Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Personal Identity

First published Tue Aug 20, 2002; substantive revision Tue Feb 20, 2007

Personal identity deals with questions about ourselves qua people (or persons). Many of these questions are familiar ones that occur to everyone at some time: What am I? When did I begin? What will happen to me when I die? Discussions of personal identity go right back to the origins of Western philosophy, and most major figures have had something to say about it. (There is also a rich literature on personal identity in Eastern philosophy, which I am not competent to discuss. Collins 1982 is a good source.)

I will first survey the main questions that go under the heading of personal identity. Most of the entry will then focus on the one that has received most attention in recent times, that of personal identity over time. I will discuss what the question means, and the main proposed answers. I will also try to show how these answers relate to some of the other questions about personal identity, and to more general questions in metaphysics and the philosophy of mind.

1. The Problems of Personal Identity

There is no single problem of personal identity, but rather a wide range of loosely connected questions. Here are the main ones:

Who am I? We often speak of one's "personal identity" as what makes one the person one is. Your identity in this sense consists roughly of those properties that make you unique as an individual and different from others. Or it is the way you see or define yourself. Or it may be the network of values and convictions that structure your life. We might call it your individual psychological identity. Your individual psychological identity is a property (or set of properties), and presumably one that you have only contingently: you might have had a different identity from the one you in fact have. Likewise, it is a property that you might have for a while and then lose: you could acquire a new individual identity, or perhaps even carry on without one. (Ludwig 1997 is a typical discussion of the Who am I? question.)

Personhood. What is it to be a person? What is necessary, and what is sufficient, for something to count as a person, as opposed to a non-person? What have people got that non-people haven't got? This is more or less equivalent to asking for the definition of the word person. An answer would take the form “Necessarily, x is a person if and only if … x …”, with the blanks appropriately filled in. More specifically, we can ask at what point in one's development from a fertilized egg there comes to be a person, and what it would take for a chimpanzee or a Martian or an electronic computer to be a person, if they could ever be. (See e.g. Chisholm 1976: 136f., Baker 2000: ch. 3.)

Persistence. What does it take for a person to persist from one time to another — that is, for the same person to exist at different times? What sorts of adventures could you possibly survive, in the broadest sense of the word 'possible'? What sort of thing would necessarily bring your existence to an end? What determines which past or future being is you? Suppose you point to a little girl in an old class photograph and say, "That's me." What makes you that girl, rather than one of the others? What is it about the way she relates then to you as you are now that makes her you? For that matter, what makes it the case that you existed at all back then? This is the question of personal identity over time. An answer to it is an account of our persistence conditions, or a criterion of personal identity over time (a "constitutive" rather than an evidential criterion: see the Evidence Question below).

Historically this question often arises out of the hope (or fear) that we might continue to exist after we die. Whether this is in any sense possible depends on whether biological death is the sort of thing that one could survive. Imagine that after your death there really will be someone, in the next world or in this one, who is rather like you. How would that being have to relate to you as you are now in order to be you — rather than me, say, or a new person who didn't exist before? What would the Higher Powers have to do in order to keep you in existence (or bring you back into existence) after your death? Or is there anything they could do? The answer to these questions depends on the answer to the Persistence Question.

Evidence. How do we find out who is who? What evidence bears on the question of whether the person here now is the one who was here yesterday? What ought we to do when different kinds of evidence support opposing verdicts? One source of evidence is first-person memory: if you remember doing something, or at least seem to remember, it was probably you who did it. Another source is physical continuity: if the person who did it looks just like you, or even better if she is in some sense physically or spatio-temporally continuous with you, that is reason to think she is you. Which of these sources is more fundamental? Does first-person memory supply evidence all by itself, for instance, or does it count as evidence only insofar as we can check it against publicly available physical evidence?

The Evidence Question dominated the philosophical literature on personal identity from the 1950s to the 1970s (Shoemaker 1963 and Penelhum 1970 are good examples). Though it is sometimes confused with the Persistence Question, the two are not the same. What it takes for you to persist through time is one thing; how we find out whether you have is another. If the criminal had fingerprints just like yours, the courts may conclude that he is you. But even if that is conclusive evidence, having your fingerprints is not what it is for a past or future being to be you: it is neither necessary (you could survive without any fingers at all) nor sufficient (someone else could have fingerprints just like yours).

Population. If we think of the Persistence Question as asking which of the characters introduced at the beginning of a story have survived to become the characters at the end of it, we can also ask how many characters are on the stage at any one time. What determines how many of us there are now? If there are some six billion people on the earth at present, what facts — biological, psychological, or what have you — make it the case that that is how many there are? The question is not what causes there to be a certain number of people at a given time, but what there being that number of people consists in. It is like asking what sort of configuration of pieces amounts to black's winning a game of chess, and not like asking what sorts of moves lead to its winning.

