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Ancient Ethical Theory

First published Tue 3 Aug, 2004

While moral theory does not invent morality, or even reflection on it, it does try to bring systematic thinking to bear on the phenomenon. Ancient moral theory, however, does not attempt to be a comprehensive account of all the phenomena that fall under the heading of morality. Rather, assuming piecemeal opinions and practices, it tries to capture its underlying essence. It is the nature of such an enterprise to evaluate and criticize some of these opinions and practices but that is not its primary goal. Ancient moral theory tries to provide a reflective account of an essential human activity so one can grasp what is of fundamental importance in pursuing it. In historical order, the theories to be considered in this article are those of Socrates as presented in certain dialogues of Plato; Plato in the Republic; Aristotle; the Cynics; Cyrenaic hedonism; Epicurus; the Stoics; and Pyrrhonian skepticism.

1. Introduction

In their moral theories, the ancient philosophers depended on several important notions. These include virtue and the virtues, happiness (eudaimonia), and the soul. We can begin with virtue.

Virtue is a general term that translates the Greek word aretê. Sometimes aretê is also translated as excellence. Many objects, natural or artificial, have their particular aretê or kind of excellence. There is the excellence of a horse and the excellence of a knife. Then, of course, there is human excellence. Conceptions of human excellence include such disparate figures as the Homeric warrior chieftain and the Athenian statesman of the period of its imperial expansion. Plato's character Meno sums up one important strain of thought when he says that excellence for a man is managing the business of the city so that he benefits his friends, harms his enemies, and comes to no harm himself (Meno 71e). From this description we can see that some versions of human excellence have a problematic relation to the moral virtues.

In the ancient world, courage, moderation, and justice were prime species of moral virtue. A virtue is a settled disposition to act in a certain way; justice, for instance, is the settled disposition to act, let's say, so that each one receives their due. This settled disposition includes a practical knowledge about how to bring it about, in each situation, that each receives their due. It also includes a strong positive attitude toward bringing it about that each receives their due. Just people, then, are not ones who occasionally act justly, or even who regularly act justly but do so out of some other motive; rather they are people who reliably act that way because they place a positive, high intrinsic value on rendering to each their due and they are good at it. Courage is a settled disposition that allows one to act reliably to pursue right ends in fearful situations, because one values so acting intrinsically. Moderation is the virtue that deals similarly with one's appetites and emotions.

Human excellence can be conceived in ways that do not include the moral virtues. For instance, someone thought of as excellent for benefiting friends and harming enemies can be cruel, arbitrary, rapacious, and ravenous of appetite. Most ancient philosophers, however, argue that human excellence must include the moral virtues and that the excellent human will be, above all, courageous, moderate, and just. This argument depends on making a link between the moral virtues and happiness. While most ancient philosophers hold that happiness is the proper goal or end of human life, the notion is both simple and complicated, as Aristotle points out. It seems simple to say everyone wants to be happy; it is complicated to say what happiness is. We can approach the problem by discussing, first, the relation of happiness to human excellence and, then, the relation of human excellence to the moral virtues.

It is significant that synonyms for eudaimonia are living well and doing well. These phrases imply certain activities associated with human living. Ancient philosophers argued that whatever activities constitute human living — e.g., those associated with fear — one can engage in those activities in a mediocre or even a poor way. One can feel fear and react to dangerous situations sometimes appropriately and sometimes inappropriately; or one might always act shamefully and dishonorably. However, to carry out the activities that constitute human living well over a whole lifetime, or long stretches of it, is living well or doing well. At this point the relation of happiness to human excellence should be clear. Human excellence is the psychological basis for carrying out the activities of a human life well; to that extent human excellence is also happiness. While the unhappy person deals with a vital and dynamic emotion like fear in an inept way, the happy person handles fear skillfully, and thereby exhibits human excellence.

So described, human excellence is general and covers many activities of a human life. However, one can see how human excellence might at least include the moral virtues. The moral virtue relevant to fear, for instance, is courage. Courage is a reliable disposition to react to fear in an appropriate way. What counts as appropriate entails harnessing fear for good or honorable ends. Such ends are not confined to one's own welfare but include, e.g., the welfare of one's city. In this way, moral virtues become the kind of human excellence that is other-regarding. The moral virtues, then, are excellent qualities of character — intrinsically valuable for the one who has them; but they are also valuable for others. In rough outline, we can see one important way ancient moral theory tries to link happiness to moral virtue by way of human excellence. Happiness derives from human excellence; human excellence includes the moral virtues, which are implicitly or explicitly other-regarding.

Since happiness plays such a vital role in ancient moral theory, we should note the difference between the Greek word eudaimonia and its usual translation as ‘happiness’. Although its usage varies, most often the English word ‘happiness’ refers to a feeling. For example, we say, “You can tell he feels happy right now, from the way he looks and how he is behaving.” The feeling is described as one of contentment or satisfaction, perhaps with the way one's life as a whole is going. While some think there is a distinction between feeling happy and feeling content, still happiness is a good and pleasant feeling. However, ‘happiness’ has a secondary sense that does not focus on feelings but rather on activities. For instance, one might say, “It was a happy time in my life; my work was going well.” The speaker need not be referring to the feelings he or she was experiencing but just to the fact that some important activity was going well. Of course, if their work is going well, they might feel contentment. But in speaking of their happiness, they might just as well be referring to their absorption in some successful activity. For ancient philosophers eudaimonia is closer to the secondary sense of our own term. Happiness means not so much feeling a certain way, or feeling a certain way about how one's life as a whole is going, but rather carrying out certain activities or functioning in a certain way.

In this way, then, ancient philosophers typically justify moral virtue. Being courageous, just, and moderate is valuable for the virtuous person because these virtues are inextricably linked with happiness. Everyone wants to be happy, so anyone who realizes the link between virtue and happiness will also want to be virtuous. This argument depends on two central ideas. First, human excellence is a good of the soul — not a material or bodily good such as wealth or political power. Another way to put this idea is to say happiness is not something external, like wealth or political power, but an internal, psychological good. The second central idea is that the most important good of the soul is moral virtue. By being virtuous one enjoys a psychological state whose value outweighs whatever other kinds of goods one might have by being vicious.

Finally, a few words about the soul are in order since, typically, philosophers argue that virtue is a good of the soul. In some ways, this claim is found in many traditions. Many thinkers argue that being moral does not necessarily provide physical beauty, health, or prosperity. Rather, as something good, virtue must be understood as belonging to the soul; it is a psychological good. However, in order to explain virtue as a good of the soul, one does not have to hold that the soul is immortal. While Plato, for example, holds that the soul is immortal and that its virtue is a good that transcends death, his argument for virtue as a psychological good does not depend on the immortality of the soul. He argues that virtue is a psychological good in this life. To live a mortal human life with this good is in itself happiness.

This position that links happiness and virtue is called eudaimonism — a word based on the principal Greek word for happiness, eudaimonia. By eudaimonism, we will mean one of several theses: (a) virtue, together with its active exercise, is identical with happiness; (b) virtue, together with its activities, is the most important and dominant constituent of happiness; (c) virtue is the only means to happiness. However, one must be cautious not to conclude that ancient theories in general attempt to construe the value of virtue simply as a means to achieving happiness. Each theory, as we shall see, has its own approach to the nature of the link between virtue and happiness. It would not be advisable to see ancient theories as concerned with such contemporary issues as whether moral discourse — i.e., discourse about what one ought to do — can or should be reduced to non-moral discourse — i.e., to discourse about what is good for one.

