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Medieval Theories of Modality

First published Wed Jun 30, 1999; substantive revision Thu Jul 31, 2003

There are four modal paradigms in ancient philosophy: the ‘statistical’ or ‘temporal frequency interpretation’ of modality, the model of possibility as a potency, the model of antecedent necessities and possibilities with respect to a certain moment of time (diachronic modalities), and the model of possibility as non-contradictoriness. None of these conceptions, which were well known to early medieval thinkers through the works of Boethius, was associated with the idea of modality as involving reference to simultaneous alternatives. This new paradigm was introduced into Western thought in early twelfth-century discussions influenced by Augustine's theological conception of God as acting by choice between alternative histories. Ancient habits of thinking continued to play an important role in scholasticism, however, and the theoretical significance of the new conception was not fully realized before the works of John Duns Scotus and some other early fourteenth century thinkers.

1. Aspects of Ancient Modal Paradigms

In speaking about the general features of the universe, ancient philosophers were inclined to think that all generic possibilities will be actualized, a habit of thinking called the principle of plenitude by Arthur O. Lovejoy (1936). Correspondingly, it was natural for them to think that the types of things which never occur are impossible and that the invariant structures of reality are necessary. This line of thought is found, e.g., in Plato's doctrine of ideas which are exhaustively imitated in the Receptacle, in Aristotle's theory of the priority of actuality over potentiality, in the Stoic doctrine of God, the world-order, and the eternal cosmic cycle, and in Plotinus's metaphysics of emanation (Knuuttila 1993).

In these approaches to the constituents of the universe, modal terms are used in accordance with the so-called ‘statistical’ or ‘temporal frequency’ model of modality where the meaning of modal terms is spelled out extensionally as follows: what is necessary is always actual, what is impossible is never actual and what is possible is at least sometimes actual. The term ‘statistical interpretation of modality’ was introduced into the modern discussion by Oscar Becker (1952), and it has been applied since in descriptions of certain ways of thinking in the history of philosophy as well, particularly by Jaakko Hintikka (1973).

Even though Aristotle did not define modal terms with the help of extensional notions, this model can be found in his discussion of eternal beings, the natures of things, the types of events, or generic statements about such things. Modal terms refer to the one and only world of ours and classify the types of things and events on the basis of their occurrence. This paradigm suggests that actualization is the general criterion of the genuineness of possibilities, but the deterministic implications of this view compelled Aristotle to seek ways of speaking about unrealized singular possibilities. Diodorus Chronus (fl. 300 B.C.) was a determinist who found no problem in this way of thinking. (For different interpretations and evaluations of the role of this model in Aristotle, see Hintikka 1973, Sorabji 1980, Seel 1982, Waterlow 1982a, White 1985, van Rijen 1989, Gaskin 1995.) In Posterior Analytics I.6 Aristotle says that certain predicates may belong to their subjects at all times without belonging to them necessarily. Some commentators have taken this to mean that Aristotle operated with a distinction between strong essential per se necessities and weak accidental necessities in the sense of non-essential invariances and that this distinction played an important role in his modal syllogistic (van Rijen 1989). This was also the view of Averroes and his followers in the Middle Ages (Lagerlund 2000). Aristotle apparently regarded the necessity of the so-called inseparable accidents as different from the necessity of per se predication, but he did not explicitly discuss this distinction. (For inseparable accidents, see Porphyry, Isagoge, 5). Post. an I.6 is one of the texts some modern scholars have referred to in arguing that Aristotle's views showing similarities to the statistical model are not based on the meaning of modal terms but on some special metaphysical and ontological doctrines (van Rijen 1989; cf. Waterlow 1982a).

Another Aristotelian modal paradigm was that of possibility as potency. In Met. V.12 and IX.1 potency is said to be the principle of motion or change either as the activator or as the receptor of a relevant influence. (For agent and patient in Aristotle's natural philosophy in general, see Waterlow 1982b.) The types of potency-based possibilities belonging to a species are recognized as possibilities because of their actualization - no natural potency type remains eternally frustrated. Aristotle says that when the agent and the patient come together as being capable, the one must act and the other must be acted on (Met. IX.5). I shall return to this formulation.