You may think that the number of people at any given time is simply the number of human organisms there are then (perhaps discounting those in a defective state that don't count as people, and ignoring non-human people, if there are any). But this is disputed. Surgeons sometimes cut the nerve bands connecting one's cerebral hemispheres (commissurotomy), resulting in such peculiar behavior as simultaneously pulling one's trousers up with one hand and pulling them down with the other. You might think that this gives us two people sharing one organism. (See e.g. Nagel 1971. Puccetti 1973 argues that there are two people within the skin of every normal human being.) Or maybe a human being with split personality could literally be the home of two or more different thinking beings (Wilkes 1988: 127f., Rovane 1998; see also Olson 2003b).

This is sometimes called the problem of "synchronic identity", as opposed to the "diachronic identity" of the Persistence Question (and the "counterfactual identity" of the How could I have been? Question below). We must handle these terms with care, however, for they are apt to give the impression that identity comes in two kinds, synchronic and diachronic: a serious blunder. The truth is simply that are two kinds of situations where we can ask how many people (or other things) there are: synchronic situations involving just one moment and diachronic ones involving a stretch of time.

What am I? What sort of things, metaphysically speaking, are you and I and other human people? What is our basic metaphysical nature? For instance, what are we made of? Are we made up entirely of matter, or partly or wholly of something else? If we are made of matter, which matter makes us up at any moment? What parts do we have, if any? Are we substances — metaphysically independent beings — or is each of us a state or an aspect of something else, or perhaps some sort of process or event?

One possible answer to this question is that we are biological organisms. Surprisingly perhaps, most philosophers reject this. (We will return to it later.) Another is that we are partless immaterial substances (or compound things made up of an immaterial soul and a material body: see Swinburne 1984). Hume suggested that each of us is "a bundle of perceptions" (1978: 252; see also Quinton 1962 and Rovane 1998: 212). A popular view nowadays is that we are material things "constituted by" human animals: you are made of the same matter as a certain animal, but you and the animal are different things because what it takes for you to persist is different (Shoemaker 1984: 112–114 and 1999, Baker 2000). Another is the idea that we are temporal parts of animals (Lewis 1976). There is even the paradoxical view that there is nothing that we are: we don't really exist at all (Russell 1985: 50, Wittgenstein 1922: 5.631, Unger 1979).

How could I have been? How different could I have been from the way I actually am? Which of my properties do I have essentially, and which only accidentally or contingently? Could I, for instance, have had different parents? Frank Sinatra and Doris Day might have had children together. Could I have been one of them? Or could they only have had children other than me? Could I have died in the womb before I acquired any mental features? Are there possible worlds just like the actual one except for who is who — where people have "changed places" so that what is in fact your career is my career and vice versa? Whether these are best described as questions about personal identity is debatable. (They are not about whether beings in other worlds are identical with people in the actual world: see van Inwagen 1985.) But they are often discussed in connection with the others.

What matters in identity? What is the practical importance of facts about our identity and persistence? Why should we care about it? Why does it matter? Imagine that surgeons are going to put your brain into my head, and that neither of us has any choice about this. Will the resulting person — who will presumably think he is you — be responsible for my actions, or for yours? (Or both? Or neither?) Suppose he will be in terrible pain after the operation unless one of us pays a large sum in advance. If we were both entirely selfish, which of us would have a reason to pay?

The answer may seem to turn entirely on whether the resulting person would be you or I. Only you can be responsible for your actions. The only one whose future welfare you cannot rationally ignore is yourself. You have a special, selfish interest in your own future, and no one else's. What matters in identity, we might say, is identity. But some deny this. They say that someone else could be responsible for your actions. You could have an entirely selfish reason to care about someone else's well-being for his own sake. I care, or ought rationally to care, about what happens to the man people will call Olson tomorrow not because he is me, but because he is then psychologically continuous with me as I am now (see Section 4), or because he relates to me in some other way that doesn't imply that he and I are one. If someone other than me were psychologically continuous tomorrow with me as I am now, he would have what matters to me, and I ought to transfer my selfish concern to him. (See Shoemaker 1970: 284; Parfit 1971, 1984: 215, 1995; Martin 1998.)

That completes our survey of problems. Though these eight questions are related, it is hard to find any interesting common feature that makes them all questions about personal identity. In any case they are different, and it is important not to confuse them.

2. Understanding the Persistence Question

Let us turn now to the Persistence Question. Few concepts have been the source of more misunderstanding than identity over time. The Persistence Question is often confused with other questions or stated in a tendentious way. It is important to get it right.

The question is what is necessary and sufficient for a past or future being to be you. Suppose we point to you now, and then point to or describe someone or something existing at another time — a certain aged man or woman, say. Then we can ask whether we are pointing to one thing twice, or pointing once to each of two things. This is a question about the identity or persistence of a person over time. (There are precisely analogous questions about the identity over time of other objects, such as dogs.) The Persistence Question asks what determines the answer to such questions, or makes statements about our identity over time true or false.

The Persistence Question is about numerical identity. To say that this and that are numerically identical is to say that they are one and the same: one thing rather than two. This is different from qualitative identity. Things are qualitatively identical when they are exactly similar. Identical twins may be qualitatively identical — there may be no telling them apart — but they are not numerically identical, for there are two of them: that's what makes them twins. A past or future person needn't, at that past or future time, be exactly like you are now in order to be you — that is, in order to be numerically identical with you. You don't remain qualitatively the same throughout your life. You change: in size, appearance, and in many other ways. So the question is not what it takes for a past or future being to be qualitatively just like you, but what it takes for a past or future being to be you, rather than someone or something other than you.