These reflections on virtue can provide an occasion for contrasting ancient moral theory and modern. One way to put the contrast is to say that ancient moral theory is agent-centered while modern moral theory is action-centered. To say that it is action-centered means that, as a theory of morality, it explains morality, to begin with, in terms of actions and their circumstances, and the ways in which actions are moral or immoral. We can roughly divide modern thinkers into two groups. Those who judge the morality of an action on the basis of its known or expected consequences are consequentialist; those who judge the morality of an action on the basis of its conformity to certain kinds of laws, prohibitions, or positive commandments are deontologists. The former include, e.g., those utilitarians who say an action is moral if it provides the greatest good for the greatest number. Deontologists say an action is moral if it conforms to a moral principle, e.g., the obligation to tell the truth. While these thinkers are not uninterested in the moral disposition to produce such actions, or in what disposition is required if they are to show any moral worth in the persons who do them, their focus is on actions, their consequences, and the rules or other principles to which they conform. The result of these ways of approaching morality is that moral assessment falls on actions. This focus explains, for instance, contemporary fascination with such questions of casuistry as, e.g., the conditions under which an action like abortion is morally permitted or immoral.

By contrast, ancient moral theory explains morality in terms that focus on the moral agent. These thinkers are interested in what constitutes, e.g., a just person. They are concerned about the state of mind and character, the set of values, the attitudes to oneself and to others, and the conception of one's own place in the common life of a community that belong to just persons simply insofar as they are just. A modern might object that this way of proceeding is backwards. Just actions are logically prior to just persons and must be specifiable in advance of any account of what it is to be a just person. Of course, the ancients had a rough idea of what just actions were; and this rough idea certainly contributed to the notion of a just person, and his motivation and system of values. Still, the notion of a just person is not exhausted by an account of the consequences of just actions, or any principle for determining which actions are and which are not just. For the ancients, the just person is compared to a craftsman, e.g., a physician. Acting as a physician is not simply a collection of medically effective actions. It is knowing when such actions are appropriate, among other things; and this kind of knowledge is not always definable. To understand what being a physician means one must turn to the physician's judgment and even motivation. These are manifested in particular actions but are not reducible to those actions. In the same way, what constitutes a just person is not exhausted by the actions he or she does nor, for that matter, by any catalogue of possible just actions. Rather, being a just person entails qualities of character proper to the just person, in the light of which they decide what actions justice requires of them.

2. Socrates

In this section we confine ourselves to the character Socrates in Plato's dialogues, and indeed to only certain ones of the dialogues in which a Socrates character plays a role. In those dialogues in which he plays a major role, Socrates varies considerably between two extremes. On the one hand, there is the Socrates who claims to know nothing about virtue and confines himself to asking other characters questions; this Socrates is found in the Apology and in certain dialogues most of which end inconclusively. These dialogues, e.g., Charmides, Laches, Crito, Euthydemus, and Euthyphro, are called aporetic. On the other hand, in other dialogues we find a Socrates who expounds positive teachings about virtue; this Socrates usually asks questions only to elicit agreement. These dialogues are didactic, and conclusive in tone, e.g., Republic, Phaedo, Phaedrus, and Philebus. However, these distinctions between kinds of dialogues and kinds of Socratic characters are not exclusive; there are dialogues that mix the aporetic and conclusive styles, e.g., Protagoras, Meno, and Gorgias. In observing these distinctions, we refer only to the characteristic style of the dialogue and leave aside controversies about the relative dates of composition of the dialogues. (See the entry on Plato, especially the section on Socrates and the section on the historical Socrates.)

The significance of this distinction among dialogues is that one can isolate a strain of moral teaching in the aporetic and mixed dialogues. In spite of their inconclusive nature, in the aporetic dialogues the character Socrates maintains principles about morality that he seems to take to be fundamental. In the mixed dialogues we find similar teaching. This strain is distinct enough from the accounts of morality in the more didactic dialogues that it has been called Socratic, as opposed to Platonic, and associated with the historical personage's own views. In what follows we limit ourselves to this “Socratic” moral teaching — without taking a position about the relation of “Socratic” moral teaching to that of the historical Socrates. For our purposes it is sufficient to point out a distinction between kinds of moral teaching in the dialogues. We will focus on the aporetic dialogues as well as the mixed dialogues Protagoras, Gorgias, and Meno.

The first feature of Socratic teaching is its heroic quality. In the Apology, Socrates says that a man worth anything at all does not reckon whether his course of action endangers his life or threatens death. He looks only at one thing — whether what he does is just or not, the work of a good or of a bad man (28b-c). Said in the context of his trial, this statement is both about himself and a fundamental claim of his moral teaching. Socrates puts moral considerations above all others. If we think of justice as, roughly, the way we treat others, the just actions to which he refers cover a wide range. It is unjust to rob temples, betray friends, steal, break oaths, commit adultery, and mistreat parents (Rep 443a-b). A similarly strong statement about wrong-doing is found in the Crito, where the question is whether Socrates should save his life by escaping from the jail in Athens and aborting the sentence of death. Socrates says that whether he should escape or not must be governed only by whether it is just or unjust to do so (48d). Obviously, by posing wrong-doing against losing one's life, Socrates means to emphasize that nothing outweighs in positive value the disvalue of doing unjust actions. In such passages, then, Socrates seems to be a moral hero, willing to sacrifice his very life rather than commit an injustice, and to recommend such heroism to others.

However, this heroism also includes an important element of self-regard. In the passage from the Apology just quoted Socrates goes on to describe his approach to the citizens of Athens. He chides them for being absorbed in the acquisition of wealth, reputation, and honor while they do not take care for nor think about wisdom, truth, and how to make their souls better (Ap. 29d-e). As he develops this idea it becomes clear that the perfection of the soul, making it better, means acquiring and having moral virtue. Rather than heaping up riches and honor, Athenians should seek to perfect their souls in virtue. From this exhortation we can conclude that for Socrates psychological good outweighs material good and that virtue is a psychological good of the first importance. The Crito gives another perspective on psychological good. Socrates says (as something obvious to everyone) that life is not worth living if that which is harmed by disease and benefited by health — i.e., the body — is ruined. But likewise, he adds, life is not worth living if that which is harmed by wrong-doing (to adikon) and benefited by the right — sc. the soul — is ruined (47e-48a). We can understand this claim in positive terms. Virtue is the chief psychological good; wrong-doing destroys virtue. So Socrates' strong commitment to virtue reflects his belief in its value for the soul, as well as the importance of the soul's condition for the quality of our lives.

A second feature of Socratic teaching is its intellectualism. In the Meno (78a-b), Socrates argues that no one knowingly desires what is bad (to kakon). His argument shows that by ‘bad’ he means things that are harmful to the subject, i.e., the one who would desire these things. In the Protagoras (358c-d) he makes a similar point when he says that it is not in human nature for someone to wish to go after what he thinks is bad in place of the good. Even if we understand good and bad here (as Socrates seems to intend) to be what is good for the subject and what is bad and harmful for the subject, the claim is still paradoxical. It seems to be obvious that humans sometimes desire to have (and wish to go after) what they know will be harmful. People can all too easily desire and go after the chocolate that they know is bad for them. Socrates, however, seems to think that we wish for or desire only what we take to be good for us. Once one recognizes (i.e., really knows and fully appreciates) that the chocolate is not good in this way, one will cease to desire it. There is no residual desire for, e.g., pleasure, that might compete with the desire for what is good. This position is called intellectualism because it implies that what ultimately motivates any action is some cognitive state: if you know what is good you will do it, and if you do an action, and it is bad, that was because you thought somehow that it was good. All error in such choices is due to ignorance.