In De Caelo I.12 Aristotle supposes, per impossibile, that a thing has contrary potencies, one of which is always actualized. He argues that the alleged unactualized potencies cannot be real, because one cannot assume them to be realized at any time without contradiction. Aristotle applies here the model of possibility as non-contradictoriness which is defined in Prior Analytics I.13 as follows: when a possibility is assumed to be realized, it results in nothing impossible. In speaking about the assumed non-contradictory actualization of a possibility Aristotle thinks that it is realized in our one and only history. The argument in De caelo excludes from the set of genuine possibilities those which remain eternally unrealized. It also shows how strongly Aristotle's modal thought was influenced by the absence of the idea of synchronic alternatives. (See also Met. IX.4.)

Aristotle heavily criticized some of his contemporaries who claimed that only that which takes place is possible (Met. IX.3). His problem was that the assumptions of his modal thinking pushed him towards a very similar position with respect to singular possibilities. In Chapter 9 of De interpretatione Aristotle says that what is necessarily is when it is, but he then qualifies this necessity of the present with the remark that it does not follow that what is actual is necessary without qualification. If he meant that the temporal necessity of a present event does not imply that such an event necessarily takes place in circumstances of that type, this is an unsatisfactory attempt to avoid the problem that changeability as a criterion of contingency makes all temporally definite singular events necessary (Hintikka 1973). Another possibility is that Aristotle wanted to show that the necessity of an event at a certain time does not imply that it would have been antecedently necessary (von Wright 1984). The remark on the necessity of the present is included in Aristotle's discussion of future contingent statements which is one of the most controversial themes of Aristotle's philosophy. The model of possibility as potency prima facie allowed Aristotle to speak about all kinds of unrealized singular possibilities by referring to passive or active potencies, but taken separately they represent partial possibilities which do not guarantee that their actualization can take place. More is required for a real singular possibility, but when the further requirements are added, such as a contact between the active and passive factor and the absence of an external hindrance, the potency model suggests that the potency can really be actualized only when a change towards its end is initiated (Met. IX.5, Phys. VIII.1). Some scholars have referred to the diachronic idea that the conditions which at t1 (t1<t2) are necessary for the obtaining of ‘p’ at t2 are not necessarily sufficient for the obtaining of ‘p’ though they are sufficient for the possibility (at t1) that ‘p’ obtains at t2 (Gaskin 1995). Unfortunately Aristotle seldom was that explicit. Some others have paid attention to Aristotle's definition of the time-taking process (kinêsis) as the actuality of the potentiality (of the end) qua potentiality (Phys. III.1), but this did not help him more than offering a place for full singular possibilities of what will be (Hintikka et al. 1977).

Aristotle's conceptual difficulties can be seen from his various attempts to characterize the possibilities based on dispositional properties such as heatable, separable, or countable. Analogous discussions were not unusual in later ancient philosophy. In Philo's definition of possibility (ca. 300 B.C.), the existence of a passive potency was regarded as a sufficient ground for speaking about a singular possibility. The Stoics revised this definition by adding the condition of the absence of external hindrance, thinking that otherwise the alleged possibility could not be realized. They did not add that an activator is needed as well, because then the difference between potentiality and actuality would disappear. According to the deterministic Stoic world view, fate as a kind of active potency necessitates everything, but the number of passive potencies with respect to a definite future instant of time (t1) is greater than what will be realized. As long as these possibilities are not prevented from being realized by other things which will be actual at t1, they in some sense represent open possibilities. When t1 is present, all unrealized possibilities are prevented from being actualized by other things. (The Stoics did not accept the Master Argument of Diodorus Cronus against possibilities which will not be realized.) Passive potencies as alternative prospective possibilities show what might happen at a certain moment, but because everything is determined, the alternatives seem to be only epistemic possibilities relative to our ignorance. (For different interpretations of the Stoic and Megarian conceptions of modality, see Vuillemin 1984, White 1985, Bobzien 1986, Engberg-Pedersen 1990, Bobzien 1993, Gaskin 1995.)

