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Leibniz on Causation

First published Tue 15 Feb, 2005

Leibniz clearly believes not only that substances are capable of action, but also that they themselves are always acting. Further, the actions of substances consist entirely of perceptions of differing degrees of distinctness. Phenomena supervene on the ordered perceptions of substances. But what causes perceptual change and thus change in phenomena? Answering this question will enable us to understand Leibniz's theory of causation. Just thirty years after Leibniz's death, David Hume stated that his own definition of cause entails that “all causes are of the same kind” (An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, 156). We do not find such a view in Leibniz; Leibniz's theory of causation incorporates both efficient and final causes, harkening back to Aristotle even while it tries to explain away real causation among phenomenal things with the infamous pre-established harmony.

1. Competing Theories of Causation

Leibniz recognizes three chief competing theories of causation: physical influx (influxus physicus), occasionalism, and pre-established harmony. Let us consider rough, non-philosopher-specific, approximations of each of these theories.

According to the theory of physical influx, there is an inflow between cause and effect; in other words, there is intersubstantial causation among finite (i.e., non-divine) substances. So, for instance, when Paco Peña appears to strum his guitar, he really is the cause of the vibration of the strings. Interestingly, the term ‘physical’ notwithstanding, the theory of physical influx is not limited to material finite substances. For physical influx sometimes is invoked to explain the causal interaction among immaterial finite substances (e.g., minds) and material finite substances (e.g., bodies). Accordingly, it is more accurate to take the term ‘physical’ to mean natural rather than material.

Occasionalism denies causation not only among finite substances, and so rules out any inflow between cause and effect, but also within finite substances. In other words, regarding finite substances, there is neither intersubstantial nor intrasubstantial causation. Taken individually or jointly, finite substances have literally no causal efficacy. When the strings of Paco Peña's guitar vibrate, Peña is not the real cause of the vibration. Nor are his fingers, wrist, and arm real causes. Is the vibration then uncaused for the occasionalist? No, for there is God. God, thought by many of Leibniz's contemporaries to be the only infinite (i.e., divine) substance, is considered to be the only real cause. God causes the strings on Peña's guitar to vibrate on the occasion of Peña's volition—itself caused by God—to strum the strings on his guitar.

Like occasionalism, the theory of pre-established harmony holds that there is no intersubstantial causation among finite substances. And like occasionalism, when the strings of Paco Peña's guitar vibrate, Peña is not the real cause of the vibration. Nor, again, are his fingers, wrist, or arm real causes. Nevertheless, it is not God who is the real (complete) cause of this vibration. According to pre-established harmony, finite substances can be real causes. Rather the strings themselves cause themselves to vibrate. Due to the special harmony between mind and body and not because of any direct causal relation, when Peña is in a state of willing his fingers to strum the strings on his guitar, the strings are in a physical state that would result in their vibration.

Leibniz is the most famous proponent of pre-established harmony. In his hands, the pre-established harmony has four main tenets: (1) no change in the states of a created substance is due to another created substance (i.e., there is no intersubstantial causation); (2) all (non-initial, natural) change in the states of a created substance is due to that substance itself (i.e., there is intrasubstantial causation); (3) each created substance has a “blueprint” (i.e., a complete concept or law of the series) that lists all of its states; and (4) each “blueprint” conforms with the blueprints of all other created substances (i.e., each of a created substance's natural states cohere with all the natural states of every other created substance). (See, for example, his letters to Arnauld, Nov. 28/Dec. 8 1686 and Apr. 30 1687, and Monadology §81.) Consider this 1704 articulation of the pre-established harmony:

Each of these souls expresses in its own manner what occurs outside itself, and it cannot do so through any influence of other particular beings (or, to put it a better way, it has to draw up [devant] this expression from the depths of its own nature); and so necessarily each soul must have received this nature-this inner source of the expression of what lies without—from a universal cause, upon which all of these beings depend and which brings it about that each of them perfectly agrees with and corresponds to the others. (New Essays A vi, 6, 440)

