel. On the other hand, some commentators believe that Rawls's position, at least since A Theory of Justice, remained resolutely political, and that any genuine development of his thought was prompted by considerations internal to his own perspective. (Rawls seems, in Political Liberalism, to endorse this latter reading of the history.)

For the mature Rawls (and perhaps too for the Rawls of A Theory of Justice), all ethico-political justification, in public contexts, is unavoidably politically rather than epistemologically based. It is based, in other words, on an overlapping consensus of the main substantive ethico-political doctrines current in a community. (The consensus is not a modus vivendi, on Rawls's account; it is a principled basis for collective life and it depends, in effect, on there being a morally significant core of commitments common to the "reasonable" fragment of each of the main comprehensive doctrines in the community.) Absent such a basis for consensus, there is no possibility of discovering, via reflective equilibration, principles of justice which can, because there is adequate up-take, effectively regulate interactions between and distributions to the members of the community. And since such disagreement would make improbable any uncoerced acceptance of some epistemologically sanctioned set of principles, no voluntaristic basis for social justice could be found in this community--even if an objective basis could be.

2. Pure Proceduralism

The method of original position argumentation is an example of pure proceduralism in ethico-political theorizing. This aspect of Rawls's work seems not to have been adequately conceptualized, but it is crucial for understanding larger issues.

Imagine that there is for a particular community a public conception of the good. In this case, it might be possible to develop rules for the distribution of goods and services on a broadly teleological basis. That is right (whether action or distribution or institution) whose implementation maximizes the realization of the good. Of course, the availability of a public conception of the good is not, perhaps, a sufficient condition for the viability of such a teleological approach. Even given such a conception, a teleological approach may still be insufficiently sensitive to distributional issues. And, indeed, this is one reason why Rawls rejected a teleological approach to ethico-political justification. But Rawls also argued on other grounds against a teleological approach. In particular, he thought that no such approach is viable (i) because the availability of a public conception of the good is a necessary condition for the viability of such an approach, and (ii) because there is no such public conception of the good in our society and in societies like it.

If we cannot develop ethico-political principles of right and justice on a teleological basis, then how can we do so? According to Rawls, we can do so via original position argumentation, framed with considerations of reflective equilibrium. That is right and just which would be acknowledged as such from the point of view of the original position. And what makes being acknowledged from this point of view the right-maker for principles of justice? Because this point of view is the appropriate one for determining principles of justice, on account of its reflecting the community's existing concept of justice--on account of its reflecting their overlapping consensus of views about justice.

Notice that there is no teleological reasoning at work here. The right-maker for principles of justice is not defined in terms of the consequences for the realization of the good of conformity with those principles. The right-maker is (hypothetical) acceptance from a particular point of view. The right-maker for principles, in other words, is their being the output of a particular procedure, in particular the procedure of original position argumentation. The reasoners in the original position are not trying, through their deliberations, to ensure an outcome that meets some already existing standard of justice for institutions. Why not? Because there is no such standard until it is constructed by their deliberation. And there is no such standard because there is pre-existing consensus within the community on neither a conception of the good--which, were it to exist, might permit a perfectly or imperfectly procedural approach to determining the principles of right, nor a full-blown conception of justice--which, were it to exist, would render any further reasoning otiose.

3. Veil of Ignorance

Far and away the most striking feature of Rawls's original position idea is the veil of ignorance. As Rawls pointed out, the idea of an initial situation of choice for ethico-political principles is common to other approaches, and represents a hypotheticalization of familiar reasoning within the social contract tradition. What is particularly interesting about Rawls's approach is that he proposed to restrict the basis for reasoning rather than expanding it, which is, for instance, the approach taken within the ideal spectator framework.

Crudely, ideal-spectator theorists make two theoretical moves which Rawls more or less reversed. Recognizing that ethico-political thinking ought to be conducted from an impartial perspective, ideal-spectator theorists capture this notion of impartiality by amalgamating ethically-relevant information about all relevant parties--e.g. all the members of some community, and by assuming that the spectator in whom this information is lodged makes h/er determination of principles on an equitable basis--e.g. in assigning equal weights to information about the preferences of individuals. There are various reasons for wondering whether this procedure is really a coherent one. Most notably, assumptions about the spectator's ability to store and synthesize information and calculate on its basis are wildly unrealistic. (See Cherniak 1986.) Furthermore, the spectator's calculations not only permit, they force h/er to reckon inter-personal gains and losses in the same way that a purely prudential self-interested reasoner would reckon intra-personal gains and losses. This is problematic for two reasons, one of which Rawls himself emphasized. First of all, and this is Rawls's primary objection, such a procedure forces the spectator to sacrifice one individual's interests to those of others, theoretically without limit, whenever doing so would result in the maximization of the total the spectator is calculating. Secondly, the idea is suspect, to say the least, that there is some basis for the commensuration of individuals’ diverse ways of valuing that would permit the determination of some socially valid aggregate for each of the various states of affairs which are being evaluated. (See D'Agostino 2003.)