Alexander of Aphrodisias claimed in De fato that the Peripatetics, as distinct from the Stoics, thought that there are genuine prospective alternatives which remain open options until the moment of time to which they refer. It was the Stoic doctrine of future alternatives which led Alexander to consider diachronic modalities which he then tried to interpret in a different way (Sharples 1983). Aristotle sometimes referred to diachronic modalities of this kind (Met. VI.3), but he did not elaborate this idea, which might have been his most promising attempt to formulate a theory of unrealized singular possibilities. (The importance of this model is particularly stressed in Waterlow 1982a; see also Weidemann 1986, Gaskin 1995.) Neither Aristotle nor his followers had any conception of synchronic alternatives. They thought that what is necessarily is when it is, and that the alternative possibilities disappear when the future is fixed. The Peripatetic theory of alternative prospective possibilities could be called the model of diachronic modalities without synchronic alternatives: there are transient singular alternative possibilities, but those which will not be realized disappear instead of remaining unrealized.

In some places Aristotle thought that for the purposes of argument one can separate things in thought even though they are inseparable in the world. One can think that something belongs of necessity to something as a particular composite of matter and form, but contingently as an instance of a species or a genus. This merely theoretical contingency is isolated from the concrete conditions of things (van Rijen 1989). Counterfactual hypotheses of this kind were not uncommon in late ancient philosophy. As abstract constructions they were not regarded as formulations of possibilities in the sense of what could be actual and were called impossible hypotheses (Martin 1999).

2. Early Medieval Developments

The early medieval thinkers were well acquainted with ancient modal conceptions through Boethius's works. One of the Aristotelian modal paradigms occurring in Boethius is that of possibility as potency (potestas, potentia). According to Boethius, when the term ‘possibility’ (possibilitas) is applied in the sense of ‘potency’, it refers to real powers or tendencies, the ends of which are either actual or non-actual at the moment of utterance. Some potencies are never unrealized. They are said to be necessarily actual. When potencies are not actualized, their ends are said to exist potentially (In Periherm. II.453-455). Necessarily actual potencies leave no room for the potencies of their contraries, for they would remain unrealized forever and the constitution of nature cannot include elements which would be in vain (In Periherm. II. 236, 243). The potencies of non-necessary features of being do not exclude contrary potencies. They are not always and universally actualized, but as potency-types even these potencies are taken to satisfy the actualization criterion of genuineness (In Periherm. I.120-1, II.237).

Boethius's view that the types of potencies and potency based possibilities are sometimes actualized is in agreement with the Aristotelian statistical interpretation of modality. This is another Boethian conception of necessity and possibility. He thought that modal notions can be regarded as tools for expressing temporal or generic frequencies. According to the temporal version, what always is is by necessity, and what never is is impossible. Possibility is interpreted as expressing what is at least sometimes actual. Correspondingly, a generic property of a species is possible only if it is exemplified at least in one member of that species (In Periherm. I.120-1, 200-201, II.237, 239).

Like Aristotle, Boethius often treated statement-making utterances as temporally indeterminate sentences. The same sentence can be uttered at different times, and many of these temporally indeterminate sentences may sometimes be true and sometimes false, depending on the circumstances at the moment of utterance. If the state of affairs the actuality of which makes the sentence true is omnitemporally actual, the sentence is true whenever it is uttered. In this case, it is necessarily true. If the state of affairs associated with an assertoric sentence is always non-actual, the sentence is always false and therefore impossible. A sentence is possible only if what is asserted is not always non-actual (I.124-125). The statistical interpretation of modal terms is also employed in Ammonius's Greek commentary on Aristotle's De interpretatione which shares some sources with Boethius's work (88.12-28) and in Alexander of Aphrodisias's commentary on Aristotle's modal syllogistic (Mueller 1999).

