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Contemporary Approaches to the Social Contract

First published Sun Mar 3, 1996; substantive revision Tue Apr 8, 2003

The idea of the social contract goes back, in a recognizably modern form, to Thomas Hobbes, but is most notably embodied, in our times, in the work of John Rawls. The basic idea is a simple one. What makes some particular system of collectively enforced social arrangements legitimate is that it is the object of an agreement for the people who are subject to it. (As in the case of public justification, the key phrase, ‘the object of an agreement’, is multiply ambiguous.) In the case of a literal contract -- say for an exchange of goods -- each of the parties has reason to honor the terms of the contract either in the (bare) fact of having agreed to its terms (under certain circumstances) or in the fact of its terms being agreeable ones. Similarly, in the case of a social contract in the manner of Hobbes or Rawls, each of the parties has reason to honor h/er responsibilities under the terms of the contract -- e.g. to pay taxes, conform to laws, participate in decision-making, etc. -- either on account of h/er agreement to do so, or, perhaps, on account of its being reasonable that s/he do so. (These are what Michael Lessnoff (1986) calls the voluntaristic and rationalistic readings of the contract.) In its modern guises, contract approaches are not intended as accounts of the historical origins of current social arrangements, but, instead, as answers to, or frameworks for answering, questions about legitimacy and political obligation. Important issues associated with the social contract include the binding force of hypothetical agreements, the reduction (or not) of ethico-political to instrumental reasoning, and the compatibility of contract reasoning with fairness and liberty.

1. Hypothetical Contracts?

Contemporary contract theory is, characteristically, doubly hypothetical. Certainly, no prominent theorist thinks that questions of legitimacy and obligation are settled by an actual survey of attitudes towards existing social arrangements, and are not settled until such a survey has been carried out. The question, then, is not "Are these arrangements the object of an actual agreement amongst stakeholders?" (If this were the question, the answer would typically be "No".) The question, rather, is "Would these arrangements be the object of an agreement if stakeholders were surveyed?" Although both of the questions are, in some sense, susceptible to an empirical reading, only the latter is in play in present-day theorizing. The contract nowadays is always hypothetical in at least this first sense.

There is a reading of the (first-order) hypothetical question "Would the arrangements be the object of agreement if___" which, as indicated, is still resolutely empirical in some sense. This is the reading where what's required of the theorist is that s/he try to determine what an actual survey of actual stakeholders would reveal about their actual attitudes towards their system of social arrangements. (We don't really perform the survey, but we do perform it in imagination.) But there is another reading that is more widely accepted in the contemporary context. On this reading, the question, really, is no longer a hypothetical question about actual reactions; it is, rather, a hypothetical question about hypothetical reactions -- it is, as I have said, doubly hypothetical. Framing the question is the first hypothetical element: "Would it be the object of agreement if they were surveyed?" Framed by this question is the second hypothetical element, one which involves the so-called stakeholders, who are no longer treated empirically, i.e. taken as given, but are, instead, themselves considered from a hypothetical point of view -- as they would be if (typically) they were better informed or more impartial, etc. The question for most contemporary contract theorists, then, is, roughly, this. "If we surveyed the idealized surrogates of the actual stakeholders in this polity, would current social arrangements be the object of an agreement for them?" A "Yes" answer confers legitimacy and imposes obligations; a "No" answer signals illegitimacy and relieves us of, or shows the purely historical status of, obligations that we might now submit to.

Of course, questions arise -- and have been raised most notably by Ronald Dworkin -- about how a (doubly) hypothetical agreement can bind any actual person. The point of second-stage hypotheticalizing is, inter alia, that, as I actually am, I might not agree to be bound by some system of social arrangements S. Suppose that it could be shown, however, that my surrogate (a better informed, more impartial version of me) would agree to be bound by S. What has that to do with me? Where this second-stage hypotheticalization is employed, it seems to be proposed that I can be bound by agreements that others, different from me, would have made. It is like saying that I ought to be bound to respect S on account of your having agreed to be bound by S. While it might (though it needn't) be reasonable to suppose that I can be bound by agreements that I would myself have entered into if given the opportunity, it is just crazy to think that I can be bound by agreements that, demonstrably, I wouldn't have made even if I had been asked.