Crudely, Rawls hoped to avoid these difficulties by reversing the moves of the spectator theorist. Instead of augmenting the information available to choosers, Rawls deliberately impoverished it. Instead of requiring choosers to be impartial, he required them to be purely self-interested--though, of course, in an extended sense; his choosers act to advance the interests of their principals. And by requiring unanimity among the various trustees or agents, Rawls ensured that individuals’ interests are not sacrificed to that of the collective; each individual can veto, through h/er agent/trustee, any social settlement that isn't adequately respectful of h/er individuality. The veil of ignorance is of importance in this context. It ensures impartiality, despite the self-interestedness of the choosers, by preventing them, through lack of knowledge, from choosing in accordance with partial perspectives that might be favored by their principals. My agent A cannot hold out for some social settlement that favors people with those characteristics; s/he doesn't know what they are. S/he will therefore have to protect my interests, as s/he must as their trustee, only by holding out for a social settlement in which no one's interests are given short shrift. H/er impartiality is a product of h/er self-interestedness plus h/er ignorance. And the latter, crucial to this procedure, is a product of the veil of ignorance.

This account of matters also enables us to clear up a confusion that was often voiced in the first few years after the publication of A Theory of Justice. It was said that Rawls had sought--as others such as David Gauthier do seek--to reduce ethico-political principles of right to principles of prudence. This on account of the purely self-interested deliberations of choosers in the original position. What this suggestion ignores is that, though the choosers reason in a purely prudential way, their reasoning is constrained by their ignorance, and their ignorance is expressive of the moral demand for impartiality. There is nothing reductionist about Rawls's reasoning, then.

4. Rawls's Pragmatism

The story I've told about A Theory of Justice is reasonably familiar. What this story ignores, however, is an aspect of Rawls's total project in A Theory of Justice that is of considerable significance in providing a model for pragmatically-oriented theorizing in ethics and politics across a range of issues. This is, specifically, Rawls's analysis, in sections 22 and 23 of A Theory, of the circumstances of justice and of the formal constraints on our understanding of justice. The basic ideas are obvious enough, if not much discussed, and a short summary (and amplification) will therefore suffice.

First of all, we need to understand that Rawls was trying to determine, in effect, which principles of sociability are fit to play a certain role in the organization of our collective lives. His analysis of justice was therefore not a conceptual analysis, but, rather, an exercise in ‘arm-chair’ social theory. The question is not, or anyway isn't exhausted by: What is the current understanding of justice in our society? The question is, rather: What sort of understanding of justice, if it were propagated and if there were ‘up-take’ by most citizens, would function effectively in the circumstances which make such an understanding socially important. Rawls's analysis was, then, what I will call pragmatic, not conceptual. Rawls put this clearly enough, I think (Rawls 1999: pp. 102-3):

The intuitive idea of justice as fairness is to think of the first principles of justice as themselves the object of an original agreement in a suitably defined initial situation. These principles are those which rational persons concerned to advance their interests would accept in this position of equality to settle the basic terms of their association. It must be shown, then, that the two principles of justice are the solution for the problem of choice presented by the original position. In order to do this, one must establish that, given the circumstances of the parties, and their knowledge, beliefs, and interests, an agreement on these principles is the best way for each person to secure his ends in view of the alternatives available. (Emphasis added)

It is, I repeat, a fact about how principles might function that justifies the choice of these principles as principles of social coordination for our society. That they enable "each person to secure his ends", subject to certain circumstances, conditions, and constraints, is their justification, not that they reflect some antecedent understanding of what justice is, metaphysically or conceptually. (This, by the way, shows why Rawls's approach is not subject, or at least is not subject for the reasons which are usually adduced, to the charge that it provides inadequate ethical leverage against such existing understandings of justice as may, of course, reflect ideological thinking. Rawls's approach is meant, specifically, to correct for mistaken understandings that might nevertheless be widely diffused. And the basis for correction is, of course, a pragmatic one: How well does this understanding facilitate the achievement of certain goals?)