In dealing with Chapter 9 of Aristotle's De interpretatione Boethius argues (II.241) that because

(1) M(pt   &   ¬ pt)
(1) It is possible that p obtains at t and not-p obtains at t.
is not acceptable, one should also deny
(2) pt   &   Mt ¬pt
(2) p obtains at t and it is possible at t that not-p obtains at t.
The denial of (2) is equivalent to
(3) pt →  Lt pt
(3) If p obtains at t then it is necessary at t that p obtains at t.
This line of thought is natural only when possibilities are treated without any idea of synchronic alternatives. (2) was generally denied in ancient philosophy and its denial was taken as an axiom by Boethius as well. Correspondingly, (3) shows how the necessity of the present was understood in ancient thought. Boethius thought that the temporal necessity of p can be qualified by shifting attention from temporally definite cases or statements to their temporally indeterminate counterparts (I.121-122, II.242-3). The same statistical idea occurs in Ammonius (153.24-6). This was one of Boethius's interpretations of the Aristotelian distinction between necessity now and necessity without qualification. But he also made use of the diachronic model according to which the necessity of ‘p’ at t does not imply that, before t, it is necessary that ‘p’ obtains at t.

Boethius developed the diachronic ideas as part of his criticism of Stoic determinism. If it is not true that everything is causally necessitated, there must be genuine alternatives in the course of events. Free choice was the source of contingency in which Boethius was mainly interested, but he thought in addition that according to the Peripatetic doctrine there is a real factor of indeterminacy in the causal nexus of nature. When Boethius refers to chance, free choice, and possibility in this context, his examples include temporalized modal notions which refer to diachronic prospective possibilities at a given moment of time. A temporally determinate prospective possibility is unrealized before the time to which it refers, and it may be not realized even when the time is present. This means, however, that the possibility no longer exists. Boethius did not develop the idea of simultaneous synchronic possibilities which would remain intact even when diachronic possibilities had vanished. On the contrary, he insisted that only what is actual at a certain time is at that time possible at that time (cf. (3) above). But he also thought that there are objective singular contingencies, so that the result of some prospective possibilities is indefinite and uncertain ‘not only to us who are ignorant, but to nature’ (In Periherm. I.106, 120, II.190-192, 197-198, 203, 207). Boethius's modal paradigms are discussed in Kretzmann 1985, Mignucci 1989, and Knuuttila 1993.

As for future contingent statements, Boethius seems to think the principle of bivalence is universally valid, but statements about future contingents, unlike those about past and present things, do not obey the stronger principle that each affirmative or negative statement is either determinately true or determinately false. A true statement is indeterminately true as long as the conditions which make it true are not yet fixed (In Periherm. I.125, II.208; Mignucci 1989). Boethius's formulations are somewhat ambiguous and it is possible that ‘indeterminate truth’ sometimes means that a statement will be either true or false (Kretzmann 1987). The first alternative became the standard medieval view, but there were different opinions of whether Aristotle abandoned bivalence for future contingent statements. (See Normore 1982, Lewis 1987, Normore 1993, Schabel 2000.) Boethius, Thomas Aquinas, and many others thought that God can know future contingents only because the flux of time is present to divine eternity. Many late medieval thinkers defended God's ability to foreknow free acts. This led to the so called middle knowledge theory of the counterfactuals of freedom (Craig 1988, Freddoso 1988).

From the point of view of the history of modal thought, interesting things took place in theology in the eleventh and twelfth centuries. Augustine had already criticized the application of the statistical model of possibility to divine power; for him, God has freely chosen the actual world and its providential plan from alternatives which he could have realized but did not will to do (potuit sed noluit). This way of thinking differs from ancient philosophical modal paradigms, because the metaphysical basis is now the eternal domain of alternative possible histories instead of the idea of one necessary world order (De spiritu et littera 1-2, De civitate Dei 12.19, 21.5-10, 22.4, 11, Contra Faustum 29.4; see also Knuuttila 2001). In Augustine God's eternal ideas of finite beings represent the possibilities of how the highest being can be imitated. In this sense the possibilities have an ontological foundation in God's essence (De Gen. ad litt. imp.16.57-58). This was the dominating conception of theological modal metaphysics until Duns Scotus departed from it. The idea of a discrepancy between the Catholic doctrine of God's freedom and power and the philosophical modal conceptions was brought into the scope of discussion by Peter Damian and Anselm of Canterbury (Holopainen 1996) and was developed in a more sophisticated way by Peter Abelard, Gilbert of Poitiers and some other twelfth century authors. (For modalities in Abelard, see also Marenbon 1997 and Martin 2001.) This is how the new modal paradigm based on the idea of synchronic alternatives became a part of Western theology, and it was particularly applied in the discussions of the distinction between God's absolute and ordained power and between divine and natural possibilities (Knuuttila 1993).