Socratic intellectualism has two significant consequences. One is that virtue (which guarantees good action) is knowledge and the other is that virtue is sufficient for happiness. Both are elaborated in the Euthydemus. While most of this dialogue is given over to Euthydemus' and Dionysiodorus' eristic display, there are two Socratic interludes. In the first of these — in a passage that has a parallel in Meno (88a ff) — Socrates helps the young Cleinias to see that wisdom is a kind of knowledge that infallibly brings happiness. He uses an analogy with craft (technê); a carpenter must not only have but know how to use his tools and materials to be successful (Euthyd. 280b-d). In turn, someone may have such goods as health, wealth, good birth, and beauty, as well as the virtues of justice, moderation, courage, and wisdom (279a-c). Wisdom is the most important, however, because it is a kind of knowledge, like carpentry, about how to use the other assets so that they are beneficial (281b-c). Moreover, all of these other so-called goods are useless — in fact, even harmful — without wisdom, because without it one will misuse any of the other assets one may possess, so as to act not well but badly. Wisdom is the only unconditional good (281d-e). Socrates' argument leaves it ambiguous whether wisdom (taken together with its exercise) is identical with happiness or whether it is the dominant and essential component of happiness (282a-b).

In this account, the focus is on a kind of knowledge as the active ingredient in happiness. The other parts of the account are certain assets that seem as passive in relation to wisdom as wood and tools are to the carpenter. Further, since there seems to be no opposition to the work of reason in the soul, Socrates' account seems a bit naive. In fact, the neglect of the complexities of moral psychology goes hand in hand with Socratic intellectualism.

3. Plato

A significant step, then, is taken in Plato's dialogues when the character Socrates begins to suppose that the soul has desires that are not always for what is good. Then the complexities of moral psychology become an important issue in the account of virtue. That development is found in Plato's mature moral theory.

It all begins with the challenge to the very notion of morality, understood along traditional lines, mounted by Callicles in the second half of the Gorgias and Thrasymachus in Republic I. Callicles thinks that moral convention is designed by the numerous weak people to intimidate the few strong ones, to keep the latter from taking what they could if they would only use their strength. No truly strong person should be taken in by such conventions (Gorg. 482e ff). Thrasymachus argues that justice is the advantage of the more powerful; he holds that justice is a social practice set up by the powerful, i.e., rulers who require their subjects through that practice to act against their own individual and group self-interest (Rep. 338d ff). No sensible person should, and no strong-willed person would, accept rules of justice as having any legitimate authority over them. In answer to the latter challenge, in Republic II, Glaucon and Adeimantus repeatedly urge Socrates to show what value justice has in itself, apart from its rewards and reputation. They gloss the intrinsic value of justice as what value it has in the soul (358b-c), what it does to the soul simply and immediately by its presence therein. Before giving what will be a new account of the soul, Socrates introduces his famous comparison between the soul and the city. As he develops his account of the city, however, it becomes clear that Socrates is talking about an ideal city, which he proceeds to construct in his discussion.

This city has three classes (genê) of citizens: the rulers and their auxiliaries — collectively the guardians — plus the farmers, artisans, and merchants; in general those concerned with the production of material goods. Once he has explained these classes and the education of the guardians, Socrates (in book IV) defines the four virtues that belong to this city — wisdom, courage, moderation, and justice. The most important for understanding Plato's moral theory is wisdom, the knowledge needed for ruling. Socrates says that the city is wise because it is well-counseled; and this is due to a special knowledge (epistêmê) found in the city. This knowledge is not carpentry, working in wood or brass or farming (428b-c). These are all crafts that aim at some partial good; while carpentry, for example, produces houses and their furnishings — something good for a city — these are only part of what it is good for a city to have. The guardians' knowledge, by contrast, aims not at a particular good but at the whole of the city and in what way it can be the best in its internal relations and in its relations to other cities (428c-d). Justice in the city is each one performing that function for which he is suited by nature and not doing the work that belongs to others (433a-b). While justice is the fundamental virtue on which the others rest, it is the function of ruling — the work of the small number of full guardians — that is the significant term in its definition.

Having finished with virtues in the city, Socrates applies the same sort of account to the original question, the value of justice in itself in the soul. Like the city, the soul has three parts: reason corresponds to rulers, the spirited part (thymos) to auxiliaries, and appetites to artisans. Each psychological part has a characteristic function. Like the rulers with respect to the city, reason exercises forethought for the whole soul (441e). The spirited part becomes angry, both with oneself and with others, mostly about injustice (439e ff), and in general provides emotional support for reason's rule. The function of the appetites for food, drink, and sex is not mentioned but seems to be the biological basis for life. This moral psychology appears even more sophisticated if we treat the spirited part as a stand-in for all of the emotions. Then the soul is divided into reason, emotions, and appetites. All of our life falls under one of these headings. We reason and think; we hate and love; we hunger and thirst.

The virtues are defined by the relations among these parts. The master virtue, justice, is each part doing its function and not interfering with that of another (441d-e; 443d). Since the function of reason is to exercise forethought for the whole soul, it should rule. The appetites, which seek only their immediate satisfaction, should not rule. A soul ruled by appetites is the very picture of psychological injustice. Still, to fulfill its function of ruling, reason needs wisdom, the knowledge of what is beneficial for each of the parts of the soul and for the whole (442c). There are similar definitions for courage and moderation, each depending on relations among the parts of the soul. Any attentive reader of the dialogues must feel that Socrates has now given an answer to the questions that started many of the aporetic dialogues. At this point, we have the fully developed moral psychology that allows the definition of the moral virtues. They fall into place around the tripartite structure of the soul.

One might object, however, that all Socrates has accomplished is to define justice and the other virtues as they operate within the soul. While each part treats the others justly, so to speak, it is not clear what justice among the parts of someone's soul has to do with that person treating other people justly. Socrates at first addresses this issue rather brusquely, saying that someone with a just soul would not embezzle funds, rob temples, steal, betray friends, break oaths, commit adultery, neglect parents, nor ignore the gods. The reason for this is that each part in the soul does its own function in the matter of ruling and being ruled (443a-b). Socrates does not explain this connection between psychic harmony and moral virtue. However, if we assume that injustice is based in overweening appetite or unbridled anger, then one can see the connection between restrained appetites, well-governed anger and treating others justly. The man whose sexual appetite is not governed by reason, e.g., would commit the injustice of adultery.

This approach to the virtues by way of moral psychology, in fact, proves to be remarkably durable in ancient moral theory. In one way or another, the various schools attempt to explain the virtues in terms of the soul, although there are, of course, variations in the accounts. Indeed, we can treat the theory of the Republic as one such variation. While the account in Republic IV has affinities with that of Aristotle in Nicomachean Ethics, for instance, further developments in Republic V-VII make Plato's overall account altogether unique. It is in these books that the theory of forms makes its appearance. So peculiar to Plato that anyone else subscribing to it is called a Platonist, the theory of forms has a dramatic impact on his moral theory.

In Republic V, Socrates returns to the issue of political rule by asking what change in actual cities would bring the ideal city closer to realization. The famous answer is that philosophers should rule as kings (473d). Trying to make the scandalous, even ridiculous, answer more palatable, Socrates immediately begins to explain what he means by philosophers. They are the ones who can distinguish between the many beautiful things and the one beautiful itself. The beautiful itself, the good itself, and the just itself are what he calls forms. The ability to understand such forms defines the philosopher (476a-c). Fully elaborated, this extraordinary theory holds that there is a set of unchanging and unambiguous entities, known by reason in a way that is separate from the use of sensory perception. This infallible grasp means that one knows what goodness is, what beauty is, and what justice is. Because only philosophers have this knowledge — an infallible grasp of goodness, beauty, and justice — they and only they are fit to be rulers in the city.

