Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Bernard Bolzano

The Principles of Equality and Liberty in Bolzano's Philosophy of State

In his “booklet” On the Best State (Bolzano 1932), Bolzano describes how the best state looks and therefore also how the currently existing states should be arranged. The booklet is divided into 28 chapters in which the following topics are treated: 1. the citizens of the state, its size and its divisions; 2. legislation; 3. government; 4. compulsory institutions; 5. liberty; 6. equality; 7. freedom of thought and of religion; 8. education and instruction; 9. care for health and for life; 10. property; 11. money; 12. occupations and life styles; 13. productive activities; 14. trade; 15. scholars; 16. books and censorship; 17. fine arts; 18. nourishment; 19. clothing; 20. housing; 21. gender specific institutions; 22. satisfaction of the pursuit for honor; 23. travels; 24. enjoyments; 25. disputes among citizens; 26. taxes and state expenditures; 27. rewards and punishments; 28. death.

A mere comparison of the chapters in terms of their size is revealing: The longest chapter by far is the tenth, concerning property, followed by the chapter on taxes and state expenditures and the chapter on rewards and punishments. From this it is clear that the unequal division of possessions was Bolzano's greatest concern; it was for him the main root of evil, which was to be removed by means of a just redistribution. Bolzano, however, does not rush in with suggestions for redistribution, but rather carefully prepares them.

First of all, he expounds on how his best state is divided up into smaller societies — primarily into countries — or built up from them. The countries again consist in an association of districts, these in an association of communities, which are for their part composed of families as the smallest unities of community in a state. The association of smaller to larger societies is justified by Bolzano through considerations of solidarity: The larger community serves for making the arrangements which smaller communities cannot afford and for dividing up risks. Bolzano also takes into consideration a “general union among all states” or even a global state in which all of mankind is joined together (Bolzano 1932, 11 ff., 22).

In the legislation in the best state all mature citizens have an equal right to vote. Here Bolzano requires that people who are affected by a decision and “cannot vote, perhaps because they are not present or are yet to be born” be represented by other persons (Bolzano 1932, 15). Bolzano thereby explicitly brings into play the requirement that in political decisions also the interests of future generations are to be considered and preserved in the framework of representative responsibility.

Quite interesting but rather difficult to appreciate as democratic is Bolzano's provision for a counsel of sages in his best state; Bolzano himself speaks of a “Rat der Geprüften”, i.e., — literally — a “counsel of the tested ones”. When unanimous (or when there is a 9 : 1 majority), it is given the privilege of veto against majority decisions and a positive right to make decisions in opposition to the majority vote in other cases (Bolzano 1932, 17 f.). The appointment of the government, however, is regulated in Bolzano's best state more democratically than in most modern democracies: The members of the government are elected every year or at least every second or third year anew whereby re-election is possible.

All Bolzano has to say regarding the principles of freedom and equality — as little as it is — is determined by his highest moral law. Even in the best state, there cannot be liberty without any restrictions, for by entering into society we voluntarily forgo certain liberties and decide to accept the principle that, with respect to various issues, it is the will of the majority and not our own will which is the focus in society. Moreover, according to Bolzano, there cannot be total equality of rights and duties — not even in the best state. The question is only how the restrictions on liberty and equality are regulated in the best state. As far as the limitations of the principle of equality are concerned, Bolzano gives a clear guideline: rights and duties, according to Bolzano, must be in line with needs and abilities. The state may therefore allow for only those inequalities in rights and duties which are justifiable with reference to differences in needs and abilities. (Considerations of this kind are also well-known from discussions on equality and justice within contemporary normative ethics; cf., e.g., Frankena 1973, 48 ff.) Nothing enraged Bolzano and his contemporaries more than the many unjust inequalities in rights and duties among the citizens in the various states of the time (Bolzano 1932, 34 f.). Bolzano especially fought against inequalities that are based on an unjust distribution of possessions or on privileges and discriminatory practices due to descent: “To no citizen is a privilege to be granted nor should any citizen be required to bear a peculiar burden simply due to the circumstance of his descent from certain parents” (Bolzano 1932, 39). Bolzano thus requires the abolition of all inherited privileges and disadvantages of inheritance. He does not in principle reject differences in the possessions of citizens, unless they diverge to the extreme from equal distribution (e.g. a hundredfold). There must be at least a certain equality in the possessions of the citizens in the best state; it can be brought about by redistribution — though not all at once, but rather gradually from one generation to the next (Bolzano 1932, 36–39).

From his principle of equality Bolzano derived a number of concrete requirements which sound plausible and very progressive for his time. These include the requirements of a doctor and a hospital for every community and of the state's payment of all expenses for doctor, medicines, and care (Bolzano 1932, 54, 114 f.), the state's payment of all expenses for the providing and educating all children (Bolzano 1932, 101, 113), for equal wages, especially also for heavy labor (Bolzano 1932, 80, 103 f.), for equal distribution of profit, for according equal legal status to illegitimate children (Bolzano 1932, 101), etc.