There is another important aspect of the pre-established harmony. A substance's expressions arising “from the depths of its own nature” are also called perceptions by Leibniz. Perception is “[t]he passing state which involves and represents a multitude in a unity” (Monadology §14 GP vi, 608/AG 214). In part, the pre-established harmony consists in the isomorphic mapping of perceptions and bodily motions. Whenever a substance has a perception x there will be a corresponding bodily state y expressing that perception x. So when I perceive myself as putting a log in the fire “[my] animal spirits and [my] blood [take] on, at exactly the right moment, the motions required to correspond to the passions and the perceptions of [my] soul” (New System GP iv, 484/L 458). However, although Leibniz's view does not have God continually jumping in every time, for example, that a body is caused to move (this would be the occasionalist view), God still has an important role. For it is God who pre-establishes the concomitance or conjunction between “causes” and “effects,” without which God's aim of producing universal and maximum harmony (Monadology §46) would be frustrated.

Why is Leibniz drawn to the rather bizarre-sounding pre-established harmony? Why does he reject the more terrene physical influx and the more celestial occasionalism?

2. Why does Leibniz reject Physical Influx?

Leibniz wants to rule out any kind of causation in which one substance passes something on to the other substance: “The way of influence is that of the common philosophy. But since it is impossible to conceive of material particles or of species or immaterial qualities which can pass from one of these substances into the other, the view must be rejected” (GP iv, 498f). Early in his career, Leibniz dismisses the influxus physicus of the Scholastic Francisco Suarez as a “barbaric expression metaphorical and more obscure than what it defines” (Preface to an Edition of Nizolius GP iv, 150). (Whether Suarez actually held the view Leibniz ascribes to him is another matter entirely.) Moreover, the pre-established harmony can achieve the same effect without the metaphysical baggage of “accident passing”: “So there will be a perfect accord between all these substances which produces the same effect that would be noticed if they all communicated with each other by a transmission of species or of qualities, as the common run of philosophers imagine” (New System GP iv, 484/L 457f).

It is fairly clear here that Leibniz takes ‘influx’ to refer to the transference of accidents (tropes or property-instances), as when a guitarist's fingers give an instance of motion to a struck guitar string. Leibniz holds that it cannot be comprehended how one finite substance could act on another finite substance. For such intersubstantial causation entails the transference or migration of an accident from one substance to another, where a trope passes from one thing to another, which then instantiates it. Such transference is inexplicable; an accident passing (or a trope transferring) from one subject to another is impossible (New Essays A vi, 6, 224). Leibniz writes in the Discourse on Metaphysics:

…nothing ever enters into our mind naturally from the outside; and we have a bad habit of thinking of our soul as if it received certain species as messengers and as if it has doors and windows. We have all these forms in our mind; we even have forms from all time, for the mind always expresses all its future thoughts and already thinks confusedly about everything it will ever think about distinctly. (Discourse on Metaphysics §26 GP iv, 451/AG 58)

And almost three decades later: “The monads [i.e., simple substances] have no windows through which something can enter or leave. Accidents cannot be detached, nor can they go about outside of substances, as the sensible species of the Scholastics once did” (Monadology §7 GP vi, 607f/AG 214).

Leibniz also argues that if the mind (one finite substance) were to act on the body (another finite substance) thereby causing bodily motion, there would be an increase in motion in that region of the world after the mind's action on the body not compensated for by a decrease in motion in another region. This is an obvious violation of the law of the conservation of motion. So there is no physical influx. Leibniz writes:

Descartes recognized that souls cannot impart a force to bodies because there is always the same quantity of force in matter [i.e., the material world]. However, he thought that the soul could change the direction of [force in] bodies. But that is because the law of nature, which also affirms the conservation of the same total direction in matter, was not known at that time. If he had known it, he would have hit upon my system of pre-established harmony. (Monadology §80 GP vi, 620f/AG 223)

