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Causation and Manipulability

First published Fri 17 Aug, 2001

Manipulablity theories of causation, according to which causes are to be regarded as handles or devices for manipulating effects, have considerable intuitive appeal and are popular among social scientists and statisticians. This article surveys several prominent versions of such theories advocated by philosophers, and the many difficulties they face. Philosophical statements of the manipulationist approach are generally reductionist in aspiration and assign a central role to human action. These contrast with recent discussions employing a broadly manipulationist framework for understanding causation, such as those due to the computer scientist Judea Pearl and others, which are non-reductionist and rely instead on the notion of an intervention. This is simply an appropriately exogenous causal process; it has no essential connection with human action. This interventionist framework manages to avoid at least some of these difficulties faced by traditional philosophical versions of the manipulability theory and helps to clarify the content of causal claims.

1. Introduction

A commonsensical idea about causation is that causal relationships are relationships that are potentially exploitable for purposes of manipulation and control: very roughly, if C is genuinely a cause of E, then if I can manipulate C in the right way, this should be a way of manipulating or changing E. This idea is the cornerstone of manipulability theories of causation developed by philosophers such as Gasking (1955), Collingwood (1940), von Wright (1971), and Menzies and Price (1993). It is also an idea that is advocated by many non-philosophers. For example, in their extremely influential text on experimental design (1979) Cook and Campbell write:

The paradigmatic assertion in causal relationships is that manipulation of a cause will result in the manipulation of an effect. … Causation implies that by varying one factor I can make another vary. [Cook & Campbell, 1979, p. 36, emphasis in original.]

Similar ideas are commonplace in econometrics and in the so-called structural equations or causal modeling literature, and very recently have been forcefully reiterated by the computer scientist Judea Pearl in an impressive book length treatment of causality (Pearl, 2000).

To a large extent, however, recent philosophical discussion has been unsympathetic to manipulability theories: it is claimed both that they are unilluminatingly circular and that they lead to a conception of causation that is unacceptably anthropocentric or at least insufficiently general in the sense that it is linked much too closely to the practical possibility of human manipulation. (See, e.g., Hausman, 1986, 1998). Both objections seem prima-facie plausible. Suppose that X is a variable that takes one of two different values, 0 and 1, depending on whether some event of interest occurs. Then for an event or process M to qualify as a manipulation of X, it would appear that there must be a causal connection between M and X: to manipulate X, one must cause it to change in value. How then can we use the notion of manipulation to provide an account of causation? Moreover, it is uncontroversial that causal relationships can obtain in circumstances in which manipulation of the cause by human beings is not practically possible -- think of the causal relationship between the gravitational attraction of the moon and the motion of the tides or causal relationships in the very early universe. How can a manipulability theory avoid generating a notion of causation that is so closely tied to what humans can do that it is inapplicable to such cases?

As remarked above, the generally negative assessment of manipulability theories among philosophers contrasts sharply with the widespread view among statisticians, theorists of experimental design, and many social and natural scientists that an appreciation of the connection between causation and manipulation can play an important role in clarifying the meaning of causal claims and understanding their distinctive features. This in turn generates a puzzle. Are non-philosophers simply mistaken in thinking that focusing on the connection between causation and manipulation can tell us something valuable about causation? Does the widespread invocation of something like a manipulability conception among practicing scientist show that the usual philosophical criticisms of manipulability theories of causation are misguided?

The ensuing discussion is organized as follows. §§2 and 3 describe two of the best known philosophical formulations of the manipulability theory -- those due to von Wright (1971) and Menzies and Price (1993) -- and explore certain difficulties with them. §4 argues that the notion of a free action cannot play the central role it is assigned in traditional versions of manipulability theories. §5 introduces the notion of an intervention which allows for a more adequate statement of the manipulability approach to causation and which has figured prominently in recent discussion. §6 considers Pearl's "interventionist" formulation of a manipulability theory and an alternative to it, due to Woodward. §§7 and 8 take up the charge that manipulability theories are circular. §9 returns to the relationship between interventions and human actions, while §10 compares manipulability accounts with David Lewis' closely related counterfactual theory of causation. Finally, §11 considers whether there are meaningful causal claims that cannot be captured by a manipulability theory.

As we shall see, the different assessments of manipulability accounts of causation within and outside of philosophy derive from the different goals or aspirations that underlie the versions of the theory developed by these two groups. Philosophical defenders of the manipulability conception have typically attempted to turn the connection between causation and manipulability into a reductive analysis: their strategy has been to take as primitive the notion of manipulation (or some related notion like agency or bringing about an outcome as a result of a free action), to argue that this notion is not itself causal (or at least does not presuppose all of the features of causality the investigator is trying to analyze), and to then attempt to use this notion to construct a non-circular reductive definition of what it is for a relationship to be causal. Philosophical critics have (quite reasonably) assessed such approaches in terms of this aspiration (i.e., they have tended to think that manipulability accounts are of interest only insofar as they lead to a non-circular analysis of causal claims) and have found the claim of a successful reduction unconvincing. By contrast, statisticians and other non-philosophers who have explored the link between causation and manipulation generally have not had reductionist aspirations-instead their interest has been in unpacking what causal claims mean and in showing how they figure in inference by tracing their interconnections with other related concepts (such as manipulation) but without suggesting that the notion of manipulation is itself a causally innocent notion.

It is the impulse toward reduction that generates the other feature that critics have found objectionable in standard formulations of the manipulability theory. To carry through the reduction, one needs to show that the notion of agency is independent of or prior to the notion of causality and this in turn requires that human actions or manipulations be given a special status-they can't be ordinary causal transactions, but must instead be an independent fundamental feature of the world in their own right. This both seems problematic on its own terms (it is prima-facie inconsistent with various naturalizing programs) and leads directly to the problem of anthropocentricity: if the only way in which we understand causation is by means of our prior grasp of an independent notion of agency, then it is hard to see what could justify us in extending the notion of causation to circumstances in which manipulation by human beings is not possible and the relevant experience of agency unavailable. As we shall see, both von Wright and Menzies and Price struggle, not entirely successfully, with this difficulty.

