# Actualism

*First published Sat Jun 17, 2000; substantive revision Fri Jan 4, 2008*

To understand the thesis of actualism, consider the following
example.
Imagine
a race of beings
— call them ‘Aliens’ — that is very different
from any life-form that exists anywhere in the universe; different
enough, in fact, that no actually existing thing could have been an
Alien, any more than a given gorilla could have been a fruitfly. Now,
even though there are no Aliens, it seems intuitively the case that
there *could* have been such things. After all, life could have
evolved very differently than the way it did in fact —
differently enough, at least, that other, very different kinds of
things might have existed. So in virtue of what is it true that there
could have been Aliens when in fact there are none, and when, moreover,
nothing that actually exists could have been an Alien?

To answer this question, a philosopher should try to identify the
special features of the world that are responsible for the truth of
claims about what could have been the case. One group of philosophers,
the *possibilists*, offers the following answer: ‘It is
possible that there are Aliens’ is true because there are in fact
individuals that could have been Aliens. At first blush, this might
appear directly to contradict the premise that no actually existing
thing could possibly have been an Alien. The possibilist's thesis,
however, is that *actual* existence encompasses only a subset of
the things that, in the broadest sense, *are*. Rather, in
addition to things like us that actually exist, there are *merely
possible* things — possible Aliens, for example — that
*could* be actual, but, as it happens are not. So there
*are* such things, but they just happen to exhibit a rather less
robust but nonetheless fully-fledged type of being than we do. For the
possibilist, then, ‘It is possible that there are Aliens’
is true simply in virtue of the fact that there are
possible-but-nonactual Aliens, i.e., things that are not actual but
which could have been, and such that, moreover, if they had been
actual, they would have been Aliens.

Actualists reject this answer; they deny that there are any
nonactual individuals. Actualism is the philosophical position that
everything there is — everything that can be said to exist in any
sense — is *actual*. Put another way, actualism denies
that there is any kind of being beyond actuality; to be is to be
actual. Actualism therefore stands in stark contrast to possibilism,
which, as we've seen, takes the things there are to include possible
but non-actual objects.

Of course, actualists will agree that there could have been Aliens. Actualism, therefore, can be thought of as the metaphysical theory that attempts to account for the truth of claims like ‘It is possible that there are Aliens’ without appealing to any nonactual objects whatsoever. What makes actualism so philosophically interesting, is that there is no obviously correct way to account for the truth of claims like ‘It is possible that there are Aliens’ without appealing to possible but nonactual objects. In the rest of this article, we will lay out the various attempts to do so in some detail and assess their effectiveness.

- 1. The Possibilist Challenge to Actualism
- 2. The Simplest Quantified Modal Logic (SQML)
- 3. Kripke's System
- 4. Is Kripke's System Actualist?
- 5. Actualist Responses to the Possibilist Challenge
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. The Possibilist Challenge to Actualism

The fundamental thesis of actualism
is:^{[1]}

(A) Everything that exists (i.e., everything there is) is actual.

Possibilism is the denial of this thesis and there are various forms of possibilism that correspond to the various ways in which one can deny Thesis (A). (This is explained in more detail in the supplementary document: Three Types of Possibilism.)

*The possibilist challenge* to actualism is to give an
analysis of our ordinary modal beliefs which is consistent with Thesis
(A), i.e., which doesn't appeal to possible but nonactual objects.
There are two central aspects to the possibilist challenge: the
challenge of possible worlds, and the challenge of possible objects.
The latter will be the central focus of this article, but, for the sake
of completeness, we begin with a brief discussion of the former.

### 1.1 Worlds

Claims such as ‘it is possible that there are Aliens’,
‘it is possible that there is a planet disturbing the orbit of
planet X’, and ‘it is necessary that everything is
self-identical’ are known as *modal* claims, because the
sentential prefixes ‘it is possible that’ and ‘it is
necessary that’ indicate a ‘mode’ in which the
statements they precede are true. Modal claims are ubiquitous in our
thought and discourse. Many of our reflective and creative thoughts
seem to be about possibilities (consider, for example, the possibility
that there are clean, fuel-efficient automobiles that cause no harm to
the environment) and much of our logical reasoning involves drawing
conclusions which, in some sense, necessarily follow from premises that
we already believe. Modal logic is the logic of possibility and
necessity and the study of modal logic, as a discipline, has flourished
in the latter half of the twentieth century. This was due in no small
part to the introduction of the concept of *possible worlds* to
investigate the truth conditions of modal claims. A large part of the
logic of possibility and necessity seems to be captured by treating the
modal operators ‘it is necessary that’ and ‘it is
possible that’ as quantifiers over possible worlds. That is, the
following semantic analyses seem to capture a large part of the logic
of modality:

(a) The statement ‘It is necessary that

p’ (‘□p’) is true just in casepis true in all possible worlds.(b) The statement ‘It is possible that

p’ (‘◊p’) is true just in casepis true in some possible world.

Notice that it is a consequence of analysis (b) that true claims asserting a possibility imply the existence of possible worlds.

On the face of it, then, the possible worlds analysis of basic modal statements just sketched appears to entail the existence of nonactual possible worlds, and hence appears directly to contradict Thesis (A). Consequently, actualists either have to try to develop a semantics for modal statements in terms that do not entail the existence of nonactual possible worlds, or at least to provide an account of possible worlds on which this consequence is rendered metaphysically innocuous.

The power of the possible worlds semantics — and the distinct
lack of any persuasive alternatives — is very attractive to many
actualists, and they are loathe to give it up (so long, of course, as
they do not have to abandon actualism). Consequently, actualists
typically grasp the second horn of the above dilemma and adopt some
sort of actualistically acceptable, "sanitized" version of this theory
on which possible worlds are conceived as theoretical *abstract*
objects which actually exist. Many such theories of
abstractly-conceived worlds have been developed, some with better
success than others (see, for example, Plantinga [1974] and [1976],
Chisholm [1976], Fine [1977], Adams, [1974], van Inwagen [1986], or
Zalta [1983] and [1993]). Some take worlds to be maximal possible
states of affairs, others take them to be maximal possible properties
or propositions, still others treat them as maximal consistent sets of
some sort, and yet others treat them as part of a more general theory
of abstract objects. For purposes here, it will serve well enough just
to assume some generic version of this view on which such abstractly
conceived worlds can perform their theoretical tasks in virtue of
certain actualistically unobjectionable modal properties. A detailed
version of such an account, and some of its philosophical
ramifications, can be found in the supplementary document on
An Account of Abstract Possible Worlds.

### 1.2 Mere *Possibilia*

The second step in the actualist analysis of modality is to find a
way to do without possible but nonactual individuals or, at least, a
way to replace them with less objectionable entities like properties of
some ilk. Possible but nonactual individuals — also known as
*mere possibilia* or *contingently nonactual* individuals
— seem to be required for the analysis of modal claims involving
quantifiers such as ‘there is’ or ‘there
exists’. Consider, first, a non-modal quantifier claim, such as
‘There are Aliens’. Such a claim might be regimented in
first-order logic as "There exists an *x* such that *x*
is an Alien", or in formal terms (in which ‘*Ax*’
abbreviates the predicate ‘*x* is an Alien’):
∃*xAx*.

Now consider the modal claim ‘There could have been
Aliens’. It is natural to regiment this claim as "It is possible
that there exists an *x* such that *x* is an Alien",
which is typically formalized as follows:

(1) ◊∃ xAx.

Now, if we deploy some acceptable theory of possible worlds, we know that sentence (1) is true if and only if:

(2) There exists a possible world wand there exists an individualxsuch thatxis an Alien atw.

But, it is a fact about the logic of the quantifier ‘there exists’ that such quantifiers ‘commute’ with one another. In other words, (2) implies (3):

(3) There exists an individual xand there exists a possible worldwsuch thatxis an Alien atw.

So the truth conditions of (1) imply (3). But if (3) is true, then so is the ordinary modal claim ‘Something is possibly an Alien’, i.e.,

(4) ∃ x◊Ax

for which (3) provides the truth conditions. Thus, given the simplest logic concerning modal and quantifier claims, (1) implies (4). In other words, the simplest quantified modal logic tells us that (5) implies (6):

(5) It is possible that there exists an xsuch thatxis an Alien.(6) There exists an xsuch that it is possible thatxis an Alien.