Even though the modal paradigm based on synchronic alternatives was very different from the traditional ones, there were not many people in the twelfth and thirteenth centuries who realized its general philosophical significance to the extent that Abelard and Gilbert of Poitiers did. It was more usual to consider it a specially theological matter which did not affect the use of traditional modal paradigms in other disciplines. This attitude was supported by the general reception of Aristotle's philosophy which clearly contributed to the frequent use of the Aristotelian modal paradigms in thirteenth century logical treatises on modalities, in metaphysical theories of the principles of being, and in the discussions of causes and effects in natural philosophy (Knuuttila 1993; for Jewish and Arabic discussions, see also Rescher 1974, Manekin 1992, Bäck 1992, Kukkonen 2000, 2002, Street 2002).

3. Modalities in Thirteenth Century Logical Treatises

The anonymous Dialectica Monacensis (ca. 1200) is one of the numerous works representing the new terminist approach to logic and can be used as an example of how modalities were treated in it. (A collection of late twelfth and early thirteenth century logical texts is edited in de Rijk 1962-67.) In discussing the quantity (universal, particular, singular) and quality (affirmative, negative) of the modals, the author states that modal terms may be adverbial or nominal. The modal adverb qualifies the copula, and the structure of the sentence can be described as follows:
(4) quantity/subject/modalized copula/predicate (Some A's are necessarily B)
In this form, the negation can be located in different places, either
(5) quantity/subject/copula modalized by a negated mode/predicate (Some A's are-not-necessarily B)
(6) quantity/subject/modalized negative copula/predicate (Some A's are-necessarily-not B)
If sentences with a negation sign are read in accordance with (5), then the mode is denied in them; if they are read in accordance with (6), the modal adverb qualifies a negated predication (De Rijk 1967, II-2, 479.35-480.3).

As for the modal sentences with nominal modes, the author says that they can be read in two ways. One can apply an adverbial type of reading to them, which is said to be how Aristotle treats modal sentences in the Prior Analytics. The quality and quantity of such a de re modal sentence is determined by the corresponding non-modal sentence. In a de dicto modal sentence that which is asserted in a non-modal sentence is considered as the subject about which the mode is predicated. When modal sentences are understood in this way, they are always singular, their form being:

(7) subject/copula/mode. (That some A's are B is necessary.)
This reading is said to be the one which Aristotle presented in De interpretatione (480.3-26). The idea of the systematic distinction between the readings de dicto (in sensu composito) and de re (in sensu diviso) of modally qualified statements was introduced into medieval discussions in Abelard's investigations of modal statements (Super Periherm. 3-47, Dialectica 191.1-210.19), and was often mentioned, as in the Dialectica Monacensis, in discussions of the composition-division ambiguity of sentences.

The author of the Dialectica Monacensis says that the matter of an assertoric sentence may be natural, remote, or contingent. True affirmative sentences about a natural matter maintain the existence of natural compounds which cannot be otherwise; these sentences as well as the natural compounds are called necessary. False affirmative sentences about a remote matter maintain the existence of compounds which are necessarily non-existent; they are called impossible. Sentences about a contingent matter are about compounds which can be actual and which can be non-actual (472.9-473.22). The theory of the modal matter was popular in early medieval logic and was also dealt with in mid-thirteenth century handbooks. Another often discussed theme was the distinction between modalities per se and per accidens which was based on the idea that the modal status of a temporally indefinite sentence may be changeable or not - for example ‘You have not been in Paris’ may begin to be impossible, whereas ‘You either have or have not been in Paris’ may not. Another distinction between sentences necessary per se and per accidens was based on Aristotle's theory of per se predication in Posterior Analytics I.4. A sentence was said to be accidentally necessary when it was unchangeably true but there was no conceptual connection between subject and predicate.