The way out of these problems is to follow writers like Pearl in reformulating the manipulability approach in terms of the notion of an intervention, where this is characterized in purely causal terms that make no essential reference to human action. Some human actions will qualify as interventions but they will do so in virtue of their causal characteristics, not because they are free or carried out by humans. This "interventionist" reformulation allows the manipulability theory to avoid a number of counterexamples to more traditional versions of the theory. Moreover, when so reformulated, the theory may be extended readily to capture causal claims in contexts in which human manipulation is impossible. However, the price of such a reformulation is that we lose the possibility of a reduction of causal claims to claims that are non-causal. Fortunately (or so §§7 and 8 argue) an interventionist formulation of a manipulability theory may be non-trivial and illuminating even if it fails to be reductive.

2. von Wright

In his (1971) von Wright describes the basic idea of the manipulability approach as follows:
… to think of a relation between events as causal is to think of it under the aspect of (possible) action. It is therefore true, but at the same time a little misleading to say that if p is a (sufficient) cause of q, then if I could produce p I could bring about q. For that p is the cause of q, I have endeavored to say here, means that I could bring about q, if I could do (so that) p. (p. 74)
To the objection that "doing" or "producing" is already a causal notion and hence not something to which we can legitimately appeal to elucidate the notion of causation, von Wright responds as follows:
The connection between an action and its result is intrinsic, logical and not causal (extrinsic). If the result does not materialize, the action simply has not been performed. The result is an essential "part" of the action. It is a bad mistake to think of the act(ion) itself as a cause of its result. (pp. 67-8 )

Here we see a very explicit attempt to rebut the charge that an account of causation based on agency is circular by contending that the relation between an action (or a human manipulation) and its result is not an ordinary causal relation. Moreover, von Wright readily embraces the further conclusion that seems to follow from this: human action must be a concept which, in our understanding of the world, is just as "basic" as the notion of causality (p. 74).

Given the logical structure of von Wright's views, it is also not surprising, to find him struggling to make sense of the idea that there can be causal relations involving events that human beings cannot in fact manipulate. He writes:

The eruption of Vesuvius was the cause of the destruction of Pompeii. Man can through his action destroy cities, but he cannot, we think, make volcanoes erupt. Does this not prove that the cause-factor is not distinguished from the effect-factor by being in a certain sense capable of manipulation? The answer is negative. The eruption of a volcano and the destruction of a city are two very complex events. Within each of them a number of events or phases and causal connections between them may be distinguished. For example, that when a stone from high above hits a man on his head, it kills him. Or that the roof of a house will collapse under a given load. Or that a man cannot stand heat above a certain temperature. All these are causal connections with which we are familiar from experience and which are such that the cause-factor typically satisfies the requirement of manipulability. (p. 70)

von Wright's view is that to understand a causal claim involving a cause that human beings cannot in fact manipulate (e.g., the eruption of a volcano) we must interpret it in terms of claims about causes that human beings can manipulate (impacts of falling stones on human heads and so on). We will return to this general idea below in connection with Price and Menzies but it is worth noting that it faces an obvious problem. If we try to explain what it means to say that different galaxies attract one another gravitationally by contending that such interactions are in some relevant respects similar to gravitational interactions with which we are familiar or have experience (people and projectiles falling to earth), we need to explain what "similar" means and it is very hard to see how to do this within the framework of an agency theory. The relevant notion of similarity does not seem to be a notion that can be spelled out in terms of similarities in people's experiences of agency. Either we explain the relevant notion of similarity in straightforwardly causal terms that seem to have nothing to do with agency (e.g., we say that the similarity consists in the fact that the same gravitational force law is operative in both cases), in which case we have effectively abandoned the agency theory, or else we are led to the conclusion that causal claims involving unmanipulable causes like galaxies involve a conception of causality which is fundamentally different from the conception that is applicable to manipulable causes.

3. Menzies and Price

A very similar dialectic is at work in an extremely interesting recent paper by Peter Menzies and Huw Price (1993) (and in a series of papers written by Price alone, 1991, 1992) which represents the most detailed and sustained attempt in the recent philosophical literature to develop an "agency" theory of causation. Price and Menzies basic thesis is that:
… an event A is a cause of a distinct event B just in case bringing about the occurrence of A would be an effective means by which a free agent could bring about the occurrence of B. (1993, p. 187)

They take this connection between free agency and causation to support a probabilistic analysis of causation (according to which "A causes B" can be plausibly identified with "A raises the probability of B") provided that the probabilities appealed to are what they call "agent probabilities," where

[a]gent probabilities are to be thought of as conditional probabilities, assessed from the agent's perspective under the supposition that antecedent condition is realized ab initio , as a free act of the agent concerned. Thus the agent probability that one should ascribe to B conditional on A is the probability that B would hold were one to choose to realize A. (1993, p. 190)

The idea is thus that the agent probability of B conditional on A is the probability that B would have conditional on the assumption that A has a special sort of status or history -- in particular, on the assumption that A is realized by a free act. A will be a cause of B just in case the probability of B conditional on the assumption that A is realized by a free act is greater than the unconditional probability of B; A will be a spurious cause of B just in case these two probabilities are equal. As an illustration, consider a stock example of philosophers -- a structure in which atmospheric pressure, represented by a variable Z, is a common cause of the reading X of a barometer and the occurrence of a storm Y, with no causal relationship between X and Y. X and Y will be correlated, but Price's and Menzies' intuitive idea is that conditional on the realization of X by a free act, this correlation will disappear, indicating that the correlation between X and Y is spurious and does not reflect a causal connection from X to Y. If, by contrast, this correlation were to persist, this would be an indication that X was after all a cause of Y. (What "free act" might mean in this context will be explored below, but I take it that what is intended -- as opposed to what Price and Menzies actually say -- is that the manipulation of X should satisfy the conditions we would associate with an ideal experiment designed to determine whether X causes Y -- thus, for example, the experimenter should manipulate the position of the barometer dial in a way that is independent of the atmospheric pressure Z, perhaps by setting its value after consulting the output of some randomizing device.)