The problem for the second step of the actualist treatment of
modality may now be stated more precisely, namely, Thesis (A) is
inconsistent with (6). Thesis (A) asserts that everything actually
exists. But (6) seems to assert the existence of a possible Alien.
There seem to be no candidates among the actually existing individuals
which we might plausibly identify as a possible
Alien.^{[2]}
Thus, the
consequences of our ordinary modal beliefs that are valid according to
the simplest quantified modal logic seems to be inconsistent with
actualism.^{[3]}

Since it seems reasonable to want to hang on to such ordinary modal beliefs as (5), there is an apparent incompatibility between the simplest quantified modal logic and actualism. This is only the tip of the iceberg, however, for the problem described in the previous paragraph resurfaces each time we ‘nest’ or ‘iterate’ modalities. Consider, for example, the following sentences:

(7) The Pope (i.e., Karol Wojtyla) could have had a son who could have become a priest. (8) There could be a planet disturbing the orbit of Pluto and it could have a period of nyears.

Such sentences seems to be representable as follows:

(9) ◊∃ x(Sxp& ◊Px)(10) ◊∃ x(Lx&Dxp& ◊Pxn)

These cases pose a serious problem for any actualist metaphysics.
Even if we assume that actualists can successfully develop a
metaphysics and logic that explain the truth of the first occurrence of
‘could’ in (7) and (8), respectively, a serious question
arises concerning the second occurrence. The simplest logic of the
second occurrence of the "nested" modal operator in (9) and (10) would
suggest that it describes a modal fact about a possible individual
— a possible son of the pope in (9), and a possible planet
disturbing the orbit of Pluto in (10). (9) seems to assert that a
possible son of the pope has the modal property of *possibly
becoming a priest*. (10) seems to assert that the possible planet
disturbing Pluto has the modal property *possibly having a period of
n years* (for some *n*). These cases of ‘nested’
modalities and the problems they pose for actualism were first
discussed in a forceful way in McMichael [1983b]. We will return to this
issue at several points below.

### 1.3 Where We Go From Here

As the reader who works through the remainder of this essay will discover, the simplest quantified modal logic has numerous consequences that seem incompatible in some way or another with actualism. In the next section, we will discover still other such consequences. Though we have succeeded in describing the issues surrounding actualism in more precise terms, we have only scratched the surface of the debate. Much of the debate turns on the precise characteristics of the modal logic being proposed as a logic for actualism. This debate can only be understood if one can contrast the characteristics of these proposed alternative logics with the characteristics of the simplest modal logic. Thus, we will spend the next section of this essay describing the characteristics of the simplest modal logic. Only then will we be in a position to evaluate the more complicated alternatives developed by actualists in the attempt to avoid commitment to nonactual possibles. For example, it is important to see just how Kripke's modal logic (Kripke [1963]) employs a variety of special techniques that yield a logic consistent with Thesis (A) (these will be documented below).

The remaining sections of this essay, therefore, contain the following material. In Section 2, we describe, in a precise way, both the characteristics of the simplest quantified modal logic and its controversial theorems. (As we acquire more sophisticated logical tools, we will revisit some of the examples already discussed; the redescription of these examples in more sophisticated logical terms may prove to be instructive.) We also show why each of the controversial theorems is objectionable from the standpoint of actualism. In Section 3, we outline a modal system developed by Saul Kripke that appears to be consistent with Thesis (A). However, in Section 4, we'll discover that Kripke's system introduces special problems of its own. Finally, in Section 5, we discuss the various attempts actualists have made to work within a Kripke-style framework to solve these problems and to find a metaphysical theory of necessity and possibility which is consistent with Thesis (A). However, we will also examine the attempts of some actualists who have recently discovered a new interpretation of the simplest quantified modal logic which is consistent with Thesis (A).

## 2. The Simplest Quantified Modal Logic

A first-order quantified modal logic is a group of logical axioms
and rules of inference that systematizes the logically true sentences
of a standard first-order modal language with identity
(**L**) relative to some class of interpretations of this
language. The language **L** is defined just like the
language of the predicate calculus with identity, but with the
following additional clause in the definition of a
‘formula’: whenever φ is a formula, so is □φ.
Thus, the language will have constants and variables for individuals,
*n*-place predicates, atomic formulas such as
‘*P ^{n}a*

_{1}…

*a*’ and ‘

_{n}*x*=

*y*’, and the usual molecular, quantified and modal formulas involving the logical notions expressed by ‘¬’ (the negation symbol), ‘→’ (the symbol for forming conditionals), ‘∀’ (the universal quantifier), and ‘□’ (the modal operator). The other logical connectives, such as ‘&’ (and), ‘’ (or), and ‘≡’ (iff), and the ‘existential’ quantifier ‘∃’, are all defined in the usual way. The formula ◊φ is defined as ¬□¬φ. (To assert that φ is possibly true is to say that φ is not necessarily false.) From this definition, the equivalence of □φ and ¬◊¬φ also follows. For convenience, a complete specification is provided in the supplementary document A First-order, Quantified Modal Language. It would serve well to spend a moment or two examining these definitions to making sure that you understand the kinds of statements that are expressible in this language.

The simplest semantics for the
language **L** defines a class of interpretations having
two distinguishing features: (1) each interpretation
**I** in the class has just two, mutually exclusive
domains--a nonempty domain of possible worlds (which includes a
distinguished "actual world" **w _{0}**) and a
nonempty domain of individuals, and (2) given any individuals

**i**

_{1},…,

**i**

_{n}in the domain and given any possible world

**w**, each interpretation

**I**specifies, for each

*n*-place predicate ‘

*R*’, whether ‘

*R*’ applies to

**i**

_{1},…,

**i**

_{n}at

**w**or not. Given that specification, the semantics then defines truth conditions for every formula of the language. The definition of truth even accommodates ‘open formulas’ (i.e., formulas with free variables) by appealing to assignment functions

**f**which assign to each variable

*x*some member

**f**(

*x*) of the domain of individuals. Moreover, given any interpretation

**I**and assignment function

**f**to the variables, a denotation function

**d**relative

**I**and

**f**is defined for the terms (constants and variables) of the language. When τ is a constant,

**d**

_{I}_{,f}(τ) is the individual in the domain that

**I**assigns to τ. When τ is a variable,

**d**

_{I}_{,f}(τ) is

**f**(τ).

The semantic notion ‘φ is true (under interpretation
**I** and assignment **f**) at world
**w**’
(‘true_{I,f} at
**w**’) is then defined recursively for all of the
formulas of the language. The three mosts important parts of this
definition for quantified modal logic are the clauses for atomic,
quantified, and modal formulas. Here are examples of each:

- The open, atomic formula ‘
*Px*’ is true_{I,f}at**w**just in case**I**specifies that ‘*P*’ applies to**d**_{I}_{,f}(*x*) at**w**. - The quantified formula ‘∀
*xPx’*is true_{I,f}at**w**just in case, for all individuals**a**, ‘*Px’*is true_{I,f[x,a]}at**w**, where**f**[*x*,**a**] is**f**if**f**(*x*) =**a**, and otherwise is just like**f**except that it assigns**a**to*x*instead of**f**(*x*). (A little less formally, ‘∀*xPx’*is true_{I,f}at**w**just in case, for all individuals**a**, the predicate ‘*P*’ applies to**a**at**w**.) - The open, modal formula ‘□
*Px*’ is true_{I,f}at**w**just in case for every possible world**w**′, ‘*Px*’ is true_{I,f}at**w**′.

A formula φ (which may have the variable *x* free) is
then defined to be true** _{I}** just in case for
every assignment

**f**, φ is true

_{I,f}at the actual world

**w**. (Note that when φ is a closed formula (i.e., a sentence), then if φ is true relative to some assignment to the variables, it is true relative to all assignments to the variables.) A formula is logically true just in case it is true

_{0}**in all interpretations**

_{I}**I**(in this class of interpretations). For convenience, we reproduce here a precise definition in the supplementary document The Simplest Semantics for a Quantified Modal Language. It would serve well to study these definitions if they are unfamiliar. (Readers with some familiarity with modal logic will recognize that we have formulated the semantics without an accessibility relation. However, no such relation is required for a correct semantics of S5, which, in order to keep things simple, we will be presupposing henceforth.)

The simplest quantified modal logic (SQML) systematizes the
logically true sentences of **L** relative to the simplest
semantics. SQML combines classical first-order logic with identity
(FOL_{=}) — i.e., the sum of classical propositional
logic, classical first-order quantification theory, and the logic of
identity — with S5 modal logic (aka KT5). (For convenience, we
reproduce the axioms and rules of inference of these systems in the
supplementary document
The Simplest Quantified Modal Logic.)
We
presuppose familiarity with FOL_{=} here. The addition S5
strengthens FOL_{=} with three axiom schemas — the K
schema, the T schema, and the 5 schema (see below) — and the Rule
of Necessitation (RN), which permits one to infer □φ from any
given theorem φ. Each of the axioms of the resulting logic SQML is
true in every interpretation in the class described in the previous
paragraph. Moreover, the rules of inference ‘preserve
truth’ (and preserve logical truth). That is, the rules of
inference permit one to infer only (logical) truths from any set of
premises consisting solely of (logical) truths. Notice (importantly)
that open formulas are assertible as axioms and provable as theorems in
SQML. Familiarity with this logic will be presupposed in what
follows.