(Someone might say, as Hume apparently did, that a past or future being couldn't be you unless he or she were then qualitatively just like you are now. That would be a highly contentious metaphysical claim. It amounts to denying that anything can survive any change whatever: even blinking your eyes would be fatal, resulting in your ceasing to exist and being replaced with someone else. It would mean that you did not exist even a moment ago. There would be no point in asking the persistence question if this were the case. Virtually all discussions of personal identity over time assume that it is possible for a person to change.)

The confusion of qualitative with numerical identity is one source of misunderstanding about the Persistence Question. Here is another. People sometimes ask what it takes for someone to remain the same person from one time to another. The idea is that if I were to alter in certain ways — if I lost most of my memory, or my personality changed dramatically, or I underwent a profound religious conversion, say — then I should no longer be the person I was before. The question of what it takes for someone to remain the same person is not the Persistence Question. It is not in fact a question about numerical identity. If it were, it would answer itself, for I necessarily remain numerically the same for as long as I exist. Nothing could make me a numerically different person from the one I am now. Nothing can start out as one thing and end up as another, numerically different thing. This has nothing to do with personal identity in particular, but is simply a fact about the logic of identity.

Those who say that after a certain sort of adventure you would be a different person, or that you would no longer be the person you once were, presumably mean that you would still exist, but would have changed in some profound and important way. If the person resulting from the adventure were not numerically identical with you, it would not be the case that you were "a different person". Rather, you would have ceased to exist and been replaced by someone else. Those who say these things are usually thinking of one's individual identity in the Who am I? sense: they are talking about the possibility of your losing some or all of the properties that make up your individual identity and acquiring new ones . This has nothing to do with the Persistence Question.

It is unfortunate that the words ‘identity’ and ‘same’ are used to mean so many different things: numerical identity, qualitative identity, individual psychological identity, and more. To make matters worse, some philosophers speak of "surviving" in a way that doesn't imply numerical identity, so that I could "survive" a certain adventure even though I won't exist afterwards. Confusion is inevitable.

Here is a more insidious misunderstanding. Many people try to state the Persistence Question like this:

  1. Under what possible circumstances is a person existing at one time identical with a person existing at another time?

In other words, what does it take for past or future person to be you? We have a person existing at one time, and a person existing at another time, and the question is what is necessary and sufficient for them to be one person rather than two.

This question is too narrow. We may want to know whether you were ever an embryo or a foetus, or whether you could survive in a persistent vegetative state. These are clearly questions about what it takes for us to persist, and an account of our identity over time ought to answer them. (Their answers may have important ethical implications: it is relevant to the morality of abortion, for instance, whether something that is an embryo or foetus at one time can be an adult person at another time, or whether, by contrast, the adult person is always numerically different from the foetus.) But many philosophers define ‘person’ as something that has certain mental features. Locke, for instance, famously said that a person is "a thinking intelligent being, that has reason and reflection, and can consider itself as itself, the same thinking thing, in different times and places" (1975: 335). And neurologists say that early-term foetuses and human beings in a persistent vegetative state have no mental features at all. If anything like Locke's definition is right, such beings are not people. In that case we cannot ask whether you were once an embryo or could come to be a vegetable by asking what it takes for a past or future person to be you.

We can see the problem more clearly by considering a particular answer to question 1:

Necessarily, a person who exists at one time is identical with a person who exists at another time if and only if the former person can, at the former time, remember an experience the latter person had at the latter time, or vice versa.

That is, a past or future person is you just in the case that you can now remember an experience she had then, or she can then remember an experience you are having now. (This view is also sometimes attributed to Locke, though it is doubtful whether he actually held it.) Call it the Memory Criterion.

The Memory Criterion may seem to imply that if you were to lapse into a persistent vegetative state, the resulting vegetable would not be you, as it would be unable to remember anything. You would have ceased to exist, or perhaps passed on to the next world. But in fact it implies no such thing. That is because this is not a case involving a person existing at one time and a person existing at another time (assuming that a human vegetable is not a person). The Memory Criterion tells us which past or future person you are, but not which past or future thing. It tells us what it takes for one to persist as a person, but not what it takes for one to persist without qualification. So it implies nothing at all about whether you could persist as a vegetable. For the same reason it says nothing about whether you were ever an embryo. (Olson 1997: 22–26, Mackie 1999: 224–228).

So we hadn't better ask question 1. Instead we ought to ask what it takes for any past or future being, person or not, to be you or I:

  1. Under what possible circumstances is a person who exists at one time identical with something that exists at another time (whether or not it is a person then)?
Philosophers typically ask 1 rather than 2 because they assume that every person is a person essentially: nothing that is in fact a person could possibly exist without being a person. (By contrast, something that is in fact a student could exist without being a student: no student is essentially a student.) If that is true, then whatever is a person at one time must be a person at every other time when she exists. This assumption makes questions 1 and 2 equivalent. Whether it is true, however, is a serious question (an instance of the How could I have been? Question). If you are a person essentially, it follows that you could not possibly have been an embryo, or come to be a vegetable (supposing, again, that such things aren't people). The embryo that gave rise to you is not numerically identical with you. You came into existence only when that being developed certain mental capacities. The assumption that you are a person essentially also rules out our being animals, for no animal is a person essentially: every human animal started out as an unthinking embryo, and may end up as an unthinking vegetable.