Like von Wright, Price and Menzies attempt to appeal to this notion of agency to provide a non-circular, reductive analysis of causation. They claim that circularity is avoided because we have a grasp of the experience of agency that is independent of our grasp of the general notion of causation.

The basic premise is that from an early age, we all have direct experience of acting as agents. That is, we have direct experience not merely of the Humean succession of events in the external world, but of a very special class of such successions: those in which the earlier event is an action of our own, performed in circumstances in which we both desire the later event, and believe that it is more probable given the act in question than it would be otherwise. To put it more simply, we all have direct personal experience of doing one thing and thence achieving another. … It is this common and commonplace experience that licenses what amounts to an ostensive definition of the notion of ‘bringing about’. In other words, these cases provide direct non-linguistic acquaintance with the concept of bringing about an event; acquaintance which does not depend on prior acquisition of any causal notion. An agency theory thus escapes the threat of circularity. (1993, p. 194-5)

Again like von Wright, Menzies and Price recognize that, once the notion of causation has been tied in this way to our "personal experience of doing one thing and hence achieving another" (1993, p. 194), a problem arises concerning unmanipulable causes. To use their own example, what can it mean to say that "the 1989 San Francisco earthquake was caused by friction between continental plates" (p. 195) if no one has (or given the present state of human capabilities could have) the direct personal experience of bringing about an earthquake by manipulating these plates? Their response to this difficulty is complex, but the central idea is captured in the following passages

… we would argue that when an agent can bring about one event as a means to bringing about another, this is true in virtue of certain basic intrinsic features of the situation involved, these features being essentially non-causal though not necessarily physical in character. Accordingly, when we are presented with another situation involving a pair of events which resembles the given situation with respect to its intrinsic features, we infer that the pair of events are causally related even though they may not be manipulable. (1993, p. 197)

Clearly, the agency account, so weakened, allows us to make causal claims about unmanipulable events such as the claim that the 1989 San Francisco earthquake was caused by friction between continental plates. We can make such causal claims because we believe that there is another situation that models the circumstances surrounding the earthquake in the essential respects and does support a means-end relation between an appropriate pair of events. The paradigm example of such a situation would be that created by seismologists in their artificial simulations of the movement of continental plates. (1993, p. 197)

The problem with this strategy parallels the difficulty with von Wright's broadly similar suggestion. What is the nature of the "intrinsic" but (allegedly) "non-causal" features in virtue of which the movements of the continental plates "resemble" the artificial models which the seismologists are able to manipulate? It is well-known that small scale models and simulations of naturally occurring phenomena that superficially resemble or mimic those phenomena may nonetheless fail to capture their causally relevant features because, for example, the models fail to "scale up" -- because causal processes that are not represented in the model become quite important at the length scales that characterize the naturally occurring phenomena. Thus, when we ask what it is for a model or simulation which contains manipulable causes to "resemble" phenomena involving unmanipulable causes, the relevant notion of resemblance seems to require that the same causal processes are operative in both. Price and Menzies provide no reason to believe that this notion of resemblance can be characterized in non-causal terms. But if the extension of their account to unmanipulable causes requires a notion of resemblance that is already causal in character and which, ex hypothesi cannot be explained in terms of our experience of agency, then their reduction fails.

It might be thought the difficulty under discussion can be avoided by the simple expedient of adhering to a counterfactual formulation of the manipulability theory. Indeed, it is clear that some counterfactual formulation is required if the theory is to be even remotely plausible: after all, no one supposes that A can only be a cause of B if A is in fact manipulated. Instead, the intuitive core of the manipulability theory should be formulated as the claim (CF):

(CF) A causes B if and only if B would change if an appropriate manipulation on A were to be carried out.
The suggestion under consideration attempts to avoid the difficulties posed by causes that are not manipulable by human beings by contending that for (CF) to be true, it is not required that the manipulation in question be practically possible for human beings to carry out or even that human beings exist. Instead all that is required is that if human beings were to exist and to carry out the requisite manipulation of A (e.g. the continental plates), B (whether or not an earthquake occurs) would change. (The possibility of adopting such a counterfactual formulation is sympathetically explored, but not fully endorsed by Ernest Sosa and Michael Tooley in the introduction to their (1993))

One fundamental problem with this suggestion is that, independently of whether a counterfactual formulation is adopted, the notion of a free action or human manipulation cannot by itself, for reasons to be described in Section 4, do the work (that of distinguishing between genuine and spurious causal relationships) that Menzies and Price wish it to do. But in addition to this, a counterfactual formulation along the lines of (CF) seems completely unilluminating unless accompanied by some sort of account of how we are to understand and assess such counterfactuals and, more specifically, what sort of situation or possibility we are supposed to envision when we imagine that the antecedent of (CF) is true. Consider, for example, a causal claim about the very early universe during which temperatures are so high that atoms and molecules and presumably anything we can recognize as an agent cannot exist. What counterfactual scenario or possible world are we supposed to envision when we ask, along the lines of (CF), what would happen if human beings were to exist and were able to carry out certain manipulations in this situation? A satisfying version of an agency theory should give us an account of how our experience of agency in ordinary contexts gives us a purchase on how to understand and evaluate such counterfactuals. To their credit, von Wright and Price and Menzies attempt to do this, but in my view they are unsuccessful.