In Republic VI, Socrates says philosophers have a paradigm in their souls whereby they can establish laws for a government pursuing goodness, beauty, and justice. They are like painters who imitate their models, except for philosophers the models are forms (484c-d). This account is a striking elaboration on the ruling craft of Republic IV. There the knowledge of ruling was contrasted with that of carpentry; here it is compared to painting, as though forms are a source of inspiration and a guide in fashioning the laws of the city. Knowledge of the forms, however, has another use for the philosopher. By analogy with the way he imitates forms in ruling the city, the philosopher imitates forms in shaping his own soul. By fixing his gaze on them, the philosopher imitates them and makes himself as like them as possible and becomes well-ordered and divine (500c-d). Given the analogy between the city and the soul, we might assume that the order is among the parts of the soul. If so, then the forms of goodness, beauty, and justice are paradigms for the order and harmony in the soul that Socrates describes in Republic IV (443d-e). Thus, the philosopher is a kind of craftsman-artist of his or her own soul. This analogy has many fruitful aspects. One of them is the notion that the moral life should be conceived in terms of such notions as beauty, fineness, or nobility. The virtues, from one point of view at least, are an expression of a soul that has order and harmony. The synoptic view of the value of one's moral life has rarely found a more striking analogy.

As with other ancient theories, this account of virtue can be called eudaimonist. Plato's theory is best represented as holding that virtue, together with its active exercise, is the most important and the dominant constituent of happiness (580b-c). One might object that eudaimonist theories reduce morality to self-interest. We should recall however that eudaimonia in this theory does not refer primarily to a feeling. In the Republic, it refers to a state of the soul, and the active life to which it leads, whose value is multifaceted. The order and harmony of the soul is, of course, good for the soul because it provides what is good for each of the parts and the whole, and so makes the parts function well, for the benefit of each and of the whole person. In this way, the soul has the best internal economy, so to speak. Still, we should not overlook the ways in which order and harmony in the soul are paired with order and harmony in the city. They are both modeled on the forms. As a consequence, virtue in the soul is not a private concern oddly joined to the public function of ruling. Rather, the philosopher who imitates forms in ruling her soul is equally motivated to imitate forms in ruling the city. So, insofar as virtue consists in imitating the forms, it is also a state of the soul best expressed by exercising rule in the city — or at least in the ideal city. Eudaimonia, then, includes looking after the welfare of others.

Indeed, the very nature of Plato's account of virtue and happiness leaves some aspects of the link between the two unclear. While virtue is the dominant factor in happiness, we still cannot tell whether for Plato one can have a reason for being, e.g., courageous that does not depend directly on happiness. Plato, even though he has forged a strong link between virtue and happiness, has not addressed such contemporary issues. In his account, it is still possible that one might be courageous just for its own sake while at the same time believing courage is also reliably linked to happiness. In the Republic, Socrates tries to answer the question what value justice has by itself in the soul; it does not follow that he is trying to convince Glaucon and Adeimantus that the value of justice is exhausted by its connection to one's own happiness.

(For further developments in Plato's moral theory in dialogues usually thought to postdate the Republic (especially Philebus), see Plato entry, especially the section on Socrates and the section on Plato's indirectness.)

4. Aristotle

The moral theory of Aristotle, like that of Plato, focuses on virtue, recommending the virtuous way of life by its relation to happiness. His most important ethical work, Nicomachean Ethics, devotes the first book to a preliminary account of happiness, which is then completed in the last chapters of the final book, Book X. This account ties happiness to excellent activity of the soul. In subsequent books, excellent activity of the soul is tied to the moral virtues and to the virtue of “practical wisdom” — excellence in thinking and deciding about how to behave. This approach to moral theory depends on a moral psychology that shares a number of affinities with Plato's. However, while for Plato the theory of forms has a role in justifying virtue, Aristotle notoriously rejects that theory. Aristotle grounds his account of virtue in his theory about the soul — a topic to which he devotes a separate treatise, de Anima.

Aristotle opens the first book of the Nicomachean Ethics by positing some one supreme good as the aim of human actions, investigations, and crafts (1094a). Identifying this good as happiness, he immediately notes the variations in the notion (1095a15-25). Some think the happy life is the life of enjoyment; the more refined think it is the life of political activity; others think it is the life of study or theoretical contemplation (1095b10-20). The object of the life of enjoyment is bodily pleasure; that of political activity is honor or even virtue. The object of the life of study is philosophical or scientific understanding. Arguing that the end of human life must be the most complete, he concludes that happiness is the most complete end. Whereas pleasure, honor, virtue, and understanding are choice-worthy in themselves, they are also chosen for the sake of happiness. Happiness is not chosen for the sake of anything else (1097a25-1097b5). Of course, the way he puts this relation between happiness and the other choice-worthy ends leaves it open whether they are means to or constituents of happiness.

Next, Aristotle turns to his own account of happiness, the summit of Book I. The account depends on an analogy with the notion of function or characteristic activity or work (ergon). A flutist has a function or work, i.e., playing the flute. The key idea for Aristotle is that the good of flute players (as such) is found in their functioning as a flutist. By analogy, if there is a human function, the good for a human is found in this function (1097b20-30). Aristotle then turns to the human soul. He argues that, in fact, there is a human function, to be found in the human soul's characteristic activity, i.e., reason (1098a1-20). Then, without explanation, he makes the claim that reason has two importantly distinct aspects, one that has reason directly and in itself and one that obeys (or can obey) reason. The part that has reason in itself, e.g., deliberates about decisions, both for the short term and the long. The part that obeys reason is that aspect of the soul, such as the appetites, that functions in a human being under the influence of reason. The appetites can fail to obey reason; but they at least have the capacity to obey (as, for example, such automatic functions as nutritive and metabolic ones do not).

Aristotle then argues that since the function of a human is to exercise the soul's activities according to reason, the function of a good human is to exercise well and finely the soul's activities according to reason. Given the two aspects of reason that Aristotle has distinguished, one can see that both can be well or badly done. On the one hand, one can reason well or badly — about what to do within the next five minutes, twenty-four hours, or ten years. On the other, actions motivated by appetites can be well or badly done, and likewise having an appetite at all can sometimes not be a well done, but a badly done, activity of the soul. Acting on the desire for a drink from the wine cooler at a banquet is not always a good idea, nor is having such a desire. According to Aristotle, the good human being has a soul in which these functions are consistently done well. Thus, good persons reason well about plans, short term or long; and when they satisfy their appetites, and even when they have appetites, it is in conformity with reason. Returning to the question of happiness, Aristotle says the good for a human is to live the way the good human lives, that is, to live with one's life aimed at and structured by the same thing that the good human being aims at in his or her life. So, his account of happiness, i.e., the highest good for a human, is virtuous or excellent activity of the soul. But he has not identified this virtuous activity with that of the moral virtues, at this point. In fact, he says if there are many kinds of excellence, then human good is found in the active exercise of the highest. He is careful to point out that happiness is not just the ability to function well in this way; it is the activity itself. Moreover, this activity must be carried out for a complete life. One swallow does not make a spring.

Although the reference here to parts or aspects of the soul is cursory, it is influenced by Aristotle's theories in the de Anima. Fundamental to the human soul and to all living things, including plants, is nutrition and growth (415a20 ff). Next is sensation and locomotion; these functions are characteristic of animals (416b30 ff). Aristotle associates appetite and desire with this part of the soul (414b1-5). Thus we have a rough sketch of animal life: animals, moved by appetite for food, go toward the objects of desire, which are discerned by sensation. To these functions is added thought in the case of humans. Thought is both speculative and practical (427a 15-20). The bulk of the de Anima is devoted to explaining the nutritive, sensory, and rational functions; Aristotle considers desire and appetite as the source of movement in other animals (432a15 ff), and these plus reason as its source in humans. In Nicomachean Ethics he focuses on the role that appetite and desire, together with reason, play in the moral drama of human life.