It appears that part of what bothers Leibniz about physical influx is that in acting, the cause is drained. According to Leibniz, real causation entails that the cause not lose any of its efficacy after exercising its causal power. Leibniz depicts the production of our thoughts, for instance, as involving emanative causation: “it is very evident that created substances depend upon God, who preserves them and who even produces them continually by a kind of emanation, just as we produce our thoughts” (Discourse on Metaphysics §14 GP iv, 439/AG 46). “[S]ubstances are to be understood as enjoying a lawful primitive force of action whereby accidents emanate from the substance, from within” (Cover & O'Leary-Hawthorne, 181). It is hard to tell why Leibniz is troubled by any theory that involves the potential loss of causal efficacy in substances. Part of it might have to do with his belief that even finite, created substances are naturally indestructible (i.e., immortal) (Principles of Nature and Grace §2 G vi, 598/P 195). But then created, finite substances, continually acting according to the physical influx model, might eventually lose their causal efficacy and would no longer be able to act. And for Leibniz, “substances cannot be conceived in their bare essence, devoid of activity; that activity is of the essence of substance in general” (New Essays A vi, 6, 65). So, physical influx would entail the natural mortality of substance, a view that Leibniz wholly rejects.

Consider another expression of Leibniz's anti-influx position:

No created substance exerts a metaphysical action or influence on another, for to say nothing of the fact that it cannot be explained how anything can pass over from one thing into the substance of another, it has already been shown that all the futures of each thing follow from its own concept. What we call causes are in metaphysical rigor only concomitant requisites. (Primary Truths C 521/L 269)

Now, the idea here of causes as concomitant requisites and of God “preserving” substances continually by a kind of emanation may suggest occasionalism, but it is clear that Leibniz, after initially showing some sympathy toward occasionalism, eventually rejects it.

3. Why does Leibniz reject Occasionalism?

Occasionalism puts forward a view where God must act for any substance that does not have the causal power themselves to act. But since no other substance besides God has the causal wherewithal to act for themselves, or even in conjunction with other finite substances, God must continually intervene in the course of the world. This means that God must perform continuous miracles. But, according to Leibniz, a world in which God is required to perform continuous miracles is a world less perfect, and thereby less praiseworthy, than a world that “unfolds” naturally without the direct intervention of God (Letter to Arnauld, Apr. 30, 1687). The idea is that occasionalism must hold that God did not initially get creation right (even if the occasionalist himself or herself is not willing to make such an assertion) and so must continually step in and repair things to get them to go the way God intends. (This is of course not to say that for Leibniz there are no miracles whatsoever. He does speak of events that “surpass all the force of creatures” (Theodicy §249 H 280), including the Creation and the Incarnation.)

According to Leibniz, a world of genuinely active substances is more perfect than a world of purely passive or causally inert substances, whose activity is not properly ascribed to them but to God. Such a view, Leibniz believes, lead inexorably to Spinozism, where God is the only real substance and where any other thing is just a mode of God or else must invoke a deus ex machina, which for Leibniz is an ad hoc solution (Primary Truths C 521/P 90; GP iv, 515/WF 221). In order to avoid what he thinks is unadulterated Spinozism, Leibniz is keen to emphasize that we must be able to distinguish the actions of God from the actions of created substances. (More on this in the section on divine causation.)

4. Intersubstantial Causation

Since Leibniz seems to think that intersubstantial causation requires physical influx and physical influx is unacceptable, he concludes that we must reject intersubstantial causation. But it has been noted that Leibniz does not always argue this way. For while consistently rejecting the existence of influx, sometimes Leibniz will not at the same time reject outright the existence of intersubstantial causation. “Leibniz sometimes suggests that our ordinary statements about causal interaction can be understood in such a way that they come out true” (Jolley, 595). Nevertheless, Jolley continues, “When Leibniz simply denies the existence of causal interaction between created substances, he tends to accept the influx analysis; he does not look around for a better analysis that would preserve the truth of our ordinary causal statements” (Jolley, 595). So, on the whole, Leibniz does not take seriously other alternative accounts of intersubstantial causation.