4. Causation and Free Action

As we have seen, Menzies and Price assign a central role to "free action" in the elucidation of causation. They do not further explain what they mean by this phrase preferring instead, as the passage quoted above indicates, to point to a characteristic experience we have as agents. It seems clear, however, that whether (as soft determinists would have it) a free action is understood as an action that is uncoerced or unconstrained or due to voluntary choices of the agent, or whether, as libertarians would have it, a free action is an action that is uncaused or not deterministically caused, the persistence of a correlation between A and B when A is realized as a "free act" is not sufficient for A to cause B. Suppose that, in the example described above, the position of the barometer dial X is set by a free act (in either of the above senses) of the experimenter but that that this free act (and hence X) is correlated with Z, the variable measuring atmospheric pressure, perhaps because the experimenter observes the atmospheric pressure and freely chooses to set X in a way that is correlated with Z. (This possibility is compatible with the experimenter's act of setting X being free in either of the above two senses.) In this case, X will remain correlated with Y when produced by a free act, even though X does not cause Y. Suppose, then, that we respond to this difficulty by adding to our characterization of A's being realized by a free act the idea that this act must not itself be correlated with any other cause of A. (Passages in Price, 1991 suggest such an additional proviso, although the condition in question seems to have nothing to do with the usual understanding of free action.) Even with this proviso, it need not be the case that A causes B if A remains correlated with B when A is produced by an act that is free in this sense, since it still remains possible that the free act that produces A also causes B via a route that does not go through A. As an illustration, consider a case in which an experimenter's administration of a drug to a treatment group (by inducing patients to ingest it) has a placebo effect that enhances recovery, even though the drug itself has no effect on recovery. There is a correlation between ingestion of the drug and recovery that persists under the experimenter's free act of administering the drug even though ingestion of the drug does not cause recovery.

5. Interventions

Examples like those just described show that if we wish to follow Menzies and Price in defending the claim that if an association between A and B persists when A is given the right sort of "independent causal history" or is "manipulated" in the right way, then A causes B, we need to be much more precise by what we mean by the quoted phases. There have been a number of attempts to do this in the recent literature on causation. The basic idea that all of these discussions attempt to capture is that of a "surgical" change in A which is of such a character that if any change occurs in B, it occurs only as a result of its causal connection, if any, to A and not in any other way. In other words, the change in B, if any, that is produced by the manipulation of A should be produced only via a causal route that goes through A. Manipulations or changes in the value of a variable that have the right sort of surgical features have come to be called interventions in the recent literature (e.g. Spirtes, Glymour and Scheines, 1993, Meek and Glymour, 1994, Hausman, 1998, Pearl, 2000, Woodward, 1997, 2000, Woodward and Hitchcock, forthcoming, Cartwright, forthcoming) and I will follow this practice. The characterization of the notion of an intervention is rightly seen by many writers as central to the development of a plausible version of a manipulability theory . One of the most detailed attempts to think systematically about interventions and their significance for understanding causation is due to Pearl, 2000 and I turn now to a discussion of his views.

6. Pearl

Pearl uses systems of equations and directed graphs to represent causal relationships and his work provides a striking illustration of the heuristic usefulness of a manipulationist framework in specifying what it is to give such systems a causal interpretation.[1] Pearl characterizes the notion of an intervention by reference to a primitive notion of a causal mechanism. A functional causal model is a system of equations Xi = F(Pai, Ui) where Pai represents the parents or direct causes of Xi that are explicitly included in the model and Ui represents an error variable that summarizes the impact of all excluded variables. Each equation represents a distinct causal mechanism which is understood to be "autonomous" in the sense in which that notion is used in econometrics; this means roughly that it is possible to interfere with or disrupt each mechanism (and the corresponding equation) without disrupting any of the others. The simplest sort of intervention in which some variable Xi is set to some particular value xi amounts, in Pearl's words, to "lifting Xi from the influence of the old functional mechanism Xi = Fi (Pai, Ui) and placing it under the influence of a new mechanism that sets the value xi while keeping all other mechanisms undisturbed." (Pearl, 2000, p. 70; I have altered the notation slightly). In other words, the intervention disrupts completely the relationship between Xi and its parents so that the value of Xi is determined entirely by the intervention. Furthermore, the intervention is surgical in the sense that no other causal relationships in the system are changed. Formally, this amounts to replacing the equation governing Xi with a new equation Xi = xi, substituting for this new value of Xi in all the equations in which Xi occurs but leaving the other equations themselves unaltered. Pearl's assumption is that the other variables that change in value under this intervention will do so only if they are effects of Xi.

Following Pearl, let us represent the proposition that the value of X has been set by an intervention to some particular value, x0, by means of a "do" operator (do(X=x0), or more simply, do x0). It is important to understand that conditioning on the information that the value of X has been set to x0 will in general be quite different from conditioning on the information that the value of X has been observed to be x0. (See Meek and Glymour, 1994; Pearl, 2000.) For example, in the case in which X and Y are joint effects of the common cause Z, P(Y/X=x0) P(Y); that is, Y and X are not independent. However, P(Y/do(X=x0) = P(Y); that is, Y will be independent of X, if the value of X is set by an intervention. This is because the intervention on X will break the causal connection from Z to X, so that the probabilistic dependence between Y and X that is produced by Z in the undisturbed system will no longer hold once the intervention occurs. In this way, we may capture Menzies' and Price's idea that X causes Y if and only if the correlation between X and Y would persist under the right sort of manipulation of X.

This framework allows for a simple definitions of various causal notions. For example, Pearl defines the "causal effect" of X on Y associated with the "realization" of a particular value x of X as:

(C) P(y/do x),
that is, as the distribution that Y would assume under an intervention that sets the value of X to the value x. It is obvious that this is a version of a counterfactual account of causation.