The problem that SQML poses for actualist philosophers is that,
while all of the logical axioms appear to be true, some of the logical
consequences of these axioms appear to be false. Consider first the
fact that the new modal axioms added by SQML to FOL_{=}, i.e.,
all instances of the K, T, and 5 schemas, all seem true. The K schema
asserts that if a conditional is necessary, then if the antecedent is
necessary, so is the consequent:

K schema: □(φ→ψ) → (□φ→□ψ)

It is easy to see that this is true in every interpretation of the class of simplest interpretations: if a conditional is true in every possible world and the antecedent of the conditional is true in every world, then the consequent of the conditional is true in every world.

The T schema asserts that a formula true in every possible world is simply true:

T schema: □φ → φ

Clearly, this is true in all interpretations — if a sentence is true in every possible world, it is true in the distinguished actual world.

The 5 schema asserts that if a formula φ is possible, then it is necessarily the case that it is possible:

5 schema: ◊φ → □◊φ

It is not hard to see that this is logically true. If a formula is true in some possible world, then from the point of view of every possible world, the formula is true in some possible world. That is, if a formula is true at some possible world, then at every possible world, there is some possible world where the formula is true. (The formal validity of the 5 schema is proved in the supplementary document The 5 Axiom Schema is Logically True.)

### 2.1 Controversial Consequences of SQML

However, the controversies surrounding actualism and modal logic
center on the following theorems, (the instances of) which are all
logically true and provable from the axioms and rules of SQML. The
first of these is the so-called *Barcan Formula* (or, more
correctly, the Barcan *schema*):

BF: ◊∃ xφ → ∃x◊φ

Our Alien example has already provided us with an example of BF in
action: where φ is ‘*Ax*’, BF asserts that
proposition (1) of Section 1.2 implies (4), or, in terms of their
ordinary language counterparts, that (5) implies (6). That all
instances of BF are logically true is shown in the supplementary
document
The Barcan Formula is Logically True;
that all instances are derivable
in from the axioms and rules of SQML is shown in
Proof of the Barcan Formula in S5.
(Note that the latter fact is shown for BF in its equivalent
form ∀*x*□φ →
□∀*x*φ. In the supplementary document,
Proof of Barcan Formula Equivalent,
it is shown that this proposition is indeed
logically equivalent to BF in SQML.)

Two further controversial principles we shall discuss are Necessary Existence and the Converse Barcan Formula:

NE: ∀ x□∃y(y=x)CBF: □∀ xφ → ∀x□φ

That NE and all instance of CBF are logically true is demonstrated in the supplementary documents:

The ‘Necessary Existence’ Principle is Logically True

The Converse Barcan Formula is Logically True

That they are provable in SQML is demonstrated in the supplementary documents:

Proof of ‘Necessary Existence’ in S5

Proof of Converse Barcan Formula in S5

### 2.2 Why Actualists Find SQML Unacceptable

With the machinery of SQML laid out before us, it is instructive to
consider why its consequences BF, NE, and CBF offend the actualist.
Recall that, according to actualism, everything there is, in any sense,
is actual. Consider first the Barcan Formula. We have seen how BF leads
to problems in the case of the Alien example, but, to drive the point
home, it is perhaps worth considering yet another case that has
appeared in the literature. Linsky and Zalta (1994) clearly express the
problem for actualists by having the reader consider a sisterless
person *b*; presumably, though sisterless in fact, most everyone
would agree that it is at least possible that *b* have a sister.
But given that possibility,

… BF requires thatthere existssomething that is possiblyb's sister. Sincebhas no sisters, which existing object is it that is possiblyb's sister? Some actualists, notably Ruth Marcus [1986], might defend BF by pointing to an existing woman (possibly one closely related tob) and suggesting that she is the thing which both exists and which is possiblyb's sister. But the great majority of actualists don't accept this idea, for they subscribe to certain essentialist views about the nature of objects. For example, they believe that women who aren'tb's sister could not have been (in a metaphysical sense)b's sister. This is a fact about their very nature, one concerning their origins. … Since there seems to be noactually existingthing which is possiblyb's sister, they conclude BF is false. We think the essentialist intuitions leading to this conclusion are not unreasonable, and so understand why these actualists take BF to be false. Indeed, it seems that BF, in general, is incompatible with the intuition that there might have been something distinct from every actual thing. It is hard to see how that intuition could be compatible with a principle which seems to require that every possibility be grounded in something that exists. This is further evidence actualists have against the acceptability of BF. But since they still want to make sense of modal discourse in terms of possible world semantics, they reject the Barcan formula as having unacceptable consequences, and search for a modal semantics on which it is not valid.

Consider next NE. For actualists, this explicitly says that for any
object *x*, necessarily something exists that is identical with
*x*. Now most actualists accept the following definition of what
it is for an object to exist:

x exists=_{df}∃y(y = x)

Given this definition, NE says that everything necessarily exists. (hence our abbreviation ‘NE’). Prior in [1957] was especially concerned by this, pointing out that classical quantified modal logic was "haunted by the myth that whatever exists exists necessarily." Note that NE applies even to those objects not named by a constant of the language. These consequences run counter to our ordinary (modal) intuitions. They are not inconsistent with Thesis (A), but are instead inconsistent with the reasonable belief that some objects might not have existed. Actualists see this as an additional and independent reason to abandon SQML.

Another problem with NE is that it leads to an even stronger result. By applying the Rule of Generalization and then the Rule of Necessitation to NE, one obtains:

NNE: □∀ x□∃y(y=x)

This asserts that it is necessary that everything necessarily exists. It follows that it is not even possible for there to be contingent individuals. To see why, note that an actualist would define ‘contingent individual’ as follows:

x is contingent=_{df}◊¬∃y(y=x)

Consequently, the claim that there are contingent individuals would be formulated as:

∃x◊¬∃y(y=x)

But it now follows from NNE that it is not possible that there are contingent individuals:

¬◊∃x◊¬∃y(y=x)

(The proof is left as an exercise.) If this is a consequence of SQML, it is no wonder actualists are dissatisfied.

Finally, there is CBF. For the actualist, the main problem with CBF
is that in SQML it implies NE in conjunction with the thesis known as
*Serious Actualism*. Serious Actualism is the thesis that it is
not possible for an object to have a property without existing, i.e.,
that if an object exemplifies a property at a world, it exists at that
world. [See Plantinga [1983], [1985], Menzel [1991], Pollock [1985],
and Deutsch [1994] for various discussions of Serious Actualism.] In
semantic terms, this amounts to the constraint that an object in the
extension of a property at a world must fall under the range of the
quantifier at that world. Serious Actualism is often expressed by the
following schema of the object language:

SA: □[φ→∃ y(y=x)], where φ is atomic and containsx.

Note that SA is a theorem of SQML (the proof is a simple exercise) and seems consistent with the actualist point of view. But from SA and CBF, one can rederive NE from any (logically) necessary property in the system. (See A Derivation of NE from SA and CBF.) Thus, even if there were a way to block the direct derivation of NE, the alternative derivation of NE from CBF and SA shows that serious actualists could not accept SQML unless CBF is somehow invalidated.

As noted, Arthur Prior was the first to realize the controversial consequences of SQML. Prior himself was a staunch actualist, and dealt with the problem by developing an alternative quantified modal logic that differs significantly from SQML, and which does not have the controversial principles above as theorems. A more detailed account of Prior's approach can be found in the supplementary document Prior's Modal Logic.

## 3. Kripke's System

Given the above consequences of SQML, one can understand why actualists would seek a reformulation of quantified modal logic that both: (1) defines interpretations so that BF, NE, and CBF are not logically true, and (2) weakens the proof theory of SQML so that BF, NE, and CBF are not derivable as theorems of the logic. Kripke's logic appealed to actualists and serious actualists for these very reasons. The system of Kripke [1963] invalidates BF, NE, and CBF both model-theoretically and proof-theoretically.

It is illuminating both to see exactly how Kripke was able to construct interpretations on which BF, NE, and CBF are not logically true and to see exactly how Kripke modified the logic of SQML so that these these schemata and sentences are no longer theorems. These techniques will be the subject of the next two subsections.