In view of how little comment this aspect of Rawls's approach has attracted--that is, its pragmatic orientation, it is difficult to exaggerate the importance of these considerations, not only for Rawls's specific project, but, indeed, for ethico-political theorizing in general. From a pragmatic point of view, the question is, always, What is good in the way of belief? How can our aims as individuals and collectively best be promoted by our system of beliefs and practices? This methodological readjustment is, I think, a contribution of Rawlsianism to our thinking in these areas that is truly revolutionary in potential.

Let's see, in detail and with some amendments, how pragmatic analysis works in relation to normative concepts and principles. Rawls explicitly identified two sorts of considerations that are relevant to such analysis and implies a third.

First of all, Rawls noted that, in order to determine what sort of principles might be fit to play a certain role, we must understand what circumstances make it necessary to develop and propagate such principles. And the reasoning, largely implicit in Rawls, is obvious enough. Suppose, for instance, that scarcity of supply relative to demand for "social primary goods", in Rawls's terminology, is characteristic of our situation. This is part of what makes the propagation of distributional principles and practices necessary: given scarcity and certain other factors, people will not collectively and automatically self-equilibrate to ensure that demand does not out-strip supply. But, of course, this fact must also be taken account of in the development of precisely these principles, which, in particular, will not be fit to play the role of justice if they just assume away the problem of distribution by presupposing, for instance, that individuals will spontaneously adjust their demands to the supply available to fulfill them. (Bruce Ackerman's account, in Social Justice in the Liberal State, is particularly clear on the importance of these circumstances.)

Secondly, Rawls noted that, in order to determine what sort of principles might be fit to play a certain role, we must understand what (formal) constraints on such principles are reasonable to impose, at least tentatively, as an expression of the function which we expect such principles to discharge. (Given the pragmatism of Rawls's approach, the epithet ‘formal’ was, I think, unfortunate.) Again, the reasoning is obvious. If we expect principles of justice to play a role in settling certain sorts of disputes that might arise in our society, then, obviously, they will have to exhibit certain sorts of features. One of Rawls's constraints is, of course, that "a conception of right must impose an ordering on conflicting claims", a requirement which, according to Rawls, whose pragmatism was plainly in evidence here, "springs directly from the roles of its principles in adjusting competing demands". (If we are in dispute and appeal to ‘the right’ as a basis for settling our dispute, but it, ‘the right’, fails to order our claims, then it contributes nothing to settling the dispute we'd tried to use it, as a tool, to settle.)

Finally, I note, distinguishing what Rawls himself had run together, that, in order to determine what sort of principles might be fit to play a certain role, we must understand what capacities and attitudes human beings are likely to bring to the situations, in which these principles might be deployed, that will support their deployment in those situations. (This is the ‘possible’ aspect of Rawls's analysis of the "normal conditions under which human cooperation is both possible and necessary".) In this case, principles and practices cannot be propagated, let alone play a role in adjusting people's relations with one another, if, for instance, there is some (relatively) insuperable barrier, cognitive, affective or institutional, to their successful uptake. (Rawls's analysis of ‘feasibility considerations’ in Part Three of A Theory of Justice is directed, in part, to an examination of these sorts of issues.) It is argued in D'Agostino 1996, for instance, that the ‘reasonableness’ of individuals is, in this sense, a capacity, or perhaps an attitude, that needs to be widespread in a given community if certain sorts of social relations are to be possible in that community. This, I will say, is a condition for justice.

It is circumstances, conditions, and constraints, in the senses identified, that play a crucial and largely unnoticed role in Rawls's pragmatic/functionalist analysis of justice. In short, we try to identify principles of justice such that:

Notice, in particular, that an analysis conducted on these terms cannot possibly be confused with conceptual analysis, no matter how loosely that ideal is interpreted. Although there may be certain ‘conceptual’ elements involved in articulating the constraints on justice, even in this case functions are to the fore--What do we want to use the principles (and practices) of justice to do? And, certainly, claims about the conditions for and circumstances of justice are, although usually highly abstract and general, matters of fact rather than matters of meaning. We are trying to design a tool for use by certain kinds of agents to accomplish certain sorts of purposes in a certain kind of environment, and our problem is one of practical functional design, not of conceptual analysis or metaphysical speculation about The Good or The Right.


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