One of the many attractions of this approach is that it yields a very natural account of what it is to give a causal interpretation to a system of equations of the sort employed in the so-called causal modeling literature. For example, if a linear regression equation Y = aX + U makes a causal claim, it is to be understood as claiming that if an intervention were to occur that sets the value of X=x0 in circumstances U=u0, the value of Y would be y = ax0 + u0, or alternatively that an intervention that changes X by amount dx will change Y by amount a dx. As another illustration consider the system of equations

(1) Y = aX + U
(2) Z = bX + cY + V
We may rewrite these as follows
(1) Y = aX + U
(3) Z = dX + W
where d = b + ac and W = cU + V. Since (3) has been obtained by substituting (1) into (2), the system (1)-(2) has exactly the same solutions in X , Y , and Z as the system (1)-(3). Since X, Y and Z are the only measured variables, (1)-(2) and (1)-(3) are "observationally equivalent" in the sense that they imply or represent exactly the same facts about the patterns of correlations that obtain among the measured variables. Nonetheless two systems correspond to different causal structures. (1)-(2) says that X is a direct cause of Y and that X and Y are direct causes of Z. By contrast, (1)-(3) says that X is a direct cause of Y and that X is a direct cause of Z but says nothing about a causal relation between Y and Z. We can cash this difference out within the interventionist/manipulationist framework described above -- (2) claims that an intervention on Y will change Z while (3) denies this. (Recall that an intervention on Y with respect to Z must not be correlated with any other cause of Z such as X, and will break any causal connection between X and Y.) Thus while the two systems of equations agree about the correlations so far observed, they disagree about what would happen under an intervention on Y. According to an interventionist/manipulationist account of causation, it is the system that gets such counterfactuals right that correctly represents the causal facts.

One possible limitation of Pearl's characterization of an intervention concerns the scope of the requirement that an intervention on Xi leave intact all other mechanisms besides the mechanism that previously determined the value of Xi. If, as Pearl apparently intends, we understand this to include the requirement that an intervention on Xi must leave intact the causal mechanism if any, that connects Xi to its possible effects Y, then an obvious worry about circularity arises, at least if we want to use the notion of an intervention to characterize what it is for Xi to cause Y. A closely related problem is that given the way Pearl characterizes the notion of an intervention, his definition (C) of the causal effect of X on Y, seems to give us not the causal contribution made by X = x alone to Y but rather the combined impact on Y of this contribution and whatever contribution is made to the value of Y by other causes of Y besides X. For example, in the case of the the regression equation Y = aX+U, the causal effect in Pearl's sense of X=x on Y is apparently P(Y) = ax + U, rather than, as one might expect, just ax. In part for these reasons,Woodward (1997, 2000) and Woodward and Hitchcock (forthcoming)explore a different way of characterizing the notion of an intervention which does not make reference to the relationship between the variable intervened on and its effects. For Woodward and Hitchcock, in contrast to Pearl, an intervention I on a variable X is always defined with respect to a second variable Y (the intent being to use the notion of an intervention on X with respect to Y to characterize what it is for X to cause Y). Such an intervention I must meet the following requirements (M1) - (M4):

(M1) I must be the only cause of X; i.e., as with Pearl, the intervention must completely disrupt the causal relationship between X and its previous causes so that the value of X is set entirely by I,
(M2) I must not directly cause Y via a route that does not go through X as in the placebo example,
(M3) I should not itself be caused by any cause that affects Y via a route that does not go through X, and
(M4) I leaves the values taken by any causes of Y except those that are on the directed path from I to X to Y (should this exist) unchanged.

Within this framework, the most natural way of defining the notion of causal effect is in terms of the difference made to the value of Y by a change or difference in the value of X. Focusing on differences in this way allows us to isolate the contribution made to Y by X alone from the contribution made to Y by its other causes. Moreover, since in the non-linear case, the change in the value of Y caused by a given change in the value of X will depend on the values of the other causes of Y, it seems to follow that the notion of causal effect must be relativized to a background context Bi which incorporates information about these other values. In deterministic contexts, we might thus define the causal effect on Y of a change in the value of X from X=x to X=x in circumstances Bi as:

(CD) Ydo x, Bi Ydo x, Bi  ,
that is, as the difference between the value that Y would take under an intervention that sets X=x in circumstances Bi and the value that Y would take under an intervention that sets X=x in Bi, where the notion of an intervention is now understood in terms of (M1) - (M4) rather than in the way recommended by Pearl. In non-deterministic contexts, the definition of causal effect is, analogously, Pdo x,Bi(Y) - Pdo x,Bi(Y). In the deterministic case, X will then be a cause of Y in Bi if and only if the causal effect of X on Y in Bi is non-zero for some pair of values of X - that is, if and only if there are distinct values of X, x and x such that the value of Y under an intervention that sets X=x in Bi is different from the value of Y under an intervention that sets X=x. In probablistic contexts, X will be a cause of Y if the probability distribution of Y is different for two different values of X, when these are set by interventions.

I will not attempt to adjudicate here among these and various other proposals concerning the best way to characterize the notions of intervention and causal effect. Instead, I want to comment on the general strategy they embody and to compare it with the approach to causation associated with theorists like Menzies and Price. Note first that the notion of an intervention, when understood along either of the lines described above, is an unambiguously causal notion in the sense that causal notions are required for its characterization -- thus the proposals variously speak of an intervention on X as breaking the causal connection between X and its causes while leaving other causal mechanisms intact or as not affecting Y via a causal route that does not go through X. This has the immediate consequence that one cannot use the notion of an intervention to provide a reduction of causal claims to non-causal claims. Moreover, to the extent that reliance on some notion like that of an intervention is unavoidable in any satisfactory version of a manipulability theory (as I believe that it is), any such theory must be non-reductionist. Indeed, we can now see that critics who have charged manipulability theories with circularity have in one important sense understated their case: manipulability theories turn out to be "circular" not just in the obvious sense that for an action or event I to constitute a an intervention on a variable X, there must be a causal relationship between I and X, but in the sense that I must meet a number of other causal conditions as well.