### 3.1 Kripke Models

The key insight in Kripke's quantified modal logic is the
replacement of the single domain **D** of individuals in
the interpretation of a first-order modal language with a function
**dom** that assigns to each world **w** its
own distinct domain of individuals
**dom**(**w**). No restrictions are placed on
the domain of a world; any set of individuals, including the empty set,
will do. Thus, instead of a single domain common to all worlds, domains
are permitted to vary from world to world. Intuitively, of course,
**dom**(**w**) represents the objects that
*exist* in **w**. In particular, the domain of the
actual world represents — of course — the things that are
actual, the things that exist simpliciter. Interpretations like this
for first-order modal languages in which each world has its own domain
are known as *Kripke models*.

The central semantic difference between Kripke models and
interpretations for SQML is that, in a Kripke model, when a quantified
formula ∀*x*φ is evaluated at a world
**w**, the quantifier ranges only over the objects that
exist in the domain of **w**. Thus, in particular, the
sample clause in the definition of truth for quantification above must
be revised for Kripke models **M** as follows, where,
again, **f** is an assignment function:

The quantified formula ‘∀xPx’ is true_{M,f}atwjust in case, for all individualsaindom(w), ‘Px’ is true_{M,f[x,a]}atw, wheref[x,a] isfiff(x) =a, and otherwise is just likefexcept that it assignsatoxinstead off(x).

Again, a little less formally, ‘∀*xPx*’ is
true_{I,f} at
**w** just in case, for all individuals **a**
*that exist in w*, the predicate
‘

*P*’ applies to

**a**at

**w**.

Kripke's changes to the model theory of first-order modal languages are relatively simple. Nonetheless, unlike the model theory for SQML, Kripke's model theory yields a set of logical truths that is fully compatible with actualism. In particular, all three of the principles with which the actualist takes issue — BF, NE, and CBF — turn out to be invalid in Kripke's semantics. Consider first BF in the form

◊∃xφ → ∃x◊φ

For definiteness, let φ be the formula ‘*Ax*’
expressing that *x* is an Alien (in the sense of
‘Alien’
introduced above). As we
noted, even though there are no Aliens in the actual world
**w _{0}**, there could have been; that is, there
is a possible world

**w**in which there are Aliens. Thus, on Kripke's way of evaluating quantified formulas, the antecedent to BF — ‘◊∃

*xAx*’ — comes out true at the actual world: ‘◊∃

*xAx*’ is true at

**w**if and only if there is some world

_{0}**u**at which ‘∃

*x*Ax’ is true, and that, in turn, is true at such a

**u**just in case some entity

*that exists in*is an Alien there. Assuming, as we are, that there is such a world, then, ‘◊∃

**u***x*Ax’ is indeed true, i.e., true at the actual world. However, as we also noted, no actually existing thing is an Alien. Thus, there is nothing in the domain of the actual world such that ‘◊

*Ax*’ is true of it, that is, nothing

**a**in the actual world and no world

**u**are such that ‘

*A*’ is true of

**a**at

**u**. So, in the case in question, the antecedent of BF is true, but the consequent is false. So BF is not valid, that is, there are models in which some of its instances are false.

It should be obvious why NE is also invalid in Kripke's semantics:
domains of worlds can be empty. Thus, let
**M _{1}** be a Kripke model containing at least
one actual individual (i.e., at least one object

**a**∈

**dom**(

**w**)) and a world

_{0}**w**that has an empty domain. Then, obviously,

**a**does not exist in

**w**, and hence ‘∃

*y*(

*y=x*)’ is false at

**w**when ‘

**a**’ is assigned to

*x*. Thus, ‘□∃

*y*(

*y*=

*x*)’ is false at

**w**when

_{0}**a**is assigned to ‘

*x*’, and so, because

**a**is in the domain of the actual world

**w**, NE (hence also NNE, of course) is false in

_{0}**M**.

_{1}
Finally, we note that CBF is invalid in Kripke's semantics. First, let
**M _{2}** be a Kripke model in which NE is
false. (We just proved the existence of such a model in the previous
paragraph, of course.) Next, let the predicate
‘

*P*’ express a property in

**M**that is

_{2}*universal*and

*existence-entailing*, that is, a property which is exemplified at each world

**w**by everything that exists at

**w**. (Such a property is said to be existence-entailing because, necessarily, anything that has it exists. The property

*existence*, of course, is the simplest example of such a property.) We can represent the universal, existence-entailing character of this property in the predicate ‘

*P*’ formally in

**M**simply by stipulating that the extension of ‘

_{2}*P*’ at any world

**w**of

**M**is

_{2}**dom**(

**w**), so that all and only the things that exist at each world are in the extension of

*P*at that world. Now, note that, under these conditions, it is true in

**M**(i.e., true at the actual world

_{2}**w**of

_{0}**M**) that □∀

_{2}*xPx*: intuitively, everything that exists in every possible world has the property

*P*in that world. Let

**a**be any object in the actual world

**w**that fails to exist in some world

_{0}**w**. (Since, by hypothesis, NE fails in

**M**, there must be such an object in

_{2}**dom**(

**w**).) Because

_{0}*P*is existence-entailing,

**a**is not in the extension of ‘

*P*’ at

**w**. So there is something in the actual world

**w**that does not have the property

_{0}*P*in every possible world, i.e., ‘∀

*x*□

*Px*’ is false in

**M**. Hence, the instance ‘□∀

_{2}*xPx*→∀

*x*□

*Px*’ of CBF is false in

**M**.

_{2}
Note that the invalidity of CBF opens the door back up to serious
actualism (SA) in Kripke's semantics, as it was the combination of SA
with CBF that led to trouble (i.e., trouble for the actualist) in SQML.
And it is easy to see formally that this is the case by constructing a
Kripke model in which SA is true. Note first that the thesis of serious
actualism can be expressed as the thesis that all properties are
existence-entailing; there is no possible world in which something has
a property but fails to exist in that world. In first-order languages,
properties are represented by predicates, and having a property is
represented semantically by being in the extension of a predicate.
Thus, to represent a property as existence-entailing in a Kripke model,
one simply ensures that, at every possible world **w**,
the extension of the predicate representing that property consist only
of things that exist in **w**. Hence, to represent
*all* properties as existence entailing, and hence, to make SA
true, one ensures that this is so for all the predicates of one's
language. Formally, then, let **M _{3}** be any
Kripke model satisfying the condition that, for every

*n*-place predicate

*F*and world

**w**,

*F*is interpreted so that, at

**w**,

*F*applies only to things that exist in

**w**; more formally, for individuals

**i**

_{1},…,

**i**

*of*

_{n}**M**,

_{3}*F*applies to

**i**

_{1},…,

**i**

*at*

_{n}**w**only if

**i**

_{1},…,

**i**

*∈*

_{n}**dom**(

**w**). This condition ensures that SA is true in

**M**.

_{3}
The compatibility of SA with Kripke's semantics is yet further
evidence of its suitability as a formal semantics for the actualist. A
question that remains is: What sort of *logic* does this
semantics yield?

### 3.2 Kripke's Quantified Modal Logic

A logic formulated in a given language **L*** is said
to be *sound* with respect to a semantics for
**L*** if and only if every formula of **L***
that is a theorem of the logic is valid (logically true) relative to
that semantics (i.e., is true in every interpretation or model of the
semantics). A logic is said to be *complete* with respect to a
semantics for **L*** if and only if every formula of
**L*** that is valid relative to that semantics is a
theorem of the logic. A sound and complete logic for a semantics is a
good thing, of course, as it provides a purely syntactic,
proof-theoretic mechanism for demonstrating the semantic validity of
formulas in the
language.^{[4]}.

SQML is sound and complete relative to the semantics
given above
for its language
**L**. Since, as we saw in the previous section, BF, NE,
and CBF are invalid in Kripke's semantics, SQML is obviously not sound.
Hence, Kripke must modify SQML to block their derivation without
blocking the derivation of any valid formulas.

There are two elements to Kripke's solution to this problem. Note
first that a typical proof of NE in S5 (hence, in SQML) such as the one
found in the supplementary document
Proof of Necessary Existence in S5
will involve the derivation of formulas containing free
variables from an instance the Universal Instantiation (UI) schema
— ∀*x*φ → φ — to which the Rule
of Necessitation is subsequently applied. Thus, the proof in the
supplementary document makes use of the following logical axioms:

*x=x*- ∀
*y*(*y*≠*x*) →*x*≠*x*.

By contraposition and the definition of the existential quantifier,
the latter axiom is equivalent to *x=x* →
∃*y*(*y=x*). Thus, given *x*=*x*, we
have ∃*y*(*y=x*). The crucial step now is the
application of Necessitation to this formula — containing, we
note, the free variable *x* — to yield
□∃*y*(*y=x*), which in turn yields NE, by
Generalization.

