## Notes to Actualism

1. Some good sources for actualism are the following: Adams [1974], Plantinga [1976], Kaplan [1975], Loux [1979], and Tomberlin and van Inwagen [1985].2. We assume here that, as with all natural kinds, being an Alien is an essential property of anything that has it.

3.
A potential
actualist move is worth addressing here. One might argue that, in fact,
there is a straightforward actualist account of the possibility of
Aliens. A widely-accepted contemporary metaphysical belief is that, for
every set of objects, there exists the mereological sum consisting of
exactly those objects. Given this, assuming that Aliens are composed of
the same basic atomic stuff that we are, there are surely actual
merological sums of atoms that are possible Aliens, i.e., that
*could* have been Aliens if only they'd been properly arranged.
Hence, there is no need to postulate possibilia to provide a semantics
for claims like ‘It is possible that there are Aliens’.
However, this objection misses the point. The general intuition that we
are attempting to isolate with the Alien example is that

(*)There could have been things other than the things that actually exist.

All that the actualist move just noted succeeds in showing is that
perhaps the Alien example doesn't entail (*). But it does not succeed
in accounting for the intuition that (*) is true. For suppose we accept
the proposed mereological gambit, i.e., that certain mereological sums
of actual atoms could have been Aliens, or instances of any other
uninstantiated natural kind. Is it not still the case that there could
have been *different atoms* (or quarks or whatever basic
building blocks you choose) than there are in fact? Indeed, is it not
logically possible that the universe could have been composed of
entirely different stuff altogether? If so, then the actualist still
needs to account for (*).

It should also be noted that the mereological gambit itself is
dubious. Its basic premise -- that any collection of atoms constitutes
a further physical object -- is far from uncontroversial. More
seriously, it seems quite clear that no instance of a physical natural
kind *is* identical with any given mereological sum of atoms,
as physical bodies are constituted by many different sums of atoms
across time as those bodies change. Perhaps, however, the actualist
could come up with some more sophisticated mereological construct C to
avoid this objection. Still, it seems, there are problems. For
intuitively, it seems that the same C, structured one way, could have
been an instance of one kind, and structured another, could have been
an instance of a different kind. But then it seems to follow from the
"modal transitivity" of identity (i.e., the principle:
∀*x*□∀*y*(*y*=*x*
→ □∀*z*(*x*=*z* →
*y*=*z*))) that if a member of a natural kind is
literally identical with a C, then it is possible that an instance of
a given kind could have been an instance of a very different kind. But
this conflicts with strong intuitions about the essentiality of kind
membership. So even if the actualist's hypothetical construct C were
plausible, rather than taking Cs to be actualist surrogates for
possible Aliens (or whatever), it would be at least equally reasonable
to claim that certain Cs are only possibly *co-located* with,
or possibly *constitutive of*, but not possibly identical with,
an Alien. For, in that case, all that follows is that the same C might
have been co-located with (or constitutive of) instances of very
different natural kinds, and intuitions about the essentiality of kind
membership are preserved.

4.
Unfortunately,
for reasons rooted ultimately in the monumental work of Gödel
[1931], a first-order logic cannot provide a completely
*decidable* mechanism for determining validity. More exactly,
while it is true that, if a formula is valid, one can eventually find a
proof of it in the logic, there is in general no proof theoretic way to
determine that a formula is *invalid*.

5. Adams [1974], p. 204. This account of world stories is significantly more accessible than the later account in Adams [1981]. The added subtleties of the later account appear to be motivated by Adams’ desire for a notion of world story that yields a robust, strong actualist semantics for statements about possible nonexistence. However, for the purposes of the present article, these subtleties add unnecessary complexity, as I believe that the 1981 account ultimately falls prey to essentially the same objections that are raised here against the earlier account.

6. McMichael does not actually use the idea of inclusion relative to an argument place. Rather, I have introduced it to simplify the presentation of the theory. It is an equivalent mechanism and so has no impact on the theory's content. McMichael's own account relies on an elegant, but conceptually more challenging permutation mechanism that shuffles argument places in relations.

7.
For the sake of
simplicity, we ignore temporal qualifications in these examples that
would be needed in a fully accurate account, e.g., **being
condemned to death as an adult**.

8. As indicated, order matters in our representation of relations: the binary role that Boswell bears to Johnson is distinct from the binary role that Johnson bears to Boswell, the latter, of course, being the converse of the former.

9. Things are a bit more subtle than this, for to have an intended* model, one also needs to do a little more to reflect the modal facts expressed by means of iterated modalities. See Menzel (1990) for details.