7. Is Circularity a Problem?

Suppose that we agree that any plausible version of a manipulability theory must make use of the notion of an intervention and that this must be characterized in causal terms. Does this sort of "circularity" make any such theory trivial and unilluminating? It seems to me that it does not, for at least two reasons. First, it may be, as writers like Woodward contend, that in characterizing what it is for a process I to qualify as an intervention on X for the purposes of characterizing what it is for X to cause Y, we need not make use of information about the causal relationship, if any, between X and Y. Instead, it may be that we need only to make use of other sorts of causal information, e.g., about the causal relationship between I and Y or about whether I is caused by causes that cause Y without causing X, as in (M1) - (M4) above. To the extent that this is so, we may use one set of claims about causal relationships (e.g., that X has been changed by a process that meets the conditions for an intervention) together with correlational information (that X and Y remain correlated under this change) to characterize what it is for a different relationship (the relationship between X and Y) to be causal. This does not yield a reduction of causal talk to non-causal talk, but it is also not viciously circular in the sense that it presupposes that we already have causal information about the very relationship that we are trying to characterize. One reason for thinking that there must be some way of characterizing the notion of an intervention along the lines just described is that we do sometimes learn about causal relationships by performing experiments -- and it is not easy to see how this is possible if to characterize the notion of an intervention on X we had to make reference to the causal relationship between X and its effects.

8. The Plurality of Causal Concepts

A second respect in which reliance on the notion of an intervention need not be thought of as introducing a vicious circularity is this: So far, I have been following von Wright and Menzies and Price in assuming that there is just one causal notion or locution (A causes B, where A and B are types of events) that we are trying to analyze. But in fact there are many such notions. For example, among causal notions belonging to the family of so-called type causal notions (i.e., causal claims that relate types of events or variables) there is a distinction to be drawn between what we might call claims about total or net causes and claims about direct causes. Even if the notion of an intervention presupposes some causal notion such as some notion of type causation, it may be that we can use it to characterize other causal notions.

As an illustration consider the causal structure represented by the following equations and associated directed graph

Y = aX + cZ
Z = bX

Different Causal Routes

In this structure, there are two different causal routes from X to Y -- a direct causal relationship and an indirect relationship with Z as an intermediate variable. If a = bc, there is cancellation along these two routes. This means that no intervention on X will change the value of Y. In one natural sense, this seems to mean that X does not cause Y, just as (C) (§6) suggests. In another natural sense, however, X does seem to be a cause -- indeed a direct cause- of Y. We can resolve this apparent inconsistency by distinguishing between two kinds of causal claims[2] -- the claim X is a total or net cause of Y, where this is captured by (C)or (CD), and the claim that X is a direct cause of Y, where this is understood along the following lines: X is a direct cause of Y if and only if under some intervention that changes the value of X, the value of Y changes when all other variables in the system of interest besides X and Y including those that are on some causal route from X to Y, are held fixed at some value, also by interventions. (For related, but different, characterizations of direct causation along these lines, see Pearl, 2000 and Woodward, forthcoming) Fixing the other values of other variables means that each of these values are determined by separate processes, each meeting the conditions for an intervention, that are appropriately independent of each other and of the intervention that changes the value of X. The effect of intervening to fix the values of these variables is thus that each variable intervened on is disconnected from its causes, including X. In the example under discussion, X qualifies as a direct cause of Y because if we were to fix the value of Z in a way that disconnects it from the value of X, and then intervene to change the value of X, the value of Y would change. This idea can then be generalized to provide a characterization of "contributing" causation or causation along a causal route, i.e., to capture the sense in which X is an indirect cause of Y along the route that goes through Z. (Woodward, forthcoming).

One can also use the notion of an intervention to characterize what it is for the fact or event of X's taking on some particular value to be an actual or token cause of Y's taking on a particular value (as opposed to X's being a type cause of Y) and in this way help to clarify the relationship between type and token causation. (See Pearl 2000, Hitchcock, 2001, Woodward, forthcoming). Thus even if a "manipulationist" or "interventionist" framework does not yield a reduction of causal talk to non-causal talk, it provides a natural way of marking the distinctions among a number of different causal notions and exhibiting their interrelations. More generally, even if a manipulationist account of causation does not yield a reduction but instead simply connects "causation" (or better, various more specific causal concepts) with other concepts within the same circle, we still face many non-trivial choices about how the concepts on this circle are to be elucidated and connected up with one another. For example, it is far from obvious how to characterize the notion of an intervention so as to avoid the various counterexamples to standard statements of the manipulability theory such as the theory of Menzies and Price. It is in part because the notion of manipulation/intervention has an interesting and complex fine structure-a structure that is left largely unexplored in traditional manipulability theories-that working out the connection between causation and manipulation turns out to be interesting and non-trivial rather than banal and obvious.

9. Interventions That Do Not Involve Human Action

We noted above that a free action need not meet the conditions for an intervention, on any of the conceptions of intervention described in §6. It is also true that a process or event can qualify as an intervention even if it does not involve human action or intention at any point. This should be apparent from the way in the notion of an intervention has been characterized, for this is entirely in terms of causal and correlational concepts and makes no reference to human beings or their activities. In other words, a purely "natural" process involving no animate beings at all can qualify as an intervention as long as it has the right sort of causal history -- indeed, this sort of possibility is often described by scientists as a natural experiment. Moreover, even when manipulations are carried out by human beings, it is the causal features of those manipulations and not the fact that they are carried out by human beings or are free or are attended by a special experience of agency that matters for recognizing and characterizing causal relationships. Thus, by giving up any attempt at reduction and characterizing the notion of an intervention in causal terms, an "interventionist approach of the sort described under §§5 and 6 avoids the second classical problem besetting manipulability theories -- that of anthropocentrism and commitment to a privileged status for human action. For example, under this approach X will qualify as a (total) cause of Y as long as it is true that for some value of X that if X were to be changed to that value by a process having the right sort of causal characteristics, the value of Y would change. Obviously, this claim can be true even if human beings lack the power to manipulate X or even in a world in which human beings do not or could not exist. There is nothing in the interventionist version of a manipulability theory that commits us to the view that all causal claims are in some way dependent for their truth on the existence of human beings or involve a "projection" on to the world of our experience of agency.