One example of the prevalence of the traditional use of modal notions can be found in the early medieval de dicto/de re analysis of examples such as ‘A standing man can sit’. It was commonly stated that the composite (de dicto) sense is ‘It is possible that a man sits and stands at the same time’ and that on this reading the sentence is false. The divided (de re) sense is ‘A man who is now standing can sit’ and on this reading the sentence is true. Many authors formulated the divided possibility as follows: ‘A standing man can sit at another time’. It was assumed that a possibility refers to an actualization in the one and only world history and that it cannot refer to the present moment because of the necessity of the present understood in the Aristotelian sense formulated in (2) and (3) above. When authors referred to another time, some of them thought in accordance with the statistical model that the possibility would be realized at that time. But the Boethian idea of diachronic prospective alternatives was also often used in thirteenth century logical treatises, and some authors thought that the divided possibility refers to the future even though it may remain unrealized. A third group of authors made use of the modern idea of synchronic alternatives in this connection. The composite reading refers then to one and the same state of affairs and the divided reading to alternative states of affairs (at the same time). This analysis was also applied to the question of whether God's knowledge of things makes them necessary. (There are textual references for all these themes in Knuuttila 1993. See also Maierù 1972, Jacobi 1980.)

The variety of intuitions about the meanings of modal notions may be one of the reasons for the fact that the logical analysis of de re modalities remained sketchy in early terminist logic. Modifying Boethius's systematization of Aristotle's remarks in De interpretatione 12 and 13, the logicians often presented the equipollences and other relations between unanalysed modals with the help of a square of opposition. Abelard's attempt to extend this analysis to quantified de re modals was confused (Super Periherm. 26.8-15) and the later progress in this area was slow. It was only in the fourteenth century that they were analysed in a satisfactory manner. (See Hughes 1989 and his description of Buridan's octagon of modal opposites and equipollences.)

Dialectica Monacensis involves a brief summary of Aristotle's modal syllogistic. (Its first Latin discussion is found in an anonymous twelfth century commentary on the Prior Analytics; Ebbesen 1981.) The first thorough commentary was Robert Kilwardby's In libros Priorum Analyticorum expositio (ca. 1240). Albert the Great's comments on modal syllogisms in his commentary on the Prior Analytics were mainly derived from Kilwardby's work. Abelard, who did not deal with Aristotle's modal syllogistics, said that the modals in mixed syllogisms with both modal and assertoric premises should be read de re (Super Periherm. 10.22-11.16) This became a common view before Aristotle's modal syllogistic was studied in any detail. Although the reception of the Prior Analytics with this interpretation strengthened the interest in quantified modal sentences, Aristotle's work was an ambiguous guidebook. The remarks on the structure of the premises are scattered and even if it is natural to think that the presupposition of the mixed moods is a de re reading of modally qualified premises, it creates serious difficulties when it is applied to the conversion rules, most of which are unproblematic only if understood as rules for modals de dicto.

There are several recent works on Aristotle's modal syllogistic but no generally accepted historical construction which would make it a coherent theory. (For recent attempts of reconstruction, see van Rijen 1989, Patterson 1995, Thom 1996, Nortmann 1996.) Robert Kilwardby and Albert the Great thought that Aristotle's modal syllogistic was a consistent theory and that the difficulties of understanding some parts disappear when certain philosophical presuppositions are explicated. Instead of employing the de dicto/de re distinction they suggested that the notion of necessity in syllogistic premises refers to the Aristotelian per se necessity of an essential predication and they also applied many ad hoc restrictions pertaining to the notion of contingency in order to give a uniform reading of Aristotelian moods and conversion rules. This approach, which shows similarities to some modern reconstructions of Aristotle's theory, was partially influenced by Averroes's works. While Kilwardby's interpretation of modal statements and modal syllogisms was influential in the thirteenth century, in the early fourteenth century it gave way to a quite different theory (Lagerlund 2000).