Whether we are animals and whether we were once embryos are substantive questions that an account of personal identity ought to answer. They are not matters to be settled in advance by the way we set up the debate. So we cannot assume at the outset that we are people (in something like Locke's sense) essentially. Asking question 1 prejudges the issue by favoring some accounts of what we are and what it takes for us to persist over others. In particular, asking 1 effectively rules out the Somatic Approach described in the next section. It is like asking which man committed the crime before ruling out the possibility that it might have been a woman.

3. Accounts of Our Identity Through Time

Almost all proposed answers to the Persistence Question fall into one of three categories. The first is the Psychological Approach, according to which some psychological relation is necessary or sufficient (or both) for one to persist. You are that future being that in some sense inherits its mental features — beliefs, memories, preferences, the capacity for rational thought, that sort of thing — from you; and you are that past being whose mental features you have inherited in this way. There is dispute over just what sort of inheritance this has to be — whether it must be underpinned by some sort of physical continuity, for instance, or whether a "non-branching" requirement is needed. There is also disagreement about what mental features need to be inherited. (I will return to some of these issues.) But most philosophers writing on personal identity since the early 20th century have endorsed some version of the psychological approach. The memory criterion mentioned earlier is an example. Advocates of the Psychological Approach include Johnston (1987), Garrett (1998), Hudson (2001), Lewis (1976), Nagel (1986, 40), Noonan (2003), Nozick (1981), Parfit (1971; 1984, 207), Perry (1972), Shoemaker (1970; 1984, 90; 1997; 1999), and Unger (1990, ch. 5; 2000).

A second idea is that our identity through time consists in some brute physical relation. You are that past or future being that has your body, or that is the same biological organism as you are, or the like. Whether you survive or perish has nothing to do with psychological facts. I will call this the Somatic Approach. It is comparatively unpopular. (It should not be confused with the view that physical evidence has some sort of priority over psychological evidence in finding out who is who. That has to do with the Evidence Question and not the Persistence Question.) Its advocates include Ayers (1990: 278–292), Carter (1989), Mackie (1999), Olson (1997), van Inwagen (1990), and Williams (1956–7, 1970).

You may think the truth lies somewhere between the two: we need both mental and physical continuity to survive; or perhaps either would suffice without the other. Views of this sort are usually versions of the Psychological Approach as I have defined it. Here is a test case. Imagine that your cerebrum — the upper brain that is primarily responsible for your mental features — is transplanted into my head. Two beings result: the person who ends up with your cerebrum and most of your mental features, and the empty-headed being left behind, which may still be biologically alive but will have no mental features at all. Those who say that you would be the one who gets your cerebrum usually say so because they believe that some relation involving psychology suffices for you to persist: they accept the Psychological Approach. Those who say that you would be the empty-headed vegetable say so because they take your identity to consist in something non-psychological, as the Somatic Approach has it.

Both the Psychological and Somatic Approaches agree that there is something that it takes for us to persist — that our identity through time consists in or necessarily follows from something other than itself. A third view denies this. Mental and physical continuity are evidence for identity, it says, but do not always guarantee it, and are not required. No sort of continuity is absolutely necessary or absolutely sufficient for you to survive — or at least none is both necessary and sufficient. The only correct and complete answer to the Persistence Question is that a person existing at one time is identical with a being existing at another if and only they are identical. There are no informative, non-trivial persistence conditions for people. This is sometimes called the Simple View (Chisholm 1976: 108ff., Swinburne 1984, Lowe 1996: 41ff., Merricks 1998). It is often combined with the view that we are immaterial or have no parts, though it needn't be. The Simple View is poorly understood, and deserves more attention than it has received. (For an interesting discussion see Zimmerman 1998.)

It seems that the Persistence Question must have an answer. One of these three views, or another that I haven't mentioned, must be true. If there is such a thing as you — if there is anything sitting there and reading this now — then some conditions must be necessary and sufficient for it to persist. Those conditions will involve psychology, or some sort of brute physical continuity, or something else. Or there are no such conditions, as the Simple View has it. Moreover, at most one such view can be true. We will revisit this claim in Section 8, however.

4. The Psychological Approach

Most people (most Western philosophy teachers and students, at any rate) feel immediately drawn to the Psychological Approach. It seems obvious that you would go along with your brain if it were transplanted into a different head, and that this is so because that organ would carry with it your memories and other mental features. This would lead that person to believe that he or she was you. Why should this belief be mistaken? That suggests that our identity over time has something to do with psychology. It is notoriously difficult, however, to get from this conviction to a plausible answer to the Persistence Question.

What psychological relation might our identity through time consist in? We have already mentioned memory: a past or future being is you if and only if you can now remember an experience she had then, or vice versa. This faces two well-known problems, discovered in the 18th century by Seargeant and Berkeley (see Behan 1979), but more famously discussed by Reid and Butler (see the excerpts in Perry 1975).