10. Interventions and Counterfactuals

We noted above that interventionist versions of manipulability theories are counterfactual theories. What is the relationship between such theories and more familiar versions of counterfactual theories such as the theory of David Lewis? Lewis' theory is an account of what it is for one individual token event to cause another while (C) is formulated in terms of variables or types of events , but abstracting away from this and certain other differences, there are a number of striking similarities between the two approaches. As readers of Lewis will be aware, any counterfactual theory must explain what we should envision as changed and what should be held fixed when we evaluate a counterfactual the antecedent of which is not true of the actual world -- within Lewis' framework, this is the issue of which worlds in which the antecedent of the counterfactual holds are "closest" or "most similar" to the actual world. Lewis' answer to this question invokes a "similarity" ordering that ranks the importance of various respects of resemblance between worlds in assessing overall similarity. (Lewis, 1979). For example, avoiding diverse, widespread violations of law is said to be the most important consideration, preserving perfect match of particular fact over the largest possible spatio-temporal region is next in importance and more important than avoiding small localized violations of law, and so on. As is well-known the effect of this similarity ordering is, at least in most situations, to rule out so-called "back-tracking" counterfactuals (e.g., the sort of counterfactual that is involved in reasoning that if the effect of some cause had not occurred, then the cause would not have occurred). When the antecedent of a counterfactual is not true of the actual world, Lewis' similarity metric leads us (at least in deterministic contexts) to think of that antecedent as made true by a "small" miracle.

The notion of an intervention plays a very similar role within manipulability theories of causation to Lewis' similarity ordering. Like Lewis' ordering, the characterization of an intervention tells us what should be envisioned as changed and what should be held fixed when we evaluate a counterfactual like "If X were to be changed by an intervention to such and such a value, the value of Y would change". (For example, on Pearl's understanding of an intervention, in evaluating this counterfactual, we are to consider a situation in which the previously existing causal relationship between X and its causes is disrupted, but all other causal relationships in the system of interest are left unchanged.) A moment's thought will also show that, as in Lewis' account, both Pearl's and Woodward's characterizations of interventions rule out backtracking counterfactuals -- for example, in evaluating a counterfactual of the form "if an intervention were to occur that changes E, (where E is an effect of C), then C would change", Pearl holds that we should consider a situation in which the relationship between E and its causes (in this case, C) is disrupted, but all other causal relationships are left unchanged, so that C still occurs, and the above counterfactual is false, as it should be. Moreover, there is a clear similarity between Lewis' idea that the appropriate counterfactuals for analyzing causation are counterfactuals the antecedents of which are made true by miracles, and the idea of an intervention as an exogenous change that disrupts the mechanism that was previously responsible for the cause event C. Indeed, one might think of an interventionist treatment of causation as explaining why Lewis' account with its somewhat counterintuitive similarity ordering works as well as it does -- Lewis' account works because his similarity ordering picks out roughly those relationships that are stable under interventions and hence exploitable for purposes of manipulation and control and, as a manipulability theory claims, it is just these relationships that are causal. This is not to say, however, that the two approaches always yield identical assessments of particular causal and counterfactual claims -- Hitchcock and Woodward, forthcoming and Woodward, forthcoming describe cases in which the two approaches diverge and in which the interventionist approach seems more satisfactory.[3].

11. The Scope of a Manipulability Theory

In the version of a manipulability theory considered under §6 above, causal claims are elucidated in terms of counterfactuals about what would happen under interventions. As we have seen, the notion of an intervention should be understood without reference to human action, and this permits formulation of a manipulability theory that applies to causal claims in situations in which manipulation by human beings is not a practical possibility. Moreover, the counterfactual formulation allows us to make sense of causal claims in contexts in which interventions do not in fact occur and arguably even in cases in which they are causally impossible, as long as we have some principled basis for answers to questions about what would happen to the value of some variable if an intervention were to occur on another variable. Consider, for example, the (presumably true) causal claim (G):

(G)   The gravitational attraction of the moon causes the motion of the tidest.
Human beings cannot at present alter the attractive force exerted by the moon on the tides (e.g., by altering its orbit). More interestingly, it may well be that there is no physically possible process that will meet the conditions for an intervention on the moon's position with respect to the tides -- all possible processes that would alter the gravitational force exerted by the moon may be insufficiently "surgical". For example, it may very well be that any possible process that alters the position of the moon by altering the position of some other massive object will have an independent impact on the tides in violation of condition (M2) for an intervention. It is nonetheless arguable we have a principled basis in Newtonian mechanics and gravitational theory themselves for answering questions about what would happen if such a surgical intervention were to occur and that this is enough to vindicate the causal claim (G).

Although a properly formulated version of a manipulability theory will thus allow us to talk about causal relationships in some contexts in which interventions are not physically possible, there are plausible arguments that such theories do place some restrictions on which relationships qualify as causal. I conclude by considering several cases of this sort, which will also serve to bring out an additional distinctive feature of manipulability theories.

12. (Alleged) Causes That Are Unmanipulable for Logical, Conceptual, or Metaphysical Reasons

Several statisticians (e.g., Holland, 1986, Rubin, 1986) who advocate manipulationist or counterfactual accounts of causation have held that causal claims involving causes that are unmanipulable in principle are defective or lack a clear meaning -- they think of this conclusion as following directly from a manipulationist approach to causation. What is meant by an unmanipulable cause is not made very clear, but the examples discussed typically involve alleged causes (e.g., race, or membership in a particular species, or perhaps gender) for which we lack any clear conception of what would be involved in manipulating them or any basis for assessing what would happen under such a manipulation. Such cases contrast with the case involving (G) above, where the notion of manipulating the moon's orbit seems perfectly clear and well-defined, and the problem is simply that the world happens to be arranged in such a way that an intervention that produces such a change is not physically possible.