Rawls's solution to this problem reflects the complexity of his original position argumentation and the idea of reflective equilibrium which it depends on. In effect, Rawls identifies two contracts, one framing the other. The first contract is one that, as we actually are, each of us makes with the surrogate who is to represent us in second-stage contractual reasoning. As I am, I agree that the question is NOT "Do I agree as I actually am to S?" but, instead, "Would I agree if I were ___ to S?", or, in other words, "Will I be bound by agreements that will be made in respect of S by my idealized surrogate (or better self)?" Once I have answered "Yes" (of course hypothetically; there is no actual survey) to the first, framing question, I will be bound to the demands of S so long as my idealized surrogate -- the subject of the second, framed (and still hypothetical) contractual question -- says "Yes" to the system S of social arrangements. (This is what Rawls meant when he characterized the parties to the original position as trustees for the interests of ‘you and me’.) Crudely, the reasoning runs as follows. I agree to be represented by X for certain purposes; X agrees that the system S is a legitimate one; hence I am bound by this system, for my trustee has agreed to it on my behalf -- this is one of the purposes for which s/he was to represent me. As Rawls said (1999, p.514): "Finally, we may remind ourselves that the hypothetical nature of the original position invites the question: why should we take any interest in it, moral or otherwise. Recall the answer: the conditions embodied in the description of this situation are ones that we do in fact accept."

2. Reductionism?

Contemporary contract theorists tend to be constructivists in the sense that they recognize no independent and determinate external standard of legitimacy that the contractual device is intended to approximate, but, rather, make the truth-maker for "S is legitimate" that S was the object of an agreement (for stakeholders or their surrogates). Crudely, being agreed to makes a regime legitimate; it is not that being agreed to is evidence for legitimacy otherwise conceived.

Within this constructivist framework, there are two main schools of contract thinking, which reflect differences which were already apparent between Hobbes's approach and John Locke's.

On the one hand, we have those contractarians, such as David Gauthier and James Buchanan, who think that legitimacy of regimes is determined by their prudential acceptability from the diverse points of view that are represented in relevant communities. On this account, the basis for an individual's agreement, and hence for h/er judgment that the regime is a legitimate one is that enforcement of the regime's demands contributes to the realization of h/er aspirations. On this account, to say "S is legitimate" is to say, more or less, that S is good for its various members. This is a prudential account of legitimacy and, if we think that prudence is a more basic idea than the ideas of morality, then this approach is reductionistic in the sense that it derives ethico-political notions like legitimacy and obligation from non-ethico-political notions such as acceptance-grounded-on-prudence. Insofar as there is some problem in understanding how genuinely ethico-political reasons can also function as motives (alleged to be a problem on cognitivist interpretations), such a reductionistic strategy may be appealing; there is alleged to be little trouble understanding how purely prudential reasons can serve as motives -- though, of course, this is a common assumption, rather than a demonstrated conclusion.

On the other hand, some contractualists, most notably Rawls and including, especially, Thomas Scanlon (1998), already build ethico-political assumptions into their particular approach to hypotheticalization. The kinds of surrogates which ‘you and I’ commission to act as our agents in reasoning about legitimacy are, on Rawls's account, already so situated that their deliberations will be framed by ethico-political considerations. (See the article "Original Position". The agents' deliberations are carried out in purely prudential terms, but they are subject to the ‘veil of ignorance’, which itself embodies important ethico-political notions.) Indeed, it can fairly be said that any approach to contract thinking that substitutes impartial surrogates for concrete individuals is anti-reductionist in this way. (As Rawls himself pointed out, some broadly utilitarian approaches to legitimacy can be conceptualized as involving a hypothetical contract. The assumptions that John Harsanyi (1977), for instance, makes in developing his version of the social contract make his approach an anti-reductionistic one.)