First, suppose a young student is fined for overdue library books. Later, as a middle-aged lawyer, she remembers paying the fine. Later still, in her dotage, she remembers her law career, but has entirely forgotten paying the fine, and everything else she did in her youth. According to the Memory Criterion, the young student is the middle-aged lawyer, the lawyer is the old woman, but the old woman is not the young student: an impossible result. If x and y are one and y and z are one, x and z cannot be two. Identity is transitive; memory continuity is not.

Second, it seems to belong to the very idea of remembering that you can remember only your own experiences. To remember paying a fine (or the experience of paying) is to remember yourself paying. That makes it trivial and uninformative to say that you are the person whose experiences you can remember — that is, to say that memory continuity is sufficient for personal identity. It is uninformative because you can't know whether someone genuinely remembers a past experience without already knowing whether he is the one who had it. Suppose we want to know whether Blott, who exists now, is the same as Clott, whom we know to have existed at some time in the past. The Memory Criterion tells us that Blott is Clott if Blott can now remember an experience of Clott's that occurred at that past time. But Blott's seeming to remember one of Clott's experiences from that time counts as genuine memory only if Blott actually is Clott. We should have to know who was who before applying the theory that is supposed to tell us who is who. Saying that you are the person whose experiences you can remember is like saying that you are the person who is entitled to your passport: true, but trivial. (Note, however, that this problem does not affect the claim that memory connections are necessary for identity. There is nothing trivial about that.)

One response to the first problem is to switch from direct to indirect memory connections: the old woman is the young student because she can recall experiences the lawyer had at a time when the lawyer remembered the student's life. The second problem is traditionally met by inventing a new concept, "retrocognition" or "quasi-memory", which is just like memory but without the identity requirement: even if it is self-contradictory to say that I remember doing something I didn't do, I could still "quasi-remember" it (Penelhum 1970: 85ff., Shoemaker 1970; for criticism see McDowell 1997). Neither solution gets us far, however, for the Memory Criterion faces a more obvious problem: there are many times in my past that I can't remember or quasi-remember at all, and to which I am not even linked indirectly by an overlapping chain of memories. There is no time when I could recall anything that happened to me while I was asleep last night. So the Memory Criterion has the absurd implication that I did not exist then, and the man who slept in my bed last night was someone else.

A better way forward appeals to the notion of causal dependence (Shoemaker 1984, 89ff.). Let us say that a being at a later time is psychologically connected with someone who exists at an earlier time if and only if the later being has the psychological features she has at the later time in large part because the earlier being has the psychological features she has at the earlier time. Having a current memory (or quasi-memory) of a past experience is one sort of psychological connection — the experience causes the memory of it — but there are others. And let us say that you are now psychologically continuous with a past or future being if and only if your current mental features relate to those she has then by a chain of psychological connections. Then we can say that a person who exists at one time is identical with something existing at another time if and only if the first is, at the first time, psychologically continuous with the second as she is at the second time.

This still leaves important questions unanswered. Suppose we could somehow copy all the mental contents of your brain onto mine, thereby erasing the previous contents of both brains. The resulting being would be mentally like you were before, and not like I was before. Whether this would be a case of psychological continuity depends on what sort of causal dependence counts. The resulting person would have inherited your mental properties in a way, but not in the usual way. Is it the right way? Could you literally move from one human animal to another via "brain-state transfer"? Advocates of the Psychological Approach disagree (Unger 1990: 67–71, Shoemaker 1997). (Schechtman 1996 gives an interesting objection to the psychological-continuity strategy, without abandoning the Psychological Approach.)

5. Fission

Whatever psychological continuity comes down to in the end, a more serious worry for the Psychological Approach is that you could be psychologically continuous with two past or future people. If your cerebrum were transplanted, the resulting being would be psychologically continuous with you by anyone's lights. The Psychological Approach implies that she would be you. Now the cerebrum has two hemispheres, and if one of them is destroyed the resulting being is also psychologically continuous with the original person. (Hemispherectomy — even the removal of the left hemisphere, which controls speech — is considered a drastic but acceptable treatment for otherwise-inoperable brain tumors: see Rigterink 1980.) So the Psychological Approach implies that if we destroyed one of your cerebral hemispheres and transplanted the other, you would be the one who got the transplanted hemisphere.

But now let the surgeons transplant both hemispheres, each into a different empty head. (We needn't pretend, as some authors do, that the hemispheres are exactly alike.) Call the resulting people Lefty and Righty. Both will be psychologically continuous with you. If any future being who is psychologically continuous with you must be you, it follows that you are Lefty and you are Righty. That implies that Lefty is Righty, for two things cannot be numerically identical with one thing. But Lefty and Righty are clearly two. So you can't be both. We can make the same point in another way by supposing that Lefty is hungry at a time when Righty isn't. If you are Lefty, you are hungry at that time. If you are Righty, you aren't. If you are both Lefty and Righty, you are both hungry and not hungry at once: a contradiction.