In chapter 8 of Book I, Aristotle explicitly identifies human good with psychological good. Dividing goods into external goods, those of the body, and those of the soul, he states that his account of happiness agrees with those who hold it is a good of the soul. In fact, in this account, happiness is closely related to traditionally conceived psychological goods such as pleasure and moral virtue, although the nature of the relation has yet to be shown (1098b10-30). Still, in Book I Aristotle is laying the foundation in his moral psychology for showing the link between the moral virtues and happiness. In Book II he completes this foundation when he turns to the question of which condition of the soul is to be identified with (moral) virtue, or virtue of character.

In II. 5, he says that conditions of the soul are either feelings (pathê), capacities for feeling (dynameis) or dispositions (hexeis). Feelings are such things as appetite, anger, fear and generally those conditions that are accompanied by pleasure and pain. Capacities are, for example, the simple capacity to have these feelings. Finally, disposition is that condition of the soul whereby we are well or badly off with respect to feelings. For instance, people are badly disposed with respect to anger who typically get angry violently or who typically get angry weakly (1105b20-30). Virtue, as a condition of the soul, will be one of these three. After arguing that virtue is neither feeling nor capacity, Aristotle turns to what it means to be well or badly off with respect to feelings. He says that in everything that is continuous and divisible it is possible to take more, less, or an equal amount (1106a25). This remark is puzzling until we realize that he is actually talking about feelings. Feelings are continuous and divisible; so one can take more, less, or an equal amount of them. Presumably, when it comes to feeling anger, e.g., one can feel too much, not very much, or a balanced amount. Aristotle thinks that what counts as too much, not very much, or a balanced amount can vary to some extent from individual to individual. At this point he is ready to come back to moral virtue for it is concerned with feelings and actions (to which feelings give rise), in which one can have excess, deficiency, or the mean. To have a feeling like anger at the right time, on the right occasion, towards the right people, for the right purpose and in the right manner is to feel the right amount, the mean between extremes of excess and deficiency; this is the mark of moral virtue (1106a15-20). Finally, virtue is not a question only of feelings since there is a mean between extremes of action. Presumably, Aristotle means that the appropriate feeling — the mean between the extremes in each situation — gives rise to the appropriate action.

At last Aristotle is ready to discuss particular moral virtues. Beginning with courage, he mentions here two feelings, fear and confidence. An excessive disposition to confidence is rashness and an excessive disposition to fear and a deficiency in confidence is cowardice. When it comes to certain bodily pleasures and pains, the mean is moderation. While the excess is profligacy, deficiency in respect of pleasures almost never occurs. Aristotle gives a fuller account of both of these virtues in Book III; however, the basic idea remains. The virtue in each case is a mean between two extremes, the extremes being vices. Virtue, then, is a reliable disposition whereby one reacts in relevant situations with the appropriate feeling — neither excessive nor deficient — and acts in the appropriate way — neither excessively nor deficiently.

Now we can discern the link between morality and happiness. While happiness itself is excellent or virtuous activity of the soul, moral virtue is a disposition to achieve the mean between two extremes in feeling and in action. The missing link is that achieving the mean is also excellent activity of the soul. Activity that expresses the virtue of courage, for example, is also the best kind of activity when it comes to the emotion of fear. Activity that expresses the virtue of moderation is also excellent activity when it comes to the bodily appetites. In this way, then, the happy person is also the virtuous person. However, in Book I Aristotle has already pointed out the problem of external goods in relation to happiness. Even if happiness is virtuous activity of the soul, in some cases external goods are needed to be virtuous — for example, one must have money to be generous. In fact, the lack of good birth, good children, and beauty can mar one's happiness for the happy person does not appear to be one who is altogether ugly, low born, solitary, or childless, and even less so if he has friends and children who are bad, or good friends and children who then die (1099a30-1099b10). Aristotle is raising a problem that he does not attempt to solve in this passage. Even if happiness is virtuous activity of the soul, it does not confer immunity to the vicissitudes of life.

Aristotle's moral psychology has further implications for his account of happiness. In Book I, chapter 7, he said that human good is virtuous activity of the soul but was indefinite about the virtues. In most of the Nicomachean Ethics he talks about the moral virtues, leaving the impression that virtuous activity is the same as activity associated with moral virtues. In Book X, however, Aristotle revisits the issue of virtuous activity. If happiness, he says, is activity in accordance with virtue, it will be activity in accordance with the highest. The highest virtue belongs to the best part of the soul, i.e., the intellect (nous) or the part that governs in the soul and contemplates the fine and godly, being itself the divine part of the soul or that which is closest to the divine (1177a10-20).

Up to this point, Aristotle has apparently been talking about the man of political action. Active in the life of the city, this person exercises courage, moderation, liberality, and justice in the public arena. Now, instead of the life of an effective and successful citizen, Aristotle is holding up the life of study and contemplation as the one that achieves happiness — that is, the highest human good, the activity of the highest virtue. He even suggests that the life of contemplation is secure against the need for external goods (1177a30). Indeed, at first he portrays these two lives as so opposite that they seem incompatible (1178a10 ff). In the end, however, he palliates the differences, leaving the possibility for some way to harmonize the two (1178a30). The differences between the two lives are rooted in the different aspects of the soul. Moral virtues belong to the appetites and desires of the sensory soul — the part obviously associated with the active political life, when its activities are brought under the guidance and control of excellent practical thought and judgment. The "highest” virtues, those belonging to the scientific or philosophical intellect, belong to theoretical reason. To concentrate on these activities one must be appropriately disengaged from active political life. While the latter description leads Aristotle to portray as possible a kind of human life that partakes of divine detachment (1178b5 ff), finally human life is an indissolvable composite of intellect, reason, sensation, desires, and appetites. For Aristotle, strictly speaking, happiness simply is the exercise of the highest virtues, those of theoretical reason and understanding. But even persons pursuing those activities as their highest good, and making them central to their lives, will need to remain connected to daily life, and even to political affairs in the community in which they live. Hence, they will possess and exercise the moral virtues and those of practical thought, as well as those other, higher, virtues, throughout their lives.

Like Plato, Aristotle is a eudaimonist in that he argues that virtue (including in some way the moral virtues of courage, justice and the rest) is the dominant and most important component of happiness. However, he is not claiming that the only reason to be morally virtuous is that moral virtue is a constituent of happiness. He says that we seek to have virtue and virtuous action for itself as well (Nicomachean Ethics, 1097b 1-10); not to do so is to fail even to be virtuous. In this regard, it is like pleasure, which is also a constituent of the happy life. Like pleasure, virtue is sought for its own sake. Still, as a constituent of happiness, virtuous action is grounded in the highest end for a human being. Thus, Aristotle bases his account of virtue and happiness in his theory about human nature. If happiness is excellent activity of the soul, the latter is understood in relation to the human function. He assumes that if one understands what the human function is one can understand what it is for that function to be done excellently (1098a5-15). This sort of argument has been criticized because it moves from a premise about what humans are to a conclusion about how they ought to be. Such criticism reflects the modern claim that there is a fact-value distinction. One defense of Aristotle's argument holds that his account of human nature is meant both to be objective and to offer the basis for an understanding of excellence. The difference, then, between modern moral theory and ancient is over what counts as an objective account of human nature. Finally, as we will see, the idea that virtue is the perfection of human nature becomes an important idea for the Stoics.

(For further detailed discussion, see entry on Aristotle's ethics.)