A sympathetic reconstruction of the position under discussion might go as follows. On a manipulationist account of causation, causes (whether we think of them as events, types of events, properties, facts, or what have you) must be representable by means of variables -- where this means, at a minimum, that it must be possible for the cause to change or to assume different values. This is required if we are to have a well-defined notion of manipulating a cause and well-defined answers to counterfactual queries about what would happen if the cause were to be manipulated in some way -- matters which are central to what causal claims mean on any version of a manipulability theory worthy of the name. Philosophers tend to think of causes as properties or events but in many cases, it is straightforward to move back and forth between such talk and a representation in terms of variables, as we have been doing throughout this entry. For example, rather than saying that the impact of the baseball caused the window to shatter or that impacts of baseballs cause window shatterings, we may introduce two indicator variables -- I which takes the values 0 and 1 for {no impact, impact} and S which takes the values 0 and 1 for {no shattering, shattering} and use these variables to express the idea that whether or not the window shatters is counterfactually dependent on (interventions that determine) whether the impact occurs. Both I and S describe causes that are straightforwardly manipulable. However, for some putative causes, there may be no well-defined notion of change or variation in value and if so, a manipulability theory will not count these as genuine causes. For example, if it is metaphysically necessary that everything that exists is a physical object or if we lack any coherent conception of what it is for something to exist but to be non-physical, then there will be no well-defined notion of intervening to change whether something is a physical object. While there are true ( and even lawful) generalizations about all physical objects, on a manipulability theory these will not describe causal relationships. Thus, although to the best of our knowledge, it is a law of nature that (L) no physical object can be accelerated from a velocity less than that of light to a velocity greater than light, (L) is not, according to a manipuability theory, a causal generalization.

Moreover, even with respect to variables that can take more than one value, the notion of an intervention or manipulation will not be well-defined if there is no well-defined notion of changing the values of that variable. Suppose that we introduce a variable "animal" which takes the values {lizard, kitten, raven}. By construction, this variable has more than one value, but if, as seems plausible, we have no coherent idea of what it is to change a raven into lizard or kitten, there will be no well-defined notion of an intervention for this variable and being an animal (or being a raven) will not be the sort of thing that can count as a bona-fide cause on a manipulability theory. The notion of changing the value of a variable seems to involve the idea of an alteration from one value of the variable to another in circumstances in which the very same system or entity can possess both values and this notion seems inapplicable to the case under discussion.

Some readers will take it to be intuitively obvious that being a raven can be a cause, e.g., of some particular organism's being black. Many standard theories of causation also endorse this conclusion, for example, if we are willing to assume it is a law that all ravens are black, then nomological theories of causation will support the claim (R):

(R)   Ravenness causes blackness.
Similarly, ravenness raises the probability of blackness and hence (R) qualifies as causal on probabilistic theories of causation, and depending on how the relevant similarity ordering is understood, (R) may also qualify as causal on a Lewis style counterfactual theory. If causal claims like (R) are true, it is an important inadequacy in manipulability theories that they seem unable to capture such claims. By contrast, others will think that claims like (R) are, if not false, at least unclear and unperspicuous, and that it is a point in favor of manipulability theories that they explain why this is the case. Those who take this second view will think that claims like (R) should be replaced by claims that involve causes that are straightforwardly manipulable. For example, (R) might be replaced by a claim that identified the genetic factors and biochemical pathways that are responsible for raven pigmentation -- factors and pathways for which there is a well-defined notion of manipulation and which are such that if they were appropriately manipulated, this would lead to changes in pigmentation. Manipulability theorists like Rubin and Holland will think that such a replacement would be clearer and more perspicuous than the original claim (R). In any case, claims involving causes that are unmanipulable in the sense that we seem to lack any clear conception of what would be involved in manipulating them are one important sort of case in which a manipulability approach will diverge from many other standard theories of causation.

Consider an additional illustration of this general theme. Holland (1986) appeals to a manipulability theory of causation to argue that the following claim is fundamentally unclear.

(F) Being female causes one to be discriminated against in hiring and/or salary
In contrast to the previous cases, the problem here is not so much that under all interpretations of the putative cause ("being female") we lack any clear idea of what it would be like to manipulate it, but rather that there are several rather different things that might be meant by manipulation of "being female" (which from the perspective of a manipulability theory is to say that there several quite different variables we might have in mind when we talk about being female as a cause ) and the consequences for discrimination of manipulating each of these may be quite different. For example, (F) might be interpreted as claiming that a literal manipulation of gender, as in a sex change operation, that leaves an applicant's qualifications otherwise unchanged, will change expected salary or probability of hiring. Alternatively, and more plausibly, (F) might be interpreted as claiming that manipulation of a potential employer's beliefs about applicant's gender will change salary and hiring probability, in which case (F) would be more perspicuously expressed as the claim that employer beliefs about gender cause discrimination. Still another possible interpretation -- in fact what Holland claims one ought to mean by (F) -- is that differentials in salary and hiring between men and women would disappear (or at least be reduced substantially) under a regime in which various sorts of biased practices were effectively eliminated, presumably as the result of changes in law and custom. While I see no reason to follow Holland in thinking that this is the only legitimate interpretation of (F), it is plainly a legitimate interpretation. Moreover, Holland is also correct to think that this last hypothetical experiment which involves manipulating the legal and cultural framework in which discrimination takes place is a quite different experiment from an experiment involving manipulating gender itself or employee beliefs about gender and that each of these experiments is likely to lead to different outcomes. From the perspective of a manipulability theory, these different experiments thus correspond to different causal claims. As this example illustrates, part of the heuristic usefulness of a manipulability theory is that encourages us to clarify or disambiguate causal claims by explicitly distinguishing among different possible claims about the outcomes of hypothetical experiments that might be associated with them. That we can clarify the meaning of a causal claim in this way is just what we would expect if a manipulability account of causation is correct.


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causation: causal processes | causation: counterfactual theories of | causation: probabilistic