The principles of propositional modal logic were generally expressed as follows: if the antecedent of a valid consequence is possible/necessary, the consequent is possible/necessary (Abelard, Dialectica 202.6-8). A great deal of Abelard's logical works consisted of discussions of topics, consequences and conditionals. Like Boethius, Abelard thought that true conditionals express necessary conceptual connections between the antecedents and the consequents. Some twelfth century masters regarded the principle that the antecedent is not true without the consequent as a sufficient condition for the truth of a conditional and accepted the so-called paradoxes of implication (Martin 1987). The question of the nature of conditionals and consequences remained a popular theme in medieval logic (Broadie 1993).

4. Fourteenth Century Discussions

John Duns Scotus's modal theory can be regarded as the first systematic exposition of the new intensional theory of modality, some elements of which were put forward in the twelfth century. In criticizing Henry of Ghent's theory of theological modalities, Scotus sketched the famous and sometimes misunderstood model of ‘divine psychology’ in which certain relations between theological, metaphysical, and modal notions are defined. According to Scotus, we can suppose that everything which can be understood eternally receives intelligible being (esse intelligibile) in the intellect of God. Because the intelligible being comprises the individual concept of each thing that can be known, all thinkable realizable individuals receive possible being (esse possibile) as the intentional correlates of divine power and choice. The possibilities are thought of as partitioned into classes on the basis of relations of compossibility. Impossibility means incompossibility between possible properties or states of affairs. One of the compossible sets into which the possibilities are partitioned is chosen by divine will to be actualized through divine power (Ord. I.43; other relevant texts are Ord. I.36 and Lect. I.39). Scotus wants to make it clear that, contrary to what Henry of Ghent did, one should not think that the domain of possibility is posterior to God's power. An infinite power can realize whatever is realizable, and it can be decided which things are realizable without any reference to that power. When Scotus says that God produces things in intelligible being, he means that they are given an ontological status, weaker than existence, as intentional correlates of divine thought. Although God's intellect in this sense eternally produces its objects, it does not create them by choice. God's infinite intellect comprehends all that can be thought without contradiction and understands them necessarily and not freely. The intentional actuality of the domain of possibility in God's mind is caused by divine intellect, but possibilities and impossibilities themselves are what they are independently of whether anything exists. They would remain the a priori conditions of being and thinking even if there were no God, though they would then not have any kind of existence. Scotus thus gave up the view of Thomas Aquinas, Bonaventura, Henry of Ghent and many other thirteenth century theologians that absolute possibilities have an ontological foundation in God's essence. He thought that logical possibilities must be regarded as non-existing preconditions of any beings and their acts. Scotus heavily criticized extensional modal theories in which the actualization at some moment of time was explicitly or implicitly used as the criterion of the genuineness of possibility. He redefined a contingent event as follows: ‘I do not call something contingent because it is not always or necessarily the case, but because its opposite could be actual at the very moment when it occurs’ (Ord. I, d. 2, p. 1, q. 1-2, n. 86). The criterion of what is possible is that we can imagine it taking place without contradiction in at least one alternative state of affairs. This is what ‘logical possibility’ means. The domain of possibility as such consists of all thinkable individuals, their properties, and their mutual relations. Because many possibilities are mutually exclusive, this domain must be structured into sets on the basis of compossibility relations. Scotus's theory can be characterized as an intuitive predecessor of possible worlds semantics, though he did not use the term ‘possible world’ in a technical sense. Scotus took it for granted that the same individual can occur in alternative states of affairs. In this respect his theory of possible individuals was different from Leibniz's view that individuals are world-bound. (For Scotus's modal theory, see Knuuttila 1993, 1996, Vos et al. 1994, Lewis 1996, Marrone 1996. Normore 1996 argues for a revised version of the traditional interpretation that modalities are primarily dependent on God.)