Perhaps because he thinks he already has an account that will work for him—the pre-established harmony—Leibniz does not think that a plausible theory of causation need be intersubstantial in kind. In other words, Leibniz does not face a problem so many of his contemporaries face. His metaphysics, unlike theirs, has the necessary elements to sustain a properly and purely intrasubstantial theory of causation; a Leibnizian created substance is self-sufficient (possessing an inner principle of change that explains all of its accidents), permanently causally efficacious (acting does not diminish its power), and equipped with a complete concept that conforms to the complete concepts of all other created substances (perceiving or representing one and the same universe). So it makes sense that Leibniz would not feel compelled to defend intersubstantial causation.

This point can be made in other words. A difficult problem in giving an account of intrasubstantial causation concerns the explanation of the difference between causation among systems and causation within a system. For instance, do the works of a watch constitute an isolated system? Even the mechanical workings of Rolexes, constructed for deep sea divers, are affected at extreme temperatures and depths. So there is a problem giving an account of causation within a Rolex. A similar problem arises for a seventeenth century philosopher who holds a non-Leibnizian (i.e., mechanistic, materialist) notion of substance. But Leibniz has no problem with explaining the difference between systems that are causally isolated and systems that cannot be made absolute; his metaphysics-cum-ontology is readily equipped to handle causally isolated units or unities. For his substances are “windowless,” not at all causally compromised by external substances.

In what follows, we will focus on Leibniz's positive account of causation. The only real causation present in Leibniz's metaphysics is that within each finite substance and that of God who pre-establishes the harmony among minds and bodies (and minds and minds, and bodies and bodies). So the rest of this entry will address intrasubstantial and divine causation.

5. Intrasubstantial Causation

Whatever can be predicated of a Leibnizian substance is either an attribute (a permanent and common characteristic (GP ii, 227, 257ff)), sometimes called “property” (GP ii, 258/L 533), or an accident (a transitory and individual characteristic (GP ii, 458/L 605; GP iv, 363)), sometimes called “modification” (G ii, 258/L 533; GP ii, 503f). In contemporary lingo, we would call an attribute a “property” and an accident a “property-instance” or “trope.” Action is an attribute of substance, for Leibniz defines substance as “a being capable of action” (GP vi, 598). A perception is an accident of a substance, for the action of a substance consists precisely in the fact that it is always changing its perceptions (Letter to De Volder, January 21, 1704, G ii 263/L 534). Now, an attribute must not be considered a substance, since it would be a mistake to equate action with what is acting, or extension with what is extended (New Essays A vi, 6, 210f). Neither is an attribute to be considered an accident, for “an attribute may be predicated of several substances at the same or at different times while an accident can never inhere in more than one substance at the same or at different times” (Clatterbaugh, 3).

So, for Leibniz the essence of a created substance is activity, in the sense of being continually in process of change of its perceptions. The accidents (tropes or property-instances) of a substance are its perceptions. The change in a created substance must be caused (“Primary Truths” C 519/L 268), yet there can be no transeunt (i.e., intersubstantial) causation (Discourse on Metaphysics §14, GP iv 439/L 312). For, as seen earlier, causal interaction between created substances (i.e., monads) is in principle inexplicable (New System G iv 483/L 457). Therefore, the cause of change of perceptions in a created substance is either to be located in an uncreated substance, namely God, and/or in the substance itself. But, as we have already seen, Leibniz rejects the view that God alone is the real causal power driving change in substances; apart from some rare Malebranchian moments, he is no occasionalist (Notes on a Reply of Foucher, G i 373f/L 155). So perceptual change in a particular substance is caused by the substance itself. But surely we want to know what it is about the substance or in the substance that drives perceptual change.

It is then right to insist that “[a]lthough Leibniz may say that it is substances which produce their states, this is only a loose way of speaking” (Jolley, 605). What exactly causes the change of perceptions of a substance? Leibniz holds that both the “primitive active power” of a substance and its perceptions or perceptual states play crucial causal roles in the changes of a substance. (And, as we will see, God is no minor player in this effort as well.) The primitive active power of a substance, Leibniz tells us, is “a nature or an internal force that can produce in it, in an orderly way all the appearances or expressions it will have, without the help of any created being” (New System GP iv 486/AG 144). And, regarding perception, “the present state of each substance is a natural result [consequence] of its preceding state” (Clarification of Difficulties concerning Monsieur Bayle GP iv, 521).