5. Cynics

Although the Cynics had an impact on moral thinking in Athens after the death of Socrates, it is through later, and highly controversial, reports of their deeds and sayings — rather than their writings — that we know of them. Diogenes the Cynic, the central figure, is famous for living in a wine jar (Diogenes Laertius [= DL] VI 23) and going about with a lantern looking for ‘a man’ — i.e., someone not corrupted (DL VI 41). He claimed to set courage over against fortune, nature against convention, and reason against passion (DL VI 38). Of this trio of opposites, the most characteristic for understanding the Cynics is nature against convention. Diogenes taught that a life according to nature was better than one that conformed to convention. First of all, natural life is simpler. Diogenes ate, slept, or conversed wherever it suited him and carried his food around with him (DL VI 22). When he saw a child drinking out of its hand, he threw away his cup, saying that a child had bested him in frugality (DL VI 37). He said the life of humans had been made easy by the gods but that humans had lost sight of this through seeking after honeyed cakes, perfumes, and similar things (DL VI 44). With sufficient training the life according to nature is the happy life (DL VI 71).

Accordingly Diogenes became famous for behavior that flouted convention (DL VI 69). Still, he thought that the simple life not only freed one from unnecessary concerns but was essential to virtue. Although he says nothing specific about the virtues, he does commend training for virtuous behavior (DL VI 70). His frugality certainly bespeaks self-control. He condemned love of money, praised good men, and held love to be the occupation of the idle (DL VI 50-51).

Besides his contempt for convention, what is most noteworthy about Diogenes as a moral teacher is his emphasis on detachment from those things most people consider good. In this emphasis, Diogenes seems to have intensified a tendency found in Socrates. Certainly Socrates could be heedless of convention and careless about providing for his bodily needs. To Plato, however, Diogenes seemed to be Socrates gone mad (DL VI 54). Still, in Diogenes' attitude, we can see at least the beginning of the idea that the end of life is a psychological state marked by detachment. Counseling the simple and uncomplicated satisfaction of one's natural instincts and desires, Diogenes urges detachment from those things held out by convention to be good. While he is not so explicit, others develop the theme of detachment into the notion of tranquility. The Stoics and Epicureans hold that happiness depends on detachment from vulnerable or difficult to obtain external goods and consists in a psychological state more under one's own direct control. In this way, happiness becomes associated (for the Epicureans) with tranquility (ataraxia). Finally, in Skepticism, suspension of judgment is a kind of epistemic detachment that provides tranquility. So in Diogenes we find the beginnings of an idea that will become central to later ancient moral theory.

6. Cyrenaics

The first of the Cyrenaic school was Aristippus, who came from Cyrene, a Greek city on the north African coast. The account of his teachings, in Diogenes Laertius, can seem sometimes inconsistent. Nevertheless, Aristippus is interesting because, as a thorough hedonist, he is something of a foil for Epicurus. First of all, pleasure is the end or the goal of life — what everyone should seek in life. However, the pleasure that is the end is not pleasure in general, or pleasure over the long term, but immediate, particular pleasures. Thus the end varies situation by situation, action by action. The end is not happiness because happiness is the sum of particular pleasures (DL II 87-88). Accumulating the pleasures that produce happiness is tiresome (DL II 90). Particular pleasures are ones that are close-by or sure. Moreover, Aristippus said that pleasures do not differ from one another, that one pleasure is not more pleasant than another. This sort of thinking would encourage one to choose a readily available pleasure rather than wait for a “better” one in the future. This conclusion is reinforced by other parts of his teaching. His school says that bodily pleasures are much better than mental pleasures. While this claim would seem to contradict the idea that pleasures do not differ, it does show preference for the immediately or easily available pleasures of bodily gratification over, e.g., the mental pleasure of a self-aware just person. In fact, Aristippus' school holds that pleasure is good even if it comes from the most unseemly things (DL II 88). Aristippus, then, seems to have raised improvidence to the level of a principle.

Still, it is possible that the position is more than an elaborate justification for short-sighted pleasure-seeking. Cyrenaics taught that a wise man (sophos) (one who always pursues immediate gratification) will in general live more pleasantly than a foolish man. That prudence or wisdom (phronêsis) is good, not in itself but in its consequences, suggests that some balance, perhaps even regarding others, is required in choosing pleasures (DL II 91). The Cyrenaic attitude to punishment seems to be an example of prudence. They hold that nothing is just, fine, or base by nature but only by convention and custom; still a good man will do nothing out of line through fear of punishment (DL II 93). Finally, they hold that friendship is based in self-interest (DL II 91). These aspects of Cyrenaic teaching suggest they are egoist hedonists. If so, there are grounds for taking the interest of others into account as long as doing so is based on what best provides an individual pleasure.

Nevertheless, Aristippus' school holds that the end of life is a psychological good, pleasure. Still, it is particular pleasures not the accumulation of these that is the end. As a consequence, their moral theory contrasts sharply with others in antiquity. If we take the claims about the wise man, prudence, and friendship to be references to virtue, then Aristippus' school denies that virtue is indispensable for achieving the end or goal of life. While they hold that virtue is good insofar as it leads to the end, they seem prepared to dispense with virtue in circumstances where it proves ineffective. Even if they held virtue in more esteem, the Cyrenaics would nonetheless not be eudaimonists since they deny that happiness is the end of life.

7. Epicurus

Epicurean moral theory is the most prominent hedonistic theory in the ancient world. While Epicurus holds that pleasure is the sole intrinsic good and pain is what is intrinsically bad for humans, he is also very careful about defining these two. Aware of the Cyrenaics who hold that pleasures, moral and immoral, are the end or goal of all action, Epicurus presents a sustained argument that pleasure, correctly understood, will coincide with virtue.

In the Letter to Menoeceus, Epicurus begins by making a distinction among desires. Some desires are empty or groundless and others are natural; the natural are further subdivided into the merely natural and the necessary. Finally, the necessary are those necessary for happiness, those necessary for the body's freedom from distress, and those necessary for life itself (Letter to Menoeceus 127). A helpful scholiast (cf. Principal Doctrines XXIX) gives us some examples; necessary desires are ones that bring relief from unavoidable pain, such as drinking when thirsty — if we don't drink when we need replenishment, we will just get thirstier and thirstier, a painful experience. The natural but not necessary are the ones that vary pleasure but are not needed in order to motivate us to remove or ward off pain, such as the desire for expensive food: we do not need to want, or to eat, expensive food in order to ward off the pain of prolonged hunger. Finally, the groundless desires are for such things as crowns and statues bestowed as civic honors — these are things that when desired at all are desired with intense and harmful cravings. Keeping these distinctions in mind is a great help in one's life because it shows us what we need to aim for. The aim of the blessed life is the body's health and the soul's freedom from disturbance (ataraxia) (128).

After this austere introduction, Epicurus makes the bold claim that pleasure is the beginning and end of the blessed life. Then he makes an important qualification. Just because pleasure is the good, Epicureans do not seek every pleasure. Some lead to greater pain. Just so, they do not avoid all pains; some lead to greater pleasures (128-29). Such a position sounds, of course, like common-sense hedonism. If one's aim is to have as much pleasure as possible over the long term, it makes sense to avoid some smaller pleasures that will be followed by larger pains. If one wants, for example, to have as much pleasure from drinking wine as possible, then it would make sense to exercise some judgment about how much to drink on an occasion since the next morning's hangover will be very unpleasant, and might keep one from having wine the next day. However, his distinction among groundless, natural, and necessary desires should make us suspicious that Epicurus is no common-sense hedonist. The aim of life is not maximizing pleasures in the way the above example suggests. Rather, real pleasure, the aim of life, is what we experience through freedom from pain and distress. So it is not the pains of the hangover or the possible loss of further bouts of wine drinking that should restrain my drinking on this occasion. Rather one should be aiming at the pleasure given by freedom from bodily pain and mental distress (131-32).