Scotus's model theoretical approach to modalities brought some new themes into philosophical discussion. One of these was the idea of the domain of possibility as a non-existent objective precondition of all being and thinking. This was well known in the seventeenth century as well through Suárez's works (Honnefelder 1990). In his discussion of eternal truths, Descartes criticized the classical view of the ontological foundation of modality as well as the Scotist theory of modality and conceivability. He seems to have thought that the domain of conceivability is freely set by God and that it could therefore be different from what it is. (There are different views of Descartes's theory and its connections to late medieval views; see Alanen and Knuuttila 1988, Alanen 1990, Normore 1991.)

Another influential idea was the new distinction between logical and natural necessities and possibilities. In Scotus's theory, logically necessary attributes and relations are attached to things in all those sets of compossibilities in which they occur. Against this background one could ask which of the natural invariances treated as necessities in earlier natural philosophy were necessary in this strong sense of necessity, and which of them were merely empirical generalizations without being logically necessary. The distinction between logical and natural necessity is crucial to the works of William Ockham and John Buridan (Knuuttila 2001b).

One important branch of medieval logic developed in treatises called De obligationibus dealt, roughly speaking, with how an increasing set of true and false propositions might remain coherent. According to the thirteenth century rules, false present tense statements could be accepted only if they were taken to refer to a moment of time different from the actual one. Scotus deleted this rule, based on the Aristotelian axiom of the necessity of the present, and later theories accepted the Scotist revision. In this new form, obligations logic could be regarded as a theory of how to describe logically possible states of affairs and their mutual relationships. These discussions influenced the philosophical theory of counterfactual conditionals (Yrjönsuuri 1994.) In dealing with counterfactual hypotheses of indirect proofs Averroes and Thomas Aquinas made use of the idea of abstract possibilities which did not imply the idea of alternative domains. The possibilities of a thing can be dealt with at various levels which correspond to Porphyrian predicables. Something which is possible for a thing as a member of a genus can be impossible for it as a member of a species. The same holds of it as a member of a species and an individuated thing. Many of these abstract possibilities are impossible in the sense that they cannot be actualized. (See Knuuttila 2001, Kukkonen 2002.)

With the new modal semantics, William Ockham, John Buridan and some other fourteenth century authors could formulate the principles of modal logic much more completely and satisfactorily than did their predecessors. Questions of modal logic were discussed separately with respect to modal propositions de dicto and de re; modal propositions de re were further divided into two groups depending on whether the subject terms refer to actual or possible beings. It was thought that logicians should also analyse the relationships between these readings and, furthermore, the consequences having various types of modal sentences as their parts. Richard of Campsall played an interesting role in the development of medieval modal syllogistics. He introduced the habit of treating the de dicto and de re moods separately, but he was also dependent on Kilwardby's interpretation. The new modal logic of William Ockham, John Buridan and Pseudo-Scotus was among the most remarkable achievements of medieval logic. In its light Aristotle's modal syllogistic was regarded as a fragmentary theory in which the distinctions between different types of fine structures were not explicated. These authors did not try to reconstruct it into a uniform system; they believed, like some modern commentators, that such a reconstruction is not possible (Lagerlund 2000). Buridan's modal logic was dominant in late medieval times. It was embraced by Marsilius of Inghen, Albert of Saxony, and Jodocus Trutfetter. (For the later influence of medieval modal theories, see Coombs 1990, Roncaglia 1996.) The rise of the new modal logic was accompanied by theories of epistemic logic (Boh 1993) and deontic logic (Knuuttila 1993) which also belong among the remarkable achievements of late medieval philosophy.


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Related Entries

Aquinas, Saint Thomas | Aristotle | Avicenna [Ibn Sina] | Boethius, Anicius Manlius Severinus | Buridan, John [Jean] | Duns Scotus, John | Kilwardby, Robert | Latin Averroism | logic: modal | medieval philosophy | Ockham [Occam], William | possible worlds | Stoicism | truth: necessary vs. contingent