But it is not as if Leibniz says that primitive powers and perceptions play the same causal roles. Whereas the primitive power of a substance is the efficient cause—a post-Humean might say the real cause—of the change of its perceptual states, these states themselves function as the teleological or final causes of change in substances. If we wish to predict which members of the series of states will come next, we need to examine the previous members. For perceptions are understood by Leibniz to be carriers of reason, content, or information about the laws of nature, and encoded with data about previous and past events. But, à la Aristotle, final causes need not also be efficient causes.

Leibniz's account may be articulated in a similar, though terminologically different, manner. Leibniz says that the action of the primitive power (“the internal principle of a substance that brings about change, or the passage from one perception to another”) “can be called appetition” (Monadology §15; also, Principles of Nature and Grace §2). However, “whereas a perception is a short-lived intrinsic state which carries information, an appetite is an endogenous tendency to alter. A monad's perception is the signal it carries that such-and-such is the case outside it; its appetite is its self-generated tendency to move from one state to another. Notice that appetite is causal, as perception is not [in the efficacious sense at least]” (Bennett, 253).

Leibniz is then quite clearly a pre-Humean regarding causation. Hume states that his definition of cause entails that “all causes are of the same kind” (An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, 156), whereas Leibniz incorporates both efficient and final causes in his theory of causation. To understand Leibniz's theory of intrasubstantial causality better (and perhaps also to acquaint ourselves with some interpretive difficulties), let us first focus on considerations having to do with efficient causation. Then we will discuss final causation.

6. Efficient Causation

Leibniz consistently refers to the causal efficacy of the powers or natures of substances. Consider the following texts:

free or intelligent substances possess something greater and more marvelous, in a kind of imitation of God. For they are not bound by any certain subordinate laws of the universe, but act by a private miracle as it were, on the sole initiative of their own power. (“Necessary and Contingent Truths” C 10/P 100)

the modifications which can occur to a single subject naturally and without miracles must arise from limitations and variations of a real genus, that is, of a constant and absolute inherent nature. (New Essays A vi, 6, 65)

Anything which occurs in what is strictly a substance must be a case of action in the metaphysically rigorous sense of something which occurs in the substance spontaneously arising out [arrive] of its own depths. (New Essays A vi, 6, 210)

why should God be unable to give substance, from the beginning, a nature or an internal force that can produce [produire] in it, in an orderly wayall the appearance or expressions it will have, without the help of any created being? This is especially so since the nature of substance necessarily requires and essentially involves progress or change, without which it would not have the force to act. (New System GP iv, 485)

The power of a substance is an attribute, a permanent and invariant property of individual substance. It is a property which no substance can ever lack; thus, the power is a nature. (Analogous to the power in substances is the power that exists in phenomenal things and that explains their own changes in qualities. However, the power in substances is metaphysically more fundamental than the power in phenomenal things. This is why Leibniz calls the former primitive and the latter derivative. Phenomenal change, including motion, supervene on the power intrinsic to substances.)

According to Leibniz, can perceptions, the differing modifications or accidents of a substance, also be efficient causes? The answer appears negative. The problem is that the language Leibniz employs to describe the relationship among perceptions or perceptual states is not explicitly causal (in the efficacious sense at least). Perceptions or perceptual states are never claimed by Leibniz to produce other states. Leibniz uses terms such as ‘consequence’, ‘suite’, ‘sequitur’, ‘résultat’, ‘tend’, and ‘derivantur’, when speaking of the passage from one perceptual state to another, terms which should make us hesitate in automatically attributing to Leibniz a theory of causally efficacious perceptions or perceptual states. Consider the following representative sample of texts:

every present state of a substance occurs to it spontaneously and is only a consequence of [une suite de] its preceding state. (Remarks on a Letter to Arnauld, GP ii, 47)