In order to understand the importance of freedom from pain and from distress, we need to grasp the distinction between kinetic pleasures and katastematic, or what are, following Cicero, misleadingly called “static” ones. Kinetic pleasures are associated with replenishment. For instance, drinking when thirsty gives a kinetic pleasure; the pleasure is in the process of quenching thirst. By contrast, katastematic pleasures (the Greek here transliterated means “to do with one's natural constitution”) are the pleasures of satiety; for instance, quenched thirst gives rise to a katastematic pleasure, a pleasure in one's naturally and undisturbedly functioning constitution. Epicurus not only thinks of this state as a positive one but its pleasure as the preferred state of pleasure. Katastematic pleasure has this status because it is the enjoyment of one's natural constitution when one is not distracted by bodily pain or mental distress.

At this point, we can see that Epicurus has so refined the account of pleasure and pain that he is able to tie them to virtue. In the Letter to Menoeceus, he claims, as a truth for which he does not argue, that virtue and pleasure are inseparable and that living a prudent, honorable, and just life is the necessary and sufficient means to the pleasure that is the end of life (132). An example of what he might mean is found in Principal Doctrines, where Epicurus holds that justice is a contract among humans to avoid suffering harm from one another. Then he argues that injustice is not bad per se but is bad because of the fear that arises from the expectation that one will be punished for his misdeeds (XXXIV). Although he does not give it, one can imagine an argument to the effect that the virtue of justice is an infallible means to avoid the fear of punishment for one's misdeeds. Of course, one might still fear unfair punishment; but at least one will be delivered from the distress of expecting to be discovered and punished for actual misdeeds.

Epicurus, like his predecessors in the ancient moral tradition, identified the good as something psychological. However, instead of, for example, the complex Aristotelian notion of excellent activity of the soul, Epicurus settled on the fairly obvious psychological good of pleasure. Of course, Aristotle argues that excellent activity of the soul is intrinsically pleasurable (Nicomachean Ethics 1099a5). Still, in his account pleasure seems something like a dividend of excellent activity (1175b30). By contrast, for Epicurus pleasure itself is the end of life. However, since Epicureans hold freedom from pain (aponia) and distress (ataraxia) gives the preferable pleasure, they emphasize tranquility (ataraxia) as the end of life. In order to achieve freedom from pain and distress, Epicureans prefer the simple pleasures (130-31). In this respect, they share a theme with the Cynics, for whom frugality is an important value.

Epicurus' doctrine can be considered eudaimonist. While Plato and Aristotle maintain that virtue is constitutive of happiness, Epicurus holds that virtue is the only means to achieve happiness, where happiness is understood as a continuous experience of the pleasure that comes from freedom from pain and from mental distress. Thus, he is a eudaimonist in that he holds virtue is indispensable to happiness; but he does not identify virtuous activity, in whole or in part, with happiness. Finally, Epicurus is usually interpreted to have held a version of psychological hedonism, although there is contrary evidence (Principal Doctrine XXV), and when in the Letter to Menoeceus he says that “we” do everything in order not to be in pain or in fear, he might mean to be referring to “we” Epicureans. Once all disturbance of the soul is dispelled, he says, one is no longer in need nor is there any other good that could be added (128). Since absence of pain and disturbance is a kind of pleasure, Epicurus could be taken, as he usually has been, to be arguing that whatever we do is done for the sake of pleasure. In this account, that aspect of human nature on which virtue is based is fairly straightforward. The account is certainly less complex than, e.g., Aristotle's. In turn, Epicurus seems to have argued in such a way as to make pleasure the only reason for being virtuous. If psychological hedonism is true, then when one realizes the necessary link between virtue and pleasure, one has all the reason one needs to be virtuous and the only reason one can have.

8. Stoics

The Stoics are well known for their teaching that the good is to be identified with virtue. By ‘virtue’ they mean such moral virtues as justice, moderation, and courage. So all that is required for happiness (i.e., the secure possession of the good, of what is needed to make one's life a thoroughly good one) — and the only thing — is to lead a morally virtuous life. In this teaching the Stoics are addressing the problem of external goods raised by Aristotle. Their solution takes the radical course of dismissing such alleged goods from the account of happiness because they are not necessary for virtue, and are not, in fact, in any way good at all.

In order to understand the Stoic claims about the relation of virtue to happiness, we can begin with virtue. Chrysippus says that virtue is a craft (technê) having to do with the things of life (Stoicorum Veterum Fragmenta[=SVF] II 909). In other texts, we learn that the things of life include impulse (hormê). Each animal has an impulse for self-preservation; it has an awareness of its constitution and strives to preserve its integrity. There is also a natural impulse to care for offspring. Humans, then, are naturally inclined toward preserving life, health, and children. But then grown-up humans also do these things under the guidance of reason; reason in the adult human case is the craftsman of impulse (DL VII 85-6). This latter phrase is significant because it implies that just following natural impulse is not enough. In fact, it is not even possible for an adult human, whose nature is such as to do everything they do by reason, ever to follow the sort of natural impulses that animals and immature humans do in their actions. In order to lead a virtuous life, reason must shape our impulses and guide their expression in action.

Here the Stoics might sound like Plato and Aristotle. Shaping impulses recalls Platonic and Aristotelian reason's governing and guiding appetites and emotions. But the similarity is misleading because Stoics do not hold to a tripartite division of the soul. In particular, they deny that there are any non-rational desires of appetite or non-rational emotions. The soul, insofar as it provides motivations and is the cause of our actions, consists of the commanding faculty (hêgemonikon) which is also reason (SVF III 378). Passions, whether they oppose virtue or might appear to support it, are just false opinions and false impulses about, e.g., what is to be endured. Courage, then, is simply knowledge of what is to be endured: the impulse to endure or not, and the only impulse that is needed by courage, then follows automatically, as a product or aspect of that knowledge. This tight unity in the soul is the basis for the Stoic teaching about the unity of the virtues. Zeno (the founder of the school) defines wisdom (phronêsis), or rather practical knowledge, in matters requiring distribution as justice, in matters requiring choice as moderation, and in matters requiring endurance as courage (Plutarch On Moral Virtue 440E-441D). Practical knowledge, then, is a single, comprehensive knowledge of what is good and bad in each of these kinds of circumstance.

Attending to this identification of virtue and practical knowledge is a good way to understand the central Stoic teaching that virtue is living in agreement with nature (SVF III16). Nature includes not only what produces natural impulses but also the rest of the government of the cosmos, the natural world. The universe is governed by right reason that pervades everything and directs (causes) the way it functions — with the exception of the only rational animals there are, the adult human beings: their actions are caused by their own individual decisions. Nature is even identified with Zeus, who is said to be the director of the administration of all that has being (DL VII 88). Since reason governs the universe for the good, everything happens of necessity and for the overall good. Virtue, then, includes understanding both one's individual nature as a human being and the way nature arranges the whole universe. This understanding is the basis for living in agreement with the government of the universe, i.e., with nature, by making one's decisions and actions be such as to agree with Zeus's or nature's own plans, so far as one can understand what those are.

At this point, we can turn to the Stoic account of happiness. They argue that health, pleasure, beauty, strength, wealth, good reputation, and noble birth are neither good nor bad. Since they can be used well or badly and the good is invariably good, these assets are not good. The virtues, however, are good (DL VII 102-103), since they are perfections of our rationality, and only rationally perfected thoughts and decisions (such as those of Zeus or nature in directing what happens) can possibly have the features of harmony and order in which goodness itself consists. Since possessing and exercising virtue is happiness, happiness does not include such things as health, pleasure, and wealth. Still, the Stoics do not dismiss these assets altogether since they still have some sort of value. These things are indifferent to happiness in that they do not add to one's virtue nor detract from it, and so they do not add to or take away from one's possession of the good. One is not more virtuous because healthy nor less virtuous because ill. But being healthy generally conforms with nature's plans for the lives of animals and plants, so it is preferable to be healthy, and one should try to preserve and maintain one's health. Health is, then, the kind of value they call a preferred indifferent; but it is not in any way a good, and it makes no contribution to the quality of one's life as a good or a bad one, happy or miserable.