The Psychological Approach appears to have the impossible consequence that one thing could be identical with two things. Short of giving up that approach altogether, there would seem to be just two ways out. One is to say that, despite appearances, "you" were really two people all along. There are two different but exactly similar people in the same place and made of the same matter at once, doing the same things and thinking the same thoughts. The surgeons merely separate them (Lewis 1976, Noonan 2003: 139–42; Perry 1972 offers a more complicated variant). The "multiple-occupancy view", as this is whimsically called, is implausible for a number of reasons, not least because it implies that we can't know how many people there are at a given time until we know what happens later. (It is usually combined with "four-dimensionalism", the metaphysical thesis that all persisting objects are extended in time and made up of temporal parts: see Section 8.)

The other solution is to take back the claim that psychological continuity by itself is sufficient for one to persist. You are identical with a past or future being who is psychologically continuous with you as you are now only if no other being is then psychologically continuous with you. (There is no unacceptable circularity in this. We don't need to know the answer to the Persistence Question in order to know how many people there are at any one time; that question comes under the Population Question.) This means that neither Lefty nor Righty is you. If both your cerebral hemispheres are transplanted, that is the end of you — though you would survive if only one were transplanted and the other destroyed. This is the "non-branching view" (Shoemaker 1984: 85, Unger 1990: 265, Garrett 1998: ch. 4; for criticism see Noonan 2003: 12–15 and ch. 7). It too is hard to believe. If you could survive with half your brain, how could preserving the other half mean that you don't survive? For that matter, the non-branching view implies you would perish if one of your hemispheres were transplanted and the other left in place. And if "brain-state transfer" gives us psychological continuity, you would cease to exist if your total brain state were copied onto another brain without erasing yours. ("Best-candidate" theories such as Nozick 1981 attempt to avoid this.)

The non-branching view makes the What Matters? question particularly acute. Faced with the prospect of having one of your hemispheres transplanted, there would seem to be no reason to prefer that the other be destroyed. On the contrary: wouldn't you rather have both preserved, even if they go into different heads? Yet on the non-branching view that is to prefer death over continued existence. This is what leads Parfit and others to say that you don't really want to continue existing. At any rate you don't want it for its own sake. Insofar as you are rational, at least, you only want there to be someone psychologically continuous with you in the future, whether or not that person is strictly you. More generally, facts about who is identical with whom have no practical importance. What matters practically is who is psychologically continuous with whom. (Lewis 1976 and Parfit 1976 debate whether the multiple-occupancy view can preserve the conviction that identity is what matters practically.)

This threatens to undermine the entire Psychological Approach. Suppose you would care about the welfare of your two fission offshoots in just the way that you ordinarily care about your own welfare, even though neither of them would be you. Then you would care about what happened to the person who got your whole brain in the original transplant case, even if she would not be you. Even if you would regard that person as yourself for all practical purposes — if you would anticipate her experiences just as you anticipate yours, for instance — that would in no way support the claim that she was you. Our reactions to the brain-transplant case would not support the claim that our identity over time consists in psychological continuity, but only the claim that psychological continuity is what matters practically. In that case we may wonder whether we have any reason to accept the Psychological Approach.

It is sometimes said that fission is not a special problem for the Psychological Approach, but afflicts all answers to the Persistence Question equally, apart (perhaps) from the Simple View. Whether this is so is an interesting question. Even if it is, though, the fission problem looks especially worrying for the Psychological Approach, for it threatens the support for that view without affecting the arguments for rival views. (It does not undermine arguments for the Somatic Approach, for instance.)

6. The Thinking-Animal Problem

The Psychological Approach faces another problem (Carter 1989, Ayers 1990: 278–292, Snowdon 1990, Olson 1997: 80f., 100–109, 2003a). It arises because that view implies that we are not human animals, for no sort of psychological continuity is either necessary or sufficient for a human animal to persist.

Every human animal starts out as an embryo, and may end up in a persistent vegetative state. Neither an embryo nor a human vegetable has any mental features at all, and so neither is psychologically continuous with anything. This shows that a human animal can persist without any sort of psychological continuity: psychological continuity is not necessary for animal identity. If you need psychological continuity to persist, you cannot be an animal.

The brain-transplant story shows that no sort of psychological continuity is sufficent for an animal to persist. If your cerebrum is transplanted into another head, the one who gets that organ, and no one else, will be psychological continuous, at that time, with you as you were before the operation. Do the surgeons thereby move a human organism from one head to another? It seems not. They simply move an organ from one animal to another, just as they might do with a kidney or a liver. We can have continuously physically realized, non-branching psychological continuity between one human animal and another. Thus, no sort of psychological continuity suffices for animal identity. If it suffices for your identity — if you would go along with your transplanted cerebrum and leave your animal behind — then you are not an animal. Not only are you not essentially an animal. You are not an animal at all, even contingently: nothing that is even contingently an animal would go along with its transplanted cerebrum.