Everything occurs in each substance in consequence of [en consequence du] the first state that God gave it in creating it. (Letter to Arnauld, April 30, 1687, GP ii, 91)

all our future thoughts and perceptions are merely consequences [que des suites], thought contingent, of our preceding thoughts and perceptions. (Discourse on Metaphysics §14 GP iv, 440)

the present state of each substance is a natural result [consequence] of its preceding state. (Clarification of Difficulties concerning Monsieur Bayle, GP iv, 521)

every present perception leads to [que la suite de] a new perception. (Theodicy §403/H 365)

subsequent [perceptions] are derived [derivantur] from preceding ones. (Letter to Des Bosses, GP ii, 372)

This is just not the kind of language we should expect to find from Leibniz when speaking of efficient causes. It seems that Leibniz never speaks of the relation among perceptions as involving one perception or perceptual state producing, in the causally efficacious sense, another perception or perceptual state. Of course, the texts adduced up to this point could accommodate such an interpretation, for while the terms ‘consequence’ and ‘derivantur’, for instance, do not entail efficient causation, they are still compatible with it. But the question is whether perceptions can function as active agencies (and so efficient causes) for Leibniz. In Leibniz's ontology, what is active is a true, enduring unity and a center of force—a substance. Leibniz writes that “everything that acts is an individual substance” (“On Nature Itself” GP iv, 509/AG 160). To understand perceptions as causally ordered, in the sense that efficient causal and not merely lawful or regular or final causal relations obtain among them, is to subscribe to a event oriented model of causation. But Leibniz, not only like his medieval predecessors but also many of his contemporaries, subscribes to a rather different model, one in which a real cause must be a substance or better yet, a faculty of that substance. Therefore, unless perceptions are genuine substances and so not events, it seems to follow that for Leibniz, perceptions (and perceptual states) are causally inefficacious.

7. Final Causation

If Leibniz does not think that perceptions can function as efficient causes, why does Leibniz even speak of later perceptions as natural consequences of earlier perceptions, if not causally? Well, for two reasons. First, there is a teleological relation between perceptions. Leibniz speaks of perceptions as unfolding spontaneously in monads according to a metaphysically basic order of causal relations. But the fact that perceptions are automatically and irreducibly causally ordered need only mean that “prior” perceptions contain the reason for subsequent perceptions. In other words, perceptions might only be final causes. Temporal priority might only depend on a relation of “involves a reason for” (Cover, 317). Now, according to Leibniz, what is a reason? He says this: “A reason is a known truth whose connection with some less well-known truth leads up to give our assent to the latter. But it is called reason, especially and par excellence, if it is the cause not only of our judgment but also of the truth itself—which makes it known as an apriori reason” (New Essays A vi, 6, 475).

As mentioned earlier, Leibniz also speaks of appetitions as a substance's “tendencies to go from one perception to another” (GP vi, 598/AG 207). That perceptions come and go according to final causes is apparent in the following passage from the Principles of Nature and Grace §3: “perceptions in the monad arise from one another by the laws of appetites, or by the laws of the final causes of good and evil, which consist in notable perceptions, ordered or disordered” (GP vi, 598/AG 207). Leibniz writes in the same work: “the future can be read in the past; the distant is expressed in the proximate” (GP vi, 605/AG 211). One moral here is that perceptions can function as teleological explananda. All of this is reminiscient of Aristotle's account of final causation, where natural processes are completed and regulated by a final state or end, towards which they tend.

Second, Leibniz wishes to ground his Law of Continuity—that all change in nature is continuous (i.e., in nature there are no gaps). For thinkers contemporaneous with Leibniz, most notably Pierre Bayle, found the apparent lack of continuity among our perceptions to be deeply problematic. But, given the Law of Continuity, Leibniz cannot allow perceptions to arise in a monad that are radically unlike their predecessors. To solve this problem, Leibniz offers his theory of petites or unconscious perceptions and says that this apparent lack of continuity in the actions of the individual substance results from our overlooking the complex multitude of unconscious perceptions, which flow, at every moment, from the individual's nature. But the doctrine of petites perceptions alone is not sufficient to ground continuity. Rather, it is the teleological relation among perceptions that serves to guarantee continuity in perceptual content. Leibniz speaks of the “marks [les marques]” that each perception of a substance contains for all other perceptions that substance will ever have (Discourse on Metaphysics §8).