To repair this "flaw" in SQML, Kripke adopts the *generality
interpretation* of theorems containing free variables, that is: a
formula φ containing free variables
*x*_{1},…,*x _{n}*, when asserted
as a theorem (and hence, in particular, as an axiom), is taken to be an
abbreviation for its universal closure
∀

*x*

_{1}…∀

*x*φ. Thus, under this proposal, the proof of NE noted above fails. For the axioms used in the proof, because they involve free variables, cannot stand as they are. Rather, they must be taken to be abbreviations of

_{n}- ∀
*x*(*x=x*) - ∀
*x*(∀*y*(*y*≠*x*) →*x*≠*x*)

respectively. From the second axiom displayed above we can derive
∀*x*(*x=x* → ∃*y*(*y=x*))
and, from this ∀*x*(*x=x*) →
∀x∃*y*(*y=x*) (by the quantifier
distribution axiom). So using the first axiom displayed above, we can
now derive ∀*x*∃*y*(*y=x*) by Modus
Ponens, and, finally, by Necessitation we can derive only
□∀*x*∃*y*(*y=x*). This latter
proposition, for Kripke, is uproblematically and uncontroversially true
— in every possible world, every individual existing in that
world is identical to something (viz., itself). To derive NE from this,
however, we need CBF — in particular, the instance
□∀*x*∃*y*(*y=x*) →
∀*x*□∃*y*(y=x). But, as Kripke points
out, the usual SQML proof of CBF also depends essentially on an
application of Necessitation to an open formula derived by universal
instantiation — the same "flaw" that infects the proof of NE.
(See the inference from line 1 to line 2 in the supplementary
document
Proof of the Converse Barcan Formula in S5.)
Hence, it, too, fails under the
generality interpretation of free variables. The proof of BF found
in
Proof of the Barcan Formula in S5
fails for the same reason. Hence, the
usual SQML proofs of all three actualistically unacceptable principles
fail in Kripke's system.

However, the generality interpretation of theorems containing free
variables is not quite enough to purge quantified modal logic of NE and
its ilk. For valid proofs of NE, BF, and CBF can still be generated in
SQML from the proofs noted by simply replacing free occurrences of the
variable ‘*x*’ with occurrences of a constant
‘*c*’. The second element of Kripke's solution,
therefore, is to banish constants from the language of quantified modal
logic; that is, to specify the language of quantified modal logic in
such a way that variables are the only terms.

Note that, because theorems involve neither constants nor free
variables in Kripke's system, the Rule of Generalization has no
purchase; any quantifier prefixed to a theorem in virtue of the rule
would be vacuous (and hence could be inferred from the easily provable
theorem φ → ∀αφ, for α not occurring
free in φ). However, there remain validities of Kripke's system
that, in SQML, can only be proved by applications of Generalization to
theorems containing free variables, e.g.,
∀*x*(*Px* → *Px*). Moreover, the
inability to assert theorems containing free variables makes it
impossible to prove any *de re* modal validities. For the
logical form of all such propositions involves a modal operator within
the scope of a quantifier, and hence, the proof of any such proposition
would appear to require the application of Necessitation to a formula
in which a variable occurs free —
∀*x*□(*Px* → *Px*), for example,
in SQML, requires the application of the Rule of Necessitation to
*Px* → *Px* followed, once again, by an application
of Generalization.

Kripke's solution cleverly involves jettisoning both Generalization
and Necessitation as rules of inference and incorporating just enough
of them as needed into the statement of his logical axioms —
slightly revised from their SQML guises. In particular, Kripke's system
declares the result of prefixing universal quantifiers and modal
operators, in any order, to propositional tautologies (whether or not
they contain free variables) to be axioms. Thus, in particular, both
∀*x*(*Px* → *Px*) and
∀*x*□(*Px* → *Px*) count as
axioms in Kripke's system.

Kripke's system is presented in detail in the supplementary document Kripke's Quantified Modal Logic. With his modifications in place — broadly, the generality interpretation of free variables, the removal of individual constants, and the relocation of Generalization and Necessitation into the logical axioms themselves — Kripke is able to demonstrate that his system is sound and complete relative to his semantics. Soundness, in particular, tells us that no invalid formula is provable in the system. Hence, since NE, CBF, and BF are all invalid in Kripke's semantics, soundness guarantees that they are all unprovable in his system.

## 4. Is Kripke's System Actualist?

On the face of it, Kripke's system provides the actualist with a powerful alternative to SQML. However, although BF, NE, and CBF are neither valid nor provable in Kripke's system, the system is open to several serious objections.

First, Kripke regards the loss of free variables from assertible
sentences as a mere inconvenience. But this seems much too facile; a
great deal of mathematical reasoning is carried out in terms of
formulas with free variables, especially when reasoning about
"arbitrary" objects from which one intends to draw general conclusions.
One should at least wonder why such reasoning cannot be carried out in
a modal logic. Far more serious, however, is the loss of individual
constants. It is surely a sad irony that a system whose motivation is
to capture our modal intuitions — most notably, intuitions about
contingency — cannot so much as permit us to talk about specific
contingent individuals and say *of* those individuals
*that* they are contingent.

Alarming as this problem might be, however, it is in fact more a formal rather than a philosophical objection to Kripke's system. Although Kripke himself might not be particularly pleased at the prospect, it seems that the proper response to these problems is simply to alter those features of classical quantification theory and/or classical propositional modal logic that give rise to invalid inferences such as the above. (Arguably, Kripke has already made a similar move in adopting the generality interpretation of free variables.) Obvious suspects here are universal instantiation and necessitation. After all, there is nothing sacrosanct about either classical quantification theory or classical modal logic. If they are inconsistent with strong modal intuitions, then their revision is required and fully warranted.

So its current inability to name contingent beings does not of
itself constitute much of an objection to Kripke's system. It is likely
that it could be patched up so as to allow it this expressive capacity.
Far more serious is the fact that, despite the invalidity and
unprovability of the actualistically objectionable principles BF, NE,
and CBF, Kripke's system does not appear to have escaped ontological
commitment to possibilia. A model theory provides a *semantics*
for a language — an account of how the truth value of a given
sentence of the language is determined in a model by the meanings of
its semantically significant component parts, notably, the meanings of
its names, predicates, and quantifiers. Now, truth-in-a-model is not
the same as truth simpliciter. However, truth simpliciter is usually
understood simply to be truth in an *intended* model, a model
consisting of the very things that the language is intuitively
understood to be "about". So if we are to take Kripke models seriously
as an account of truth for modal languages, then we must identify the
intended models of those languages. And for this there seems little
option but to take Kripke's talk of possible worlds literally: the set
W in an intended Kripke model is the set of all possible worlds. If so,
however, it appears that Kripke is committed to possibilia. For suppose
the modal operators are literally quantifiers over possible worlds. And
suppose it is possible that there be objects — Aliens, for
example — that are distinct from all actually existing objects.
Letting ‘*A*’ express the property of being an
Alien, we can represent this proposition by means of the sentence
‘◊∃*yAy* &
¬∃*x*◊*Ax*’, i.e., while there could
be Aliens (◊∃*y**Ay*), no actually existing
thing could be an Alien (¬∃*x*◊*Ax*). On
Kripke's semantics, the first conjunct of this sentence can be true
only if there is a possible world *w* and an object *a*
such that *a* is an Alien at *w*. But given the second
conjunct, any such object *a* is distinct from all actually
existing things. Hence, using Kripke's semantics to provide us with an
account of truth, we find ourselves quantifying directly over possible
worlds and mere *possibilia*. That BF, NE, and CBF are
unprovable in Kripke's system, it seems, is metaphysically irrelevant.
For it appears that, nonetheless, the semantics itself is wholly
committed to possibilism.

An option for the actualist here, perhaps, is simply to deny that
Kripke models have any genuine metaphysical bite. The real prize is the
logic, which describes the modal facts of the matter *directly*.
The model theory is simply a formal *instrument* that enables us
to prove that the logic possesses certain desirable metatheoretic
features, notably consistency. But this position is unsatisfying at
best. Consider ordinary "Tarskian" model theory for nonmodal
first-order logic. Intuitively, this model theory is more than just a
formal artifact. Rather, when one constructs an intended model for a
given language, it shows clearly how the semantic values of the
relevant parts of a sentence of first-order logic — the objects,
properties, relations, etc. in the world those parts signify —
contribute to the actual truth value of the sentence. The semantics
provides insight into the "word-world" connection that explains how it
is that sentences can express truth and falsity, how they can carry
good and bad information. The embarrassing question for the actualist
who would adopt the proposed instrumentalist view of Kripke semantics
is: what distinguishes Kripkean model theory from Tarskian? Why does
the latter yield insight into the word-world connection and not the
former? Distaste for the metaphysical consequences of Kripke semantics
at best provides a motivation for finding an answer to these questions,
but it is not itself an answer. The actualist owes us either an
explanation of how Kripke's model theory provides a semantics for modal
languages that does not commit us to possibilism, or else he owes us a
semantical alternative.