The problem with this is that there is a human animal located where you are. That animal would seem to have the same thoughts and other mental features as you have. (It shares your brain.) But the Psychological Approach implies that you are not that animal. It follows that there is a conscious, intelligent being other than you now sitting in your chair and thinking your thoughts. There are twice as many thinking beings as the census-takers report. This ought to lead you to wonder which thinker you are. You may believe that you are the non-animal — the one with psychological persistence conditions. But the animal has the same reasons for believing that it has psychological persistence conditions as you have for supposing that you do. Yet it is mistaken. How do you know that you're not the one making the mistake? Even if you are the non-animal thinker with the psychological persistence conditions, it seems that you could never know it.

Three solutions to this problem have been proposed (apart from giving up the Psychological Approach altogether, that is). Some say that human animals have psychological persistence conditions (Wiggins 1980: 160, 180; McDowell 1997: 237; for criticism see Olson 1997: 114–119). Despite appearances, the Psychological Approach is compatible with our being animals, and so the problem doesn't arise. The surgeons do not move your cerebrum from one animal to another in the transplant story. Rather, one animal has its parts cut away until it is the size of a cerebrum. It thereby ceases to be an animal (a detached cerebrum is not an animal), and is moved across the room and given a new complement of parts, at which point it comes to be an animal once more. This view has not proved popular, however.

A second solution is to deny that human animals can think in the way that we do. Thinking animals are not a problem for the Psychological Approach because there are none. Why can't human animals think? You would expect the explanation to be that they are material things, and no material thing can think. If any material thing could think, wouldn't it be an animal? But some argue that material non-animals can think even though animals cannot. Shoemaker says that organisms can't think because they have the wrong persistence conditions: the nature of mental properties entails that psychological continuity must suffice for the bearers of those properties to persist, and it does not suffice for organisms persist. Material things with the right persistence conditions, however, can think. (See Shoemaker 1984: 92–97, 1999, 2004, Olson 2002b. For a related view see Baker 2000: 101–105.)

Noonan (1998) proposes a third solution. He concedes that human animals think as we do, and invokes an unorthodox view of personhood and of first-person reference to explain how we can know that we are not those animals. First, not just any rational, self-conscious being is a person, but only one with psychological persistence conditions. So human animals don't count as people. Second, personal pronouns such as ‘I’ refer only to people. So when the animal associated with you says ‘I’, it doesn't refer to itself. Rather, it refers to you, the person who shares in that utterance. When it says, "I am a person," it doesn't express the false belief that it is a person, but the true belief that you are. The animal is not mistaken about which thing it is, and neither are you. You can infer that you are a person from the linguistic facts that you are whatever you refer to when you say ‘I’, and that ‘I’ never refers to anything but a person. (For discussion see Olson 2002a.)

7. The Somatic Approach

There appears to be a thinking animal located where you are. It also appears that you are the thinking thing — the only one — located there. If things are as they appear, then you are that animal. The view that we are animals is sometimes called Animalism.

Animalism does not imply that all animals, or even all human animals, are people. We may not want to call human embryos or animals in a persistent vegetative state ‘people’. Being a person may be only a temporary property of you, like being a philosopher. Nor does animalism imply that all people are animals. It is consistent with the existence of wholly inorganic people: gods or angels or rational robots. It does not say that being an animal is part of what it is to be a person (a view defended in Wiggins 1980, 171 and Wollheim 1984, ch. 1 and criticized in Snowdon 1996). Animalism leaves the answer to the Personhood Question entirely open.

If we are animals, we have the persistence conditions of animals. And as we saw, animals appear to persist by virtue of some sort of brute physical continuity. So Animalism seems to imply a version of the Somatic Approach.

A few philosophers endorse the Somatic Approach without saying that we are animals. They say that we are our bodies (Thomson 1997), or that our identity through time consists in the identity of our bodies (Ayer 1936: 194). This has been called the Bodily Criterion of personal identity. Its relation to Animalism is uncertain. If a person's body is by definition a sort of animal, then perhaps being identical to one's body is the same as being an animal. Whether this is so depends in part on what it is for something to be someone's body — a surprisingly difficult question (see van Inwagen 1980, Olson 1997: 144–149).

The Somatic Approach is unpopular. We have already met the main objection to it: when we reflect on the cerebrum-transplant story, it seems obvious that you would go along with your transplanted cerebrum, even though the animal would stay behind. The claim that you would stay behind, and that someone who thinks she is you and has full memories of your life and even has your brain might not be you, might seem incredible (see Unger 2000). This is often taken to be completely decisive.

The Somatic Approach has the virtue of being compatible with our beliefs about who is who in actual cases. In every actual case, the number of people we think there are is equal to the number of human animals. Every actual case in which we take someone to survive or perish is a case where a human animal survives or perishes. The Psychological Approach, or at any rate for the view that psychological continuity is necessary for us to persist, does not share this virtue. When someone lapses into a persistent vegetative state, his friends and relatives rarely conclude that their loved one no longer exists, even when they believe that there is no mental continuity of any sort between the human vegetable and the person. (They may conclude that his life no longer has any value; but that is another matter.) And most of us believe that we were once foetuses. When we see an ultrasound picture of a 12-week-old foetus, we ordinarily think we are seeing something that will, if all goes well, be born, learn to speak, and eventually become an adult human person. Yet none of us is in any way psychologically continuous with a 12-week-old foetus. And one might set more store by our opinions about cases we have actually confronted than by our opinions about science-fiction stories.