Leibniz's account of intrasubstantial causation therefore involves a tight connection between efficient causes and final causes. This should not be surprising, since Leibniz tells us that “[a] cause in the realm of things corresponds to a reason in the realm of truths, which is why causes themselves—and especially final ones—are often called reasons” (New Essays A vi, 6, 475). Leibniz seems to think that efficient causal explanations (in accordance with laws of mind and forces acting) and final causal explanations (in accordance with the substance's “blueprint” and ultimately God's aim of universal and maximum harmony) are individually sufficient. They are equipotent. So what causes the changes in perceptions? Causal forces as well as reasons.

8. Causal Models

It has been noted that “[p]erhaps the greatest difference between a contemporary concept of causation and a seventeenth century concept is one of model. Contemporary philosophers customarily conceive causation as a relation between events (e.g., my flipping the switch caused the light to come on) while seventeenth century philosophers thought of it more as a relation among substances, their qualities, and their ‘powers' (e.g., I cause my idea of justice)” (Frankel, 57). Yet this arcane picture possesses at least one virtue that the contemporary one does not. It has the distinct advantage of avoiding any problematic regress of causal explanation. Once a causal sequence of events is laid out, we can always ask why that sequence, and not another, occurred. But an explanation of this sequence, according to an event/event model of causation does not preclude the same question “Why that sequence of events?” being asked of it again and again. On the other hand, Leibniz does not think that the power, will, or appetite, which are not events at all, but faculties, of an agency or agent, need any explaining. The regress of explanation stops abruptly with the substance. In a letter to de Volder (June 30, 1704), he writes: “To ask why there is perception and appetite in simple substances is to inquire about something ultramundane, so to speak, and to demand reasons of God why he has willed things to be such as we conceive them to be” (GP ii, 271/L 538). Furthermore, the central message of Leibniz's bombastic but enlightening essay, Against Barbaric Physics (circa 1713), seems to be that since the actions of substances are in fact spontaneous, there is no way of explaining change in substances unless we posit some force or power that drives substantial action. The reason being that, without this agency in monads, there would be no cause sufficient to determine the whole sequence of events and thus no adequate causal explanation of the totality of actions (i.e., perceptions) on the part of substances. And, besides failing to break out of the cycle of explanation that appears to plague event/event models of causation, such a picture clearly violates Leibniz's Principle of Sufficient Reason:

Thus the sufficient reason, which needs no other reason, must be outside this series of contingent things, and must be found in a substance which is its cause, and which is a necessary being, carrying the reason of its existence with itself. Otherwise, we would not yet have a sufficient reason where one could end the series. (Principles of Nature and Grace §8 GP, vi, 604/AG 210)

Hence, we should understand Leibniz's statement in a letter to Arnauld (May 1686) that “there is always something to be conceived in the subject which provides the explanation why this predicate or this event belongs to it, or why a particular event happened rather than not” (GP ii, 45/P 60) not in terms of some ideal event contained in the subject as carrying the correlative explanatory role, but the power or principle of change of the subject.

Further lending credence to the claim that Leibniz postulates a substance-accident model of causation, it appears that whenever Leibniz describes the causal relation found within substances, even those depictions that are best understood as metaphorical, those depictions themselves point to a non-homogeneous account of the intrasubstantial causal relata. That is, intrasubstantial causal relata do not involve components of the same kinds. Whether he speaks of the actualizations of an essence, predicates of a subject, values of a function, perceptions of an appetite, cogitations of a will, ends of reason, harmonies of a rule of order, it is clear that Leibniz envisions “effects” which are different in kind from their “causes.” The essence of a substance is not itself an actualization; the function of a substance is not itself a value of a function (Cover & O'Leary-Hawthorne, 229); a substance's appetite is not itself a perception; the will of a substance is not itself a cogitation, it is a faculty; the reason governing the substance is not itself the end to which it strives; and, the rule of order is not itself an instance of the harmonious agreement among substances.