This exclusion of what are traditionally called external goods from being goods at all may seem unduly severe. Still, the Stoics would argue that the exclusion is necessary for happiness (which they define as the “smooth flow of life”). External “goods” are among things vulnerable to fate, to the way that nature rules the universe. If the smooth flow of one's life depended on having these things and avoiding their opposites, and if the government of the universe takes them away in some cases, then — in those cases — happiness would not be possible. By contrast, if virtue is living in agreement with nature's government of the universe, one is not vulnerable to the vicissitudes of life. If one understands that the good of the whole dictates that in a particular case one's health may be taken away for the sake of some overall good result in the universe at large, then one will not put the highest value on his health. We can best appreciate the notion that virtue is the good, then, if we take virtue to be both the knowledge that the universe is well governed and living on the basis of that knowledge (DL VII 88).

The Stoics are extreme eudaimonists compared to Plato or Aristotle. While Plato clearly associates virtue and happiness, he never squarely faces the issue whether happiness may require other goods, e.g., wealth and health. Aristotle holds happiness to be virtuous activity of the soul; but he raises — without solving — the problem of external goods and happiness. For these two, virtue, together with its active exercise, is the dominant and most important component of happiness, while Stoics simply identify virtue and the good, and so make it the only thing needed for a happy life. Still, Stoics do not reduce happiness to virtue, as though ‘happiness’ is just a name for being perfectly just, courageous, and moderate. Rather they have independent ways of describing happiness. Following Zeno, all the Stoics say it is a good flow of life. Seneca says the happy life is peacefulness and constant tranquility. However, we should keep in mind that, while they do not reduce happiness to virtue, their account of happiness is not that of the common person. So in recommending virtue because it secures happiness the Stoics are relying on happiness in a special, although not idiosyncratic, sense. In fact, their idea of happiness shares an important feature with the Epicurean, which puts a premium on tranquil pleasures. In Stoicism as well, deliverance from the vicissitudes of fate leads to a notion of happiness that emphasizes tranquility. And, as we shall see, tranquility is a value for the Skeptics.

Clearly, the Stoic account of virtue and happiness depends on their theory about human nature. For Aristotle, virtue is perfection of the human function and the Stoics follow in this line of thinking. While their notion of virtue builds on their notion of the underlying human nature, their account of the perfection of human nature is more complex than Aristotle's. It includes accommodation to the nature of the universe. Virtue is the perfection of human nature that makes it harmonious with the workings of fate, i.e. with Zeus's overall plan, regarded as the ineluctable cause of what happens in the world at large.

9. Pyrrhonian Skeptics

Pyrrho, a murky figure, contemporary with Epicurus and Zeno the Stoic, left no writings. In the late, anecdotal tradition he is credited with introducing suspension of judgment (DL IX 61). He became the eponymous hero for the founding of Pyrrhonian skepticism in the first century B.C. (See entry on Pyrrho.) Because for every argument there is an opposing argument, Pyrrhonian Skeptics expressed no determinate opinions (DL IX 74). This attitude would seem to lead to a kind of epistemic paralysis. The Skeptics reply that they do not abolish, e.g., relying on sight. They do not say that it is unreliable and they do not refuse, personally, ever to rely on it. Rather, they have the impression that there is no reason why we are entitled to rely on it, in a given case or in general, even if we go ahead and rely on it anyhow (DL IX 103). For example, if one gets the visual impression of a tower, that appearance is not in dispute. What it seems one cannot know is whether there actually is a tower. For Skeptics, claiming that there actually is a tower is a dogmatic statement about the explanation of the appearance; it goes beyond what, it seems, we have a warrant for claiming.

Such views have an obvious impact on practical and moral issues. First of all, the Skeptics argue that, so far as we have been given any good reason by philosophers to believe, there is nothing good or bad by nature. They also hold the weaker conclusion that what is good by nature is, apparently, unknowable (DL IX 101). This skepticism could seem to have disastrous consequences for living one's life. In fact, according to tradition, Pyrrho himself did not avoid anything, whether it was wagons, precipices, or dogs. It would appear that, suspending judgment about whether being hit by a wagon was naturally good or bad, Pyrrho might walk into its path, or not bother to get out of the way. His less skeptical friends kept him alive — presumably by guiding him away from busy roads, vicious dogs, and deep gorges. Another tradition, however, says that he only theorized about suspension of judgments, and took action to preserve himself and otherwise lead a normal life, but doing so without any judgments as to natural good and bad. Living providently, he reached ninety years of age (DL IX 62).

In any event, Pyrrho's suspension of judgment led to a certain detachment. Not knowing what was good or bad by nature, he was indifferent where dogmatists would be unhappy or at least anxious. For instance, he performed household chores usually done by women (DL IX 63-66). Thus Pyrrho's skepticism detached him from the dogmatic judgments of a culture in which a man's performing women's work was considered demeaning. In turn, his skepticism and suspension of judgment led to freedom from disturbance (ataraxia) (DL IX 68). It is significant that this psychological state, so important for Epicureans as part of the end of life, should play a key role in Pyrrhonian skepticism at its beginning with Pyrrho, but certainly in its development with Sextus Empiricus.

While suspension of judgment in moral matters brings freedom from disturbance, it does not lead to immoral behavior. Their type of skepticism about what is good or bad by nature allowed Pyrrhonists to choose and avoid things according to habit and custom (DL IX 108). Sextus generalizes the Skeptic teaching about appearances to cover the whole area of practical activity. He says the rules of everyday conduct are divided into four parts: (1) the guidance from nature, (2) compulsion that comes from bodily states like hunger and thirst, (3) traditional laws and customs about pious and good living, (4) the teachings of the crafts (Sextus Empiricus, Outlines of Pyrrhonism, I 21-24). The Skeptic is guided by all of these as by appearance, and thus undogmatically. For instance, he would follow the traditional laws about pious and good living, accepting these laws as the way things appear to him to be in matters of piety and goodness but claiming no knowledge.

Sextus says that the end of life is freedom from disturbance in matters of belief, plus moderate states in matters of compulsion. Suspension of judgment provides the former in that one is not disturbed about which of two opposing claims is true, when (as always seems to happen) one cannot rationally decide between them. Matters of compulsion cover such things as bodily needs for food, drink, and warmth. While the Skeptic undeniably suffers when hungry, thirsty, or cold, he achieves a moderate state with respect to these sufferings when compared to the person who both suffers them and believes they are naturally bad. The Skeptic's suspension of judgment about whether his suffering is naturally bad gives him a certain detachment from the suffering (I 25-30).

As a consequence, the Skeptic conception of the end of life is similar in some ways to Epicurean and Stoic beliefs. For Epicureans the end is freedom from pain and distress; the Stoic identification of virtue and the good promises freedom from disturbance. While Pyrrho and Sextus hold freedom from disturbance to be the end of life, they differ from the former over the means to freedom from disturbance. The Epicureans, for example, hold that virtue is the infallible means to freedom from disturbance. By contrast, Sextus does not have a lot to say in a positive vein about virtue, although he does recommend following traditional laws about piety and goodness. Rather, for Skeptics it is an epistemic attitude, not virtue, that leads to the desired state. Moreover, while Sextus talks about the end of life, the word for happiness is conspicuously absent from his account. The omission may not be significant since in the philosophical tradition happiness is generally understood to be the end of life. In any event, their moral theory is so thin, that they could not be called eudaimonists even if one allows that freedom from disturbance fills the same role as happiness does in eudaimonism. Following moral conventions might be a means to or even a constituent of freedom from disturbance; but in this regard it is no different from any other activity. Following moral conventions has a role in freedom from disturbance only if it is done with the appropriate epistemic attitude.


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Aristotle, General Topics: ethics | Plato | Pyrrho