## 5. Actualist Responses to the Possibilist Challenge

We now turn to the work of actualists who have tried to address the possibilist challenge.

### 5.1 Individual Essences

One of the best known responses to the possibilist challenge was
developed by Alvin Plantinga [1974]. The heart of Plantinga's approach
is the notion of an *individual essence*. Plantinga's precise
definition of this notion is a bit complex, but the idea itself is
quite simple. Consider first the venerable distinction between
*essential* and *accidental* properties. Intuitively, the
essential properties of an object are those properties that make the
object "what it is." More exactly, they are the properties that the
object couldn't possibly have lacked. Its accidental properties, by
contrast, are those that it just happens to have but might well have
lacked. Thus, the property **being a horse** is
intuitively not a property that the champion racehorse Secretariat
could have lacked; he couldn't have been a rabbit, say, or a stone. The
property **being a horse** is thus essential to
Secretariat. By contrast, Secretariat could easily have lacked the
property **being a racehorse**. Under different
circumstaces — if, say, he'd injured a leg as a colt — he
might have spent his days frolicking in the fields. That property is
therefore accidental to Secretariat. So the first part of the
definition of an individual essence — the "essence" part —
is that an individual essence is an essential property of anything that
has it. And the "individual" part of the definition is simply that if
something has a given individual essence, then nothing else could
possibly have that same individual essence. (We provide the definition
Plantinga actually uses in the document
Plantinga's Definition of an Individual Essence.)

Examples of individual essences are a little harder to come by than
examples of essential properties. There are fairly strong intuitive
grounds for the thesis that having arisen from the exact sperm and egg
that one has is an individual essence of every human person, or at
least of every human body. A different sperm and the same egg, say,
would have resulted in a perhaps similar but numerically distinct
person. Less controversial from a purely logical standpoint are what
Plantinga calls *haecceities*, i.e., properties like
**being Plantinga**, or perhaps, **being identical
with Plantinga**, that are "directly about" some particular
object. Pretty clearly, Plantinga has the property **being
Plantinga** essentially — he could not exist and lack it;
any world in which he exists is, *ex hypothesi*, a world in
which he is *Plantinga*, and hence a world in which he exhibits
the property in question. Moreover, nothing but the individual
Plantinga could have had that property; necessarily, anything that has
it is identical to Plantinga. Hence, **being Plantinga**
is an individual essence. Importantly, Plantinga takes individual
essences, like all properties, to exist necessarily, even if they are
not exemplified. (Interested readers may wish to read the supplementary
document
Background Assumptions for Plantinga's Account.)

Briefly put, Plantinga's solution to the possibilist challenge is to
replace the possibilia of Kripke's semantics with individual essences.
We follow the development of this solution found in Jager [1982].
Specifically, an interpretation **I** of the first-order
modal language **L**, consists again of two mutually
disjoint nonempty sets: the set of possible worlds and the set of
individual essences. And, as with Kripke, there is a function
**dom** that assigns to each possible world
**w** its own distinct domain
**dom**(**w**). However, instead of the
possible individuals that exist in **w**, this domain
consists of those individual essences that are *exemplified* in
**w**, or, more exactly, that *would have been
exemplified* if **w** had been actual.

But how, exactly, does **I** assign values to
predicates?After all, it is not individual essences to which predicates
apply at worlds, it is the things that exemplify them; **being an
Alien**, if it were exemplified, would not be a property of
essences, but of individuals. Plantinga's trick is to talk, not about
exemplification, but *coexemplification*. Properties
**P** and **Q** are *coexemplified*
just in case some individual has both **P** and
**Q**. And for any world **w**,
**P** and **Q** are *coexemplified in
w* just in case, if

**w**were actual,

**P**and

**Q**would be coexemplified. So, for example, given that there are men who are philosophers, the properties

**being a man**and

**being a philosopher**are coexemplified in the actual world. Again, any world in which the pope (i.e., Wojtyla) has a child is a world in which the property

**being a child of Wojtyla**is coexemplified with an individual essence

*E*; any such essence

*E*, of course, is unexemplified in the actual world (assuming the lifelong chastity of the pope).

A relation **R** is coexemplified with properties
**P**_{1},…,**P**_{n}
(in that order) just in case (i) there are individuals
**i**_{1},…,**i**_{n}
that exemplify
**P**_{1},…,**P**_{n},
respectively, and (ii)
**i**_{1},…,**i**_{n}
stand in the relation **R**. And for any world
**w**, **R** is coexemplified with
properties
**P**_{1},…,**P**_{n}
in **w** just in case, if **w** were actual,
**R** would be coexemplified with
**P**_{1},…,**P**_{n}. In
Plantinga's system, then, a 1-place predicate *P* *applies
to* a given individual essence **e** at a world
**w** just in case the property expressed by *P*
is coexemplified with the **e** at
**w**. And an *n*-place predicate *R*
applies to essences
**e**_{1},…,**e**_{n}
at **w** just in case the relation expressed by
*R* is coexemplified with
**e**_{1},…,**e**_{n}
at **w**. For any individual essences
**e**_{1},…,**e**_{n}
and possible world **w** in our interpretation
**I**, then, **I** specifies, for each
*n*-place predicate *R*, whether or not *R*
applies to
**e**_{1},…,**e**_{n}
at **w**.

The denotation function **f** for **I**
works just as in SQML and Kripke semantics, only now, of course, it
assigns essences to variables instead of possibilia. Given this, we can
now illustrate the definition of truth for this model theory by means
of several instances of its most important clauses:

- The open, atomic formula ‘
*Px*’ is true_{I,f}at**w**just in case**I**specifies that ‘*P*’ applies to**d**_{I}_{,f}(*x*) at**w**. - The quantified formula ‘∀
*xPx*’ is true_{I,f}at**w**just in case, for all individual essences**e**in**dom**(**w**), ‘*Px’*is true_{I,f[x,e]}at**w**, where**f**[*x*,**e**] is**f**if**f**(*x*) =**e**, and otherwise is just like**f**except that it assigns**e**to*x*instead of**f**(*x*). (A little less formally, ‘∀*xPx’*is true_{I,f}at**w**just in case, for all individual essences**e**, the predicate ‘*P*’ applies to**e**at**w**.) - The open, modal formula ‘□φ’
(‘◊φ’) is
true
_{I,f}at**w**just in case for every (some) possible world**w**, ‘φ’ is true_{I,f}at**w**.

Referring back to our Alien example, then, the proposition that it
is possible that there are Aliens, ◊∃*xAx*, is true on
this account if and only if there is a possible world
**w** and a haecceity **e** such that
‘*A*’ applies to **e** at
**w**, i.e., if and only if the property **being an
Alien** and **e** are coexemplified in
**w**.

Notice that Plantinga's account also has no problem dealing with iterated modalities. The problem, recall, was that sentences like

(9) ◊∃ x(Sxp& ◊Px)

appear to require mere possibilia to serve as the values of the
quantifier, since no actually existing thing could be a son of the
current pope.For Plantinga, the solution is simply that quantifiers
range over haecceities, and that, in particular, (9) is true in virtue
of their being an unexemplified haecceity which, in some possible world
is coexemplified with the property **being a son of
Wojtyla**, and in another world, that very same haecceity is
coexemplified with **being a priest**.

In sum, then, in Plantinga's account there is an individual essence
for every *possibile* in Kripke's. And for every property that
every *possibile* enjoys at any given world **w**
in Kripke's account, there is an individual essence that is
coexemplified with that property in (the Plantingian counterpart of)
**w**. Plantinga's semantics would thus appear to generate
precisely the same truth values for the sentences of a modal language
as Kripke's. Hence, it would appear that Plantinga has indeed
successfully developed a semantics for modal languages that comports
with actualist scruples.

#### Problems with this Account

Objections to Plantinga's account of actualism are addressed in the document Problems with the Actualist Accounts.