All told, it seems that Leibniz ascribes to a heterogeneous account of causation, where the cause is different in kind from its effect. Ultimately, Leibniz offers a theory of intrasubstantial causation that incorporates both efficient and final causes, where only substances or strictly speaking, their powers, can be efficient causes while perceptions have a teleological function.

9. Divine Causation

Let us end with some short words on divine causation. Leibniz wants to provide an account where God's relationship with created substances is compatible with substances possessing the ability to act spontaneously or freely. Leibniz does not want to fall into the trap of ascribing too much to the hand of God; that is, he wants to avoid any obvious Spinozistic or occasionalist overtones. This cannot be done successfully if our conception of power or principle of change of the actions of substances hinges on the thought that God not only creates substances but also controls their every move.

There is a caveat, however. Leibniz often begins by stating that everything which occurs spontaneously in a substance comes to that substance from itself. Then he quickly points out, as if reminding us of the real protagonist in the causal narrative, that everything which comes to a substance comes ultimately from God (New Essays A vi, 6, 210f). Are we thus again abruptly forced into a Spinozistic view of causation, where God's actions cannot be properly distinguished those of his creatures? No, according to Leibniz, for God's role in intrasubstantial causation, besides that which is implied by miraculous intervention, is only an emanatory one (Discourse on Metaphysics §28 AG 59f; A vi, 6, 210f). An emanative mode of causal activity is one in which the cause includes, in some “eminent” or higher form, what it gives to its effect, without losing the ability to produce the same kind of effect in the future. But a substance, undergoing this kind of intervention or causal process, need not lose its natural causal efficacy which is rooted in its power or principle of change.

Leibniz distinguishes between the production of states in a substance and the conserving of a substance undergoing different states. There is therefore capacity in Leibniz's theory of causation both for substances to be the causes of their states (via powers and perceptions) and for God to conserve substances (Sleigh 2, 174). God is thus involved in continual creation, and since his causal activity complements that of substances, Leibniz does not count this as miraculous. Properly speaking, this is not intervention on God's part, but cooperation or concurrence. Leibniz writes: “In concurring with our actions, God ordinarily does no more than follow the laws he has established, that is, he continually conserves and produces our being in such a way that thoughts come to us spontaneously or freely in the order that the notion pertaining to our individual substance contains them, a notion in which they could be foreseen from all eternity” (Discourse on Metaphysics §30 GP iv, 454/AG 63).


Works of Leibniz

[A] Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz: Sämtliche Schriften und Briefe. Edited by the German Academy of Science. Darmstadt and Berlin: Berlin Academy, 1923-. Cited by series, volume, and page.
[AG] Philosophical Essays. Edited and translated by Roger Ariew and Daniel Garber. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1989.
[C] Opuscules et Fragments Inédits de Leibniz. Edited by Louis Couturat. Paris: Felix Alcan, 1903.
[GM] Leibnizens Mathematische Schriften. Edited by C. I. Gerhardt. Berlin: Weidman, 1875-90. Cited by volume and page.
[GP] Die Philosophischen Schriften von Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz. Edited by C.I. Gerhardt. Berlin: Weidman, 1875-1890. Cited by volume and page.
[H] Theodicy. Edited by Austin Farrer and translated by E.M. Huggard. New Haven: Yale UP, 1952.
[L] Philosophical Papers and Letters. Edited by Leroy Loemker, 2nd ed. Dordrecht: Reidel, 1969.
[P] Philosophical Writings. Translated and edited by Mary Morris and G.H.R. Parkinson. London: Dent, 1973.
[NE] New Essays on Human Understanding. Translated and edited by Peter Remnant and Jonathon Bennett. Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 1982.
[W] Leibniz: Selections. Edited by Philip P. Wiener. New York: Charles Scribner's Sons, 1951.

Secondary Literature

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Related Entries

Aristotle | Hume, David | Malebranche, Nicolas | occasionalism | perception: the problem of | Spinoza, Baruch | substance