Friends of the Somatic Approach can also try to account for the attraction of the transplant argument in a way that is consistent with their view. Whenever someone has memories, personality, and other mental traits just like yours, that is strong evidence for his being you. All the more so if he inherited those traits from you. Brute physical continuity is also far less important to the narrative structure of most stories than mental continuity. When we hear a story, we don't much care about which person at the end of it is the same animal as a certain person at the beginning. We care about who is psychologically continuous with that person. These facts might lead us to think that the one who got your transplanted cerebrum would be you even if, because you are an animal, this is not the case.

This last thought suggests that the Somatic Approach, like the non-branching view, might imply that identity has no practical importance. The one who got your transplanted cerebrum may have all that matters in identity. You might have a reason, before the transplant, to care selfishly about what will happen to him or her afterwards. He might be responsible for your actions, entitled to your bank account, and so on. Yet on the Somatic Approach he would not be you.

8. Wider Issues

We have compared the virtues of the two main accounts of our identity over time. We saw that the Psychological Approach, despite its initial attraction, faces problems with fission. The usual "non-branching" solution is both implausible in itself and suggests that identity has no practical importance, which in turn undermines the original support for the Psychological Approach. And it implies that we are not animals, raising the awkward problem of how we relate to the apparently intelligent animals we call our bodies. The Somatic Approach — in particular when combined with the view that we are animals — is also intuitively attractive, and solves the thinking-animal problem. But it has implausible consequences about our identity over time. Is there any way to move the discussion forward?

I believe that the debate turns on more general issues in metaphysics and the philosophy of mind. For instance, advocates of the Psychological Approach appear to be committed to the view that each normal human organism is associated with a non-organism that thinks and is conscious. They will need an account of the metaphysical nature of this non-organism, and of how it relates to the animal. If they hope to solve the thinking-animal problem by denying that human animals can think, they will need an account of the nature of mental properties that is consistent with this.

Some general metaphysical views suggest that there is no unique right answer to the question of what it takes for us to persist. Perhaps the best-known example is the ontology of temporal parts or "four-dimensionalism" (see Heller 1990, ch. 1, Sider 2001). It says that a persisting thing exists at different times by having different temporal parts located at those times, much as a spatially extended thing exists in different places by having different spatial parts located in those places. All persisting things have earlier and later parts in the way that tennis matches do. For every period of time when you exist, short or long, there is a temporal part of you that exists only then.

What things are we, on this view? There are many likely candidates. Suppose you are a material thing, and that we know what determines your spatial boundaries. That should tell us what counts as your current temporal part or "stage" — the temporal part of you located now and at no other time. That stage is a part of a vast number of temporally extended objects (Hudson 2001: ch. 4). For instance, it is a part of a being whose temporal boundaries are determined by relations of psychological continuity, in the sense defined in Section 4, among its stages. That is, one of the beings thinking your current thoughts is an aggregate of person-stages, each of which is psychologically continuous with each of the others and not with anything else. The view that we persist by virtue of psychological continuity suggests that that is what you are.

Your current stage is also a part of a being whose temporal boundaries are determined by relations of psychological connectedness (Section 4 again). That is, one of the beings now thinking your thoughts is an aggregate of person-stages, each of which is psychologically connected with each of the others and not to anything else. This may not be the same as the first being, for some stages may be psychologically continuous with your current stage but not psychologically connected with it. The view that psychological connectedness is necessary and sufficient for us to persist suggests that we are beings of the second sort (Lewis 1976). Your current stage is also a part of an animal. And it is a part of many bizarre and gerrymandered objects, such as Hirsch's "contacti persons" (Hirsch 1982, ch. 10). Some even say that you are your current stage itself (Sider 2001, 188–208).

Four-dimensionalism implies that you share your current thoughts with countless beings that diverge from one another in the past or future. This makes it hard to say which thing you are, or which things any of us are. And because each of these beings persist through time by virtue of something different, it is equally hard to say what our identity over time consists in. How could we ever know? We could say that we are the beings we refer to when we say ‘I’, or more generally the beings that our personal pronouns and proper names refer to. That seems true enough; but it is unlikely, given four-dimensionalism, that our personal pronouns succeed in referring to just one sort of thing. It is more likely that each utterance of a personal pronoun refers ambiguously to many different candidates: to various sorts of psychologically interrelated aggregates, to an animal, and perhaps to others as well. That would make it indeterminate which things, even which kinds of things, we are. And insofar as the different candidates have different persistence conditions, it would be indeterminate what our identity over time consists in. Some versions of the metaphysic of constitution (Baker 2000) have similar implications.

These wider questions — about the nature of mental properties and the existence of temporal parts, among others — cannot be settled by thinking about personal identity alone. Which view of personal identity one finds attractive is likely to depend on one's general metaphysical beliefs. So there may not be much point in asking about our identity over time without first addressing these underlying issues.


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identity | identity: relative | Locke, John | personal identity: and ethics | temporal parts


Some material in this entry appeared previously in E. Olson, ‘Personal Identity’, in The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Mind, edited by S. Stich and T. Warfield, Oxford: Blackwell, 2003.