### 5.2 World Stories

Many propositions are *singular* in form. That is, as opposed
to general propositions like **All men are animals** and
**There are Aliens**, some propositions are, in the words
of Arthur Prior, "directly about" specific individuals — for
example, the proposition **Winston Churchill was a German
citizen**. Such propositions are typically expressed by means of
sentences involving names, pronouns, indexicals, or other devices of
direct reference. As we've seen, possibilists believe that there are
singular possibilities (i.e., singular propositions that are possibly
true) about things that don't actually exist, possibilities involving
mere *possibilia*. Similarly, haecceitists also believe that
there are singular possibilities that are, in a certain clear sense,
directly about things that don't exist, viz., possibilities that, were
they actual, would involve the exemplification of haecceities that are
in fact actually unexemplified. Say that a *strong* actualist is
someone who rejects both nonactual *possiblia* and unexemplified
haecceities. For the strong actualist, then, there are no singular
propositions directly about things that do not actually exist. Since
this is a necessary truth for the strong actualist, it also follows
that, had some actually existing individual failed to exist, there have
been no singular propositions about that individual. Singular
propositions about contingent beings are thus themselves likewise
contingent for the strong actualist. A strong actualist, then, as we
might put it, believes that all possibilities are either wholly
general, or at most are directly about actually existing individuals
only.

Several philosophers — notably, Robert Adams and, building on
work of Prior [1977], Kit Fine — have developed possible world
semantics that are strongly actualist. The approach in Adams [1974]
centers around Adams' notion of a possible world, or "world story". For
Adams, a world story is a *maximally possible* set of
propositions, that is, a set **s** of propositions such
that (i) for any pair of mutually contradictory propositions **p** and **q**, s contains either
**p** or **q**, and (ii) it
is possible that all the members of **s** be true
together.^{[5]}.
A proposition **p** is
*true* in a world story **w**, then, just in case
**p** is a member of **w**. Thus, Adams takes
a proposition to be possible just in case it is true in some world
story. In particular, then, the semantics of our paradigmatic
proposition **Possibly, there are Aliens**, i.e.,
formally,

(1) ◊∃ xAx,

is straightforward and, on the face of it, innocuous from a strongly actualist perspective: (1) is true if and only if (the proposition expressed by)

(14) ‘∃ xAx’ (i.e., the propositionThere are Aliens) is true at some world.

#### Problems with this Account

Objections to world stories are addressed in the document Problems with the Actualist Accounts.

### 5.3 World Propositions

Inspired by the work of Arthur Prior, Kit Fine [1977] has developed
an approach similar to Adams' which takes account of the contingency of
singular propositions. For Adams, a possible world is a certain set of
propositions. Fine, by contrast, drawing on an idea of Prior's,
identifies a world with a certain type of proposition — what he
calls a *world proposition*. Roughly speaking, a world
proposition might be thought of as the infinite conjunction of all of
the proposition in one of Adams' world stories. More specifically, a
world proposition is a proposition **q** such that it is
possible both that **q** be true and that it entail all
true propositions. A proposition **p** is then said to be
*true in* a possible world, i.e., world proposition,
**q** just in case **q** *entails*
**p**, i.e., formally, just in case
□(**q** → **p**).

Now, if Fine's account were to parallel Adams', then Fine would now
say that, for a proposition to be possible is for it to be true in some
possible world, i.e., to be entailed by some world proposition. But
Fine is more mindful of the problems that contingent propositions raise
for actualism. Consequently, he suggests alternative truth conditions
for propositions of the form **Possibly p**, namely, that
it is *possible* that **p** be true in some
possible world. Thus, for Fine, the full analysis of the iterated modal
proposition (9) — ◊∃*x*(*Sxp* &
◊*Px*) — is as follows: (9) is true if and only if

(18) It is possible that ‘∃ x(Sxp& ◊Px)’ (i.e., the propositionWojtyla has a son who could have become a priest) is true at some worldw.

(18), in turn, is true if and only if

(19) It is possible that, for some some individual x, ‘Sxp& ◊Px’ (i.e., the proposition) is true at some worldxis a son of Wojtyla andxcould have become a priestw,

which, in turn, is true if and only if

(20) It is possible that, for some some individual x, ‘Sxp’ (i.e., the proposition) is true at some worldxis a son of Wojtylawand, it is possible that, for some worldu, ‘Px’ (i.e., the proposition) is true atxis a priestu.

Thus, all that Fine's account requires in its analyses of (9) is the
*possibility* that certain propositions exist — notably,
singular propositions (and, in particular, world propositions) that
don't exist in fact but would exist if certain individuals did, as
would be the case, e.g., if the pope were to have a son.Unlike Adams
account, then, Fine's wears its fully intensional character on its
sleeve. It abandons the idea that ordinary modal operators such as
"possibly" and "necessarily" can, in general, be analyzed as
extensional quantifiers over possible worlds. For some occurrences of
those operators — those in (9), for instance — are
ineliminable.

#### Problems with this Account

Objections to world propositions are addressed in the document Problems with the Actualist Accounts.

### 5.4 Roles

McMichael [1983a] has proposed an actualist semantics that avoids
the objections to haecceities raised against Plantinga and both the
loss of compositionality objection and the iterated modalities
objection raised against Adams. Like Adams, McMichael rejects
haecceities. However, like Plantinga, McMichael introduces a class of
actualist surrogates for *possibilia*, which he calls
*roles*. McMichael's account builds on a very rich and elaborate
theory of relations, and it is necessary to lay out at least some of
its basic concepts in order to understand the account.

For McMichael, a primitive logical relation of *inclusion*
can hold between properties and relations. Because it is a primitive,
it cannot be defined, but, intuitively, in the case of properties, the
idea is that one property **P** includes another
**Q** just in case, necessarily, anything that has
**P** has **Q**. Thus, the property
**being red** includes the property **being
colored**. Again, intutively once again, one binary relation
**R** includes another **R**′ just in
case, necessarily, for any objects **x** and
**y**, if **x** bears **R** to
**y**, then **x** bears
**R**′ to **y**.So, for example,the
conjunctive relation **being both a child and an heir of**
includes the relation **being a child of**.

Inclusion can also hold between an *n*+1-place relation and
an *n*-place relation, relative to one of the argument places of
the
former.^{[6]}
Thus, in particular, a 2-place relation
**Q** can include a property **P**, relative
to one of its two argument places: intuitively, **Q**
includes **P**, relative to its first argument place, if
and only if, necessarily, whenever two things **a** and
**b** stand in the relation **Q**,
**a** exemplifies **P**. And if the inclusion
were with respect to the second argument place, of course, it would be
**b** that exemplifies **P**. So, for
example, the **child-of** relation, relative to its first
argument place, includes the property **being a child of
something**; whenever any object **a** bears the
**child-of** relation to some object **b**,
**a** has the existentially quantified property
**being a child of something**. Similarly,
**child-of** includes the property **being a parent
of something** relative to its second argument place.

A (unary) role is just a "purely qualitative" property of a certain
sort, where (as described in more detail in the supplementary document
on
Qualitative Essences)
a purely qualitative
property is a property that "involves" no particular individuals. Thus,
such properties as **being a philosopher** and
**being someone's mother or maternal aunt** are purely
qualitative, while **being a student of Quine** and
**being Johnson's mother or a friend of Boswell** are not.
Given this, McMichael defines a property **P** to be a
*unary role* if (i) it is exemplifiable, (ii) it is purely
qualitative, and (iii) for any purely qualitative property
**Q**, either **P** includes
**Q** or **P** includes the complement
**-Q** of **Q**. A role is thus a complete
(nonmodal) "characterization" of the way something could be,
qualitatively. Intuitively, then, the role of a given object is a
"conjunction" of all of the purely qualitative, nonconjunctive
properties the object exemplifies. Thus, for example, Socrates' role
includes the properties **being a philosopher**,
**being snub-nosed**, **being the most famous
teacher of a famous philosopher**, **being condemned to
death** and so
on.^{[7]}
The notion of role generalizes in a natural
way to all *n*-place relations, including, notably, propositions
(i.e., 0-place relations) and binary (i.e., 2-place) relations. Thus,
the binary role that Boswell bears to Johnson is, intuitively, a
conjunction of all of the purely qualitative, nonconjunctive binary
relations that Boswell bears to
Johnson.^{[8]}
As one might suspect, it
can be shown on McMichael's theory that a binary role includes a unique
unary role with respect to each of its argument places. In particular,
the binary role that Boswell bears to Johnson includes Boswell's unary
role relative to its first argument place and Johnson's relative to its
second.

Now (as also explained in the supplementary document on Qualitative Essences), Adams [1979] has argued persuasively that no purely qualitative property, no matter how complex, can serve as an individual essence for a contingent being. Hence, in general, roles — being purely qualitative — are not individual essences. Rather, they are general properties that are (in general) exemplifiable by different things (though not necessarily things in the same possible world). Because of this, none of the objections to Plantinga's haecceities is relevant to roles, as the fact that haecceities are individual essences lies at the heart of those objections. At the same time, McMichael is able to provide a semantics for (9) that does not run afoul of the iterated modalities objection. The basic trick is to

…alter the criterion for deciding what an individual might have done. Instead of saying that what an individual might have done is whathedoes in some possible world, let us say that what an individual might have done is whatany suchindividual does in some possible world…. To determine what Socrates might have done, we don't look for worlds in which he appears, but instead we look for roles in possible worlds which are accessible to Socrates' actual role. If one of these roles includes a certain property, then that property is one Socrates could have had; otherwise, it is not [ibid., 73].