3. Challenges

Bruce Ackerman (1980) has mounted a profound challenge to contract thinking. It works, crudely, on the idea that the premises of a course of contract reasoning can be manipulated so as to yield (more or less) any conclusion that the theorist has some antecedent interest in producing. The argument goes as follows. Each version of contract theory must specify three features: (i) the chooser c, (ii) the situation of choice C, and (iii) the alternatives A from which a choice is made. If c chooses S from A in C, then this establishes the legitimacy of S only relative to the specification of chooser, situation, and choice-set, and hence could be put into doubt, absent further constraints on the situation, by alternative specifications. Most obviously, if the choice-set is arbitrarily confined to S and various alternatives that are chosen by the theorist for their utterly unacceptable character, then any selection of S from A is meaningless as a legitimator. (The trick could be worked as easily, though not as transparently perhaps, by restricting the characterization of c or of C.) Perhaps the solution to this problem is simply to lift all restrictions on C, A, and c, hence banishing all arbitrary elements. If all the alternatives are canvassed and if the chooser isn't biased for or against any of them, then, surely, the fact that h/er choice was S does indeed confer legitimacy. However, as Ackerman points out, this won't work either, for, with no limits on A, and with no biasing -- and hence distinguishing -- characteristics built into c, there can be no choice at all. What would a chooser without bases for choice even be like?

Ackerman only considers two possibilities: (i) that contract thinking is unrestricted -- but, if so, utterly empty; (ii) that contract thinking is rigged -- but, if so, utterly devoid of normative force. However, there may be a non-arbitrary, non-empty form of such reasoning. This, anyway, is what Rawls thought. He certainly didn't permit unrestricted reasoning about legitimacy; his deliberators in the original position are trustees for the "higher-order interests" of their principles, and hence, via further argumentation, (surrogate) maximizers of social primary goods, reasoning in accordance with certain ethico-politically significant constraints -- a veil of ignorance embodying a concept of justice. On the other hand, although the course of reasoning does make concrete assumptions about choosers, choice-situations, and choice-sets, the assumptions it makes, or so Rawls claimed, are ones that we share. So while they might be arbitrary sub specie aeternitatis, they are not arbitrary from the point of view of the concrete individuals on whose behalf they are made. As these individuals see it, these particular assumptions are privileged at least in the sense that they represent current community attitudes about justice. A demonstration of legitimacy is relative to these assumptions, but, since they are the best the community can do, there is nothing untoward about this. (This raises, but does not solve, the problem of ideology -- i.e. that the community's very notion of justice is already corrupted. Notice that, within a constructivist framework, this judgment can itself be made only from the point of view of another community's concept of justice -- a concept that might itself also be corrupted.)

Robert Nozick (1974) also mounted a powerful challenge to contract thinking, at least of the kinds that Rawls represented. His argument proceeds in three stages. (1) Nozick distinguished end-state principles of social life from historical principles. An end-state principle says, in effect, that a situation S is legitimate only if it approximates a particular canonical state of affairs S*. An historical principle, on the other hand, says that any state is legitimate, whatever it might be substantively, so long as it has been reached from previous states by processes which are themselves legitimate. (2) Nozick noted that end-state judgments of legitimacy are very volatile in changing circumstances, and, hence, that ensuring continued legitimacy could, on this account, involve such arbitrarily large restrictions of liberty as to be unacceptable. (3) Nozick then noted that contract thinking, at least of the Rawlsian kind, delivers up end-state principles of legitimacy, and hence must be rejected -- on account of point (2).

Nozick's argument is most vulnerable on point (2). It is true that Rawls's particular argument does yield an end-state principle in the form of the difference principle. And it certainly seems likely that continued legitimacy, by this standard, might require large impositions on individuals' liberties. But these considerations only establish that liberty and fairness may need to be traded off against one another in uncongenial ways, as Isaiah Berlin (1958) had, of course, long ago pointed out; they do not establish a decisive objection to the contract approach.


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ethics: deontological | justification, political: public | liberalism | original position