Bringing about a certain equality regarding the rights and duties of citizens is an important concern for Bolzano. How little Bolzano cares for the principle of liberty, however, becomes manifest already by the fact that the chapter on liberty is the second shortest chapter in his booklet (the shortest being the one on travelling). Liberty is fully subordinated by him to his highest moral law: The limitation of personal liberty, according to Bolzano, is permissible always when (though certainly only when) the general welfare is advanced more than it is harmed thereby. In this way Bolzano gives the state all kinds of means of limiting personal freedom in every conceivable manner. Some of these limitations, which are partly bizarre from the present perspective, even met with Bolzano's approval. Here it will be merciful for us to disregard Bolzano's rather amusing prescriptions for clothing (Bolzano 1932, 106 f.). One might also have a certain understanding for Bolzano's recommended ban against certain pleasures, such as consumption of liquor, smoking, the use of snuff, hunting as a sport as well as gambling (Bolzano 1932, 106 f.). On the basis of Bolzano's own biography it is, however, hard to understand that there is in his best state a special board of censors (even if it is bound to strict rules), and that repeated offenders can be removed from teaching positions for spreading doctrines “which seem false and dangerous to the government of the state” (Bolzano 1932, 88 f.). Today we certainly lack all understanding for Bolzano's list of professions that require state approval or must even be forbidden: Professional practice of scientific and artistic activities is permissible only with state approval and confined within temporal restrictions; poetry, music, dance, and acting, as well as the occupation of scholars, are even forbidden as life vocations (Bolzano 1932, 77 f., 87 f., 94. f.).

The indicated examples make clear that the constitution of Bolzano's best state is made up of a very ambivalent mixture of regulations which make an impression of being very progressive with respect to the desired equality for the citizens, but extremely objectionable with respect to the liberties conceded to them. (For an evaluation of these regulations from a modern perspective cf. George & Rusnock 2006, 286–289.) The hot-cold treatment to which we are exposed when facing these regulations reaches a high point as soon as we consider punishments that Bolzano provides in his best state (Bolzano 1932, 126–129). He first elucidates the different goals which are connected with carrying out punishment (as distinct from the mere threat of punishment) and even explicitly favors carrying out punishment in a humane manner; thus he rejects, for example, unnecessary aggravation in the case of labor in prison (“such as attaching irons to the feet, etc.”), initiating torture in order to force confessions, and also the sentence of life. On the other hand, he allows for corporeal punishment (especially for children or very rough persons), “exhibition on stage” for the sake of “public humiliation” and even the use of the death penalty; it is merely cold comfort to learn that the death penalty should be laid down “only for premeditated murder” and should “never be carried out before the eyes of the people” (Bolzano 1932, 128).

In On the Best State, Bolzano advocated certain political views which can be characterized as socialistic; thus he was called a “socialist” (cf. Smetana 1849, 52 f.) and even accused of “communism” (Wisshaupt 1850, 45 f.). Such a reproach, aimed at a Catholic clergyman of his time, comes across not only as surprising, but as downright shocking. Bolzano himself, however, conceded that his concepts are in a certain sense communistic (Bolzano 1965, 365). Especially his conception of property is repeatedly mentioned in this connection. As already mentioned, the longest chapter by far in On the Best State is reserved for the topic of property (Bolzano 1932, 55–73). This certainly indicates the importance that Bolzano attributed to this issue. Bolzano's views concerning property make especially clear how many personal liberties he was willing to forgo in favor of equality of the citizens and the general welfare. According to Bolzano, it is the state's responsibility to determine the circumstances under which a thing can become and remain our property. In the business of granting property rights, the state has to comply with the following principle: An object may be declared to be the property of a certain person iff it is more conducive to the welfare of the whole to grant to this person property rights than it is to refuse them to him. This view of property has serious consequences on Bolzano's view of inheritance rights: In the best state, children are no longer regarded as the rightful heirs of property that was in the possession of their parents, but rather only the state must see and conduct itself as its heir (Bolzano 1932, 63 f.; cf. also Bolzano 1849a, 135 f.).

From these few examples it can be clearly seen what political explosiveness there was in Bolzano's views. Bolzano was fully aware of the fact that such views will evoke or at least intensify the discontent and the revolutionary spirit in the population. A revolution, however, was for Bolzano a “red flag”. He was dismayed at the atrocities that resulted as consequences of the French Revolution and at the unhappiness that fell upon many people due to this revolution. (Marian Mika, who had a great influence on Bolzano with regard to religious questions as pointed out in section 1, had published in 1794 and 1797 two volumes with sermons in which he warned against dangers and condemned misfortunes caused by the French Revolution.) From fear of such consequences, Bolzano rejected revolution of every kind and wanted to avoid everything that might lead to a radical overthrow or even only prepared the way for this. Instead, he was in favor of gradual and peaceful implementation of necessary reforms (Bolzano 1932, IV). For this reason, Bolzano did not want his manuscript On the Best State to be published in his lifetime, but only when the time for it was ripe. A first draft of the work was already sketched around the year 1810 (Hoffmann 1850, 10), and the manuscript was completed at least in a preliminary version around the year 1831. (On the question of dating the manuscript, cf. Arnold Kowalewski in his introduction to Bolzano 1932, XXII–XXVI.) The booklet circulated subsequently during Bolzano's lifetime only in form of the manuscript and copies of it. It appeared in print for the first time hundred years later, namely in 1932; due to a lack of communication among Bolzano scholars at that time, there was already in the following year, independently of the first edition of this manuscript, a second one (Bolzano 1933).