Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Frege's Logic, Theorem, and Foundations for Arithmetic

Proof that Q is Hereditary on the Natural Numbers

We want to prove the following claim:
The proof of this claim appeals to the following Lemma (cf. Gg I, Theorem 149):
Lemma on Predecessor+:
Nx & Precedes(y,x) →
   #[λz Precedes+(z,y)] = #[λz Precedes+(z,x) & zx]

(Proof of the Lemma on Predecessor+)

Intuitively, the Lemma on Predecessor+ tells us that if y precedes a number x, then #[λz zy] is identical to #[λz zx & zx].

Now to show HerOn(Q,N), we have to show:

nm[Precedes(n,m) → (QnQm)]
If we replace ‘Q’ with its definition and simplify the result by λ-Conversion, then what we have to show is:
nm(Precedes(n,m) →
    Precedes(n,#[λz Precedes+(z,n)]) → Precedes(m,#[λz Precedes+(z,m)])
(Intuitively, we have to show that if n precedes m, then if n precedes the number of numbers less than or equal to n, then m precedes the number of numbers less than or equal to m.) So, letting n and m be arbitrary, we assume both:
(A)   Precedes(n,m)
(B)   Precedes(n,#[λz Precedes+(z,n)])
to show:
Precedes(m,#[λz Precedes+(z,m)])
By the definition of Predecessor, we have to show that there is a concept F and object x such that:
(1)   Fx
(2)   #[λz Precedes+(z,m)] = #F
(3)   m = #[λu Fu & ux]
We can demonstrate that there is an F and x for which (1), (2) and (3) hold if we pick F to be [λz Precedes+(z,m)] and pick x to be m. We now establish (1), (2), and (3) for these choices.

To show that (1) holds, we have to show:

z Precedes+(z,m)]m
But we know, from the definition of Precedes+, that Precedes+(m,m). So by abstraction using λ-Conversion, we are done.

To show that (2) holds, we need do no work, since our choice of F requires us to show:

#[λz Precedes+(z,m)] = #[λz Precedes+(z,m)],
which we know by the logic of identity.

To show (3) holds, we need to show:

(C)   m = #[λu Precedes+(u,m) & um]
[Note that the λ-expression in the above has been simplified by applying λ-Conversion to the following (which, strictly speaking, is what results when you substitute our choice for F in (3)):
uz Precedes+(z,m)]u & um]
In what follows, we use the simplified version of this λ-expression.]

Now in virtue of (A), (B) and the functionality of Predecessor (the proof of which was left as an exercise in the subsection No Two Numbers Have the Same Successor in §5), we know m = #[λz Precedes+(z,n)]. So, substituting for m in (C), we have to show:

#[λz Precedes+(z,n)] = #[λu Precedes+(u,m) & um]
But we can demonstrate this by appealing to the Lemma on Predecessor+ mentioned at the outset. We may instantiate the variables x and y in this Lemma to m and n, respectively, yielding:
Nm & Precedes(n,m) →
   #[λz Precedes+(z,n)] = #[λz Precedes+(z,m) & zm]
Since the consequent is what we had to show, we are done, for the conjuncts of the antecedent are things we assumed to be true at the beginning of our conditional proof.

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