Thus, a little more formally, where *F* is the property
**being foolish**, and *s* is Socrates, a simple
modal sentence such as

(21) Possibly, Socrates is foolish (◊ Fs)

is true just in case some unary role accessible to the actual role of Socrates includes the property of being foolish.

Similar to Plantinga's semantics, then, quantifiers do not range over individuals, but over roles. This enables McMichael to avoid the iterated modalities objection and provide a compositional semantics for our iterative paradigm (9). Specifically, (9) is true if and only if

(22) Some role Raccessible to Wojtyla's actual roleRincludes the property_{k}being a parent of someone(i.e., the property [λy∃xCxy] expressed by the open formula ‘∃xCxy’).

(22) captures the idea that an individual *such as* Wojtyla
could have been a parent. Adams, of course, got this far in his account
of (9). But, unlike Adams, with roles at his disposal, McMichael can
continue his analysis of (9) and unpack the existentially quantified
formula ‘∃*xCxy*’. Specifically, (22) holds if
and only if

(23) Some binary role Sthat includes thechild-ofrelation (i.e., the relation expressed by the atomic formula ‘Cxy’) also includes, relative to its second argument place, the roleR(a role accessible to Wojtyla's actual roleR)._{k}

That is, in accordance with McMichael's recursive definition of
truth, (23) unpacks the quantified formula
‘∃*xCxy*’ in terms of the
**child-of** relation that is expressed by the embedded
atomic formula ‘*Cxy*’. Specifically, the truth of
(9) consists in the existence of a binary role **S** that
includes the **child-of** relation and, relative to its
second argument place, a role accessible to Wojtyla's role
**R _{k}**. Note that, being a binary role,

**S**also includes a unique role relative to its first argument place. And because it includes the

**child-of**relation and, relative to its second argument place, a role

**R**accessible to Wojtyla's role

**R**,

_{k}**S**will include, relative to its first argument place, a role

**R**′ that can only be exemplified by a child of whatever exemplifies

**R**, i.e., a child of

*such*an object as Wojtyla.

To capture the intuition that no such child could be identical to
any actually existing thing, then, McMichael can simply deny that the
role **R**′ that would be exemplified by such a
child is accessible to the role of any actually existing thing.

#### Problems with this Account

Objections to McMichael's role theory are addressed in the document Problems with the Actualist Accounts.

### 5.5 Dispensing with Worlds

A rather different approach to the possibilist challenge is broached by Menzel [1990]. This approach is clarified and refined by Ray [1995], and a very similar approach is elaborated in great formal and philosophical detail by Chihara [1998]. For ease of reference, call this the "no-worlds" approach.

All non-skeptical approaches to modality agree that Kripke models
provide key insights into the meaning of our modal discourse and the
nature of modal reality. However, as we have seen, the naive "intended"
model of Kripke semantics leads to possibilism. The standard actualist
response — following David Lewis, "ersatzism" — has been to
define actualistically acceptable notions of possible worlds and
possible individuals to serve as replacements for the elements of
**W** and **D** in the naive intended model,
thereby (or so it is argued) preserving the semantical and metaphysical
benefits of Kripke models while avoiding ontological commitment to
*possibilia*. As just seen above, however, ersatzism is still
problematic. By contrast, the no-worlds account does not attempt to
identify worlds as acceptable abstract entities of some sort. Rather,
the notion of a possible world is abandoned altogether.

To get at the idea, note first that the notion of an intended Tarski
model makes perfectly good sense for a formalization of nonmodal
discourse about the actual world. To illustrate, suppose we have a
given a piece of nonmodal discourse about a certain event, a baseball
game, say. Suppose now we formalize that discourse in a nonmodal
language *L*′; that is, for each referring expression in
the disourse (e.g., ‘Mark McGwire’, ‘second
inning’, etc.), there is a unique constant of *L*′,
and for every simple verb phrase in the discourse (‘is a home
run’, ‘is out’, ‘relieves’, etc.) there
is a unique predicate of *L*′. Then we can form a Tarski
model **M**_{L′} for
*L*′ whose domain consists of the actual objects that the
speakers are talking about in the discourse (fans, players, equipment,
etc.) and which interprets the predicates of *L*′ so that
they are true of exactly those (*n*-tuples of objects in the
domain that are in the extension of the corresponding verb phrases of
the discourse. In this way we form the intended model of
*L*′, the piece of the world that it is intended to be
about.

According to proponents of the no-worlds account, the fallacy of
both ersatzism and possibilism is the inference that things must work
in largely the same way with regard to Kripke models. A Kripke model is
basically an indexed collection of Tarski models. Just as there is an
intended Tarski model for a nonmodal language *L*′
constructed from the actual world, the accounts above infer that, for a
given formalization *L* of modal discourse, there must be an
intended Kripke model constructed from all possible worlds. And,
depending on one's tolerance for possibilia, this leads either to
possibilism or one of its ersatz variations.

For no-worlders, the modal upshot of a Kripke model lies in its
structure rather than its content. The specific elements of a Kripke
model are irrelevant. Rather, under appropriate conditions, it is the
form of a Kripke model alone that tells us something about modal
reality. Specifically, the model theory of Kripke semantics is retained
in the no-world account. The elements of a model are irrelevant; it is
easiest just to take them to be pure sets, or ordinal numbers, or some
other type of familiar mathematical object. Consequently, there can be
no notion of a single intended model, because, for every model, there
are infinitely many others that are structurally isomorphic to it, and
structure is all that matters on the no-worlds account. In place of
intended models, the no-worlds account offers the notion of an
*intended** model. To get at the idea, suppose one has an
intended Tarski model **M** of the actual world, a model
that actually contains entities in the world and assigns extensions to
predicates that reflect the actual meanings of the adjectives and verb
phrases those predicates formalize. Now replace the objects in that
model with abstract objects of some ilk to obtain a new model
**M**′ that is structurally isomorphic to
**M**. Then **M**′ also models the
world under a mapping, or embedding, that takes each element
**e**′ of **M**′ to the element
**e** that it replaced in **M**. We can thus
justifiably think of **M**′ as a sort of intended
model because, even though it doesn't necessary *contain*
anything but pure sets (or some other type of mathematical object),
under an appropriate embedding it models the actual world no less than
**M**. To distinguish models like
**M**′ that require a nontrivial embedding into the
world from models like **M**, no-worlders call the former
*intended** models.

According to no-worlders, the notion of an intended* Tarski model is
all that is needed for modeling the modal facts. From these a notion of
an intended* Kripke model can be defined. Assume that
**L** is a model language that formalizes some range of
modal discourse about the world. Roughly, then, an intended* Kripke
model **M** is simply a Kripke model such that (i) the
Tarski model indexed by the distinguished index
**w _{0}** is an intended* Tarski model of the
actual world, (ii) every Tarski model

**M**′ in

**M**

*could have been*an intended* model of the world, that is, the world could have been as

**M**′ represents it, and (iii) necessarily, some Tarski model in

**M**is an intended* model of the world, i.e., no matter how the world had been, there would have been an intended* Tarski model of it in

**M**.

^{[9]}

Truth in a model on the the no-worlds account is defined as usual as
truth at the distinguish index **w _{0}** of the
model, hence, a sentence φ is true simpliciter if and only if it is
true at the distinguished index of some (hence, any) intended* Kripke
model. Given the definition of an intended* model, it follows that a
modal formula ‘◊φ’ is true if and only if, for some
intended* Kripke-model

**M**, φ is true in some Tarski-model

**M**′ in

**M**, that is, in some Tarski-model

**M**′ in

**M**that could have been an intended* model of the world. Thus, in particular, (1) is true if and only if

(20) For some intended* Kripke model M, there is a Tarski modelM′ inMin which ‘∃xAx’ is true,

that is, given the definition of an intended* Kripke model, if and
only if there is a Tarski model **M**′ that could
have been an intended* Tarski model and such that, if it had been,
there would have been Aliens.

For the no-worlder, then, intended* Kripke models adequately represent the modal structure of the world simply by virtue of their own modal properties. Since Kripke models are constructed entirely out of existing objects, the semantics for modal logic requires no distinction between what is actual and what is possible. It therefore conforms with the thesis of actualism, but does so without the elaborate metaphysical apparatus of the ersatzers.

#### Problems with this Account

Objections to the no-world account are addressed in the document Problems with the Actualist Accounts.

### 5.6 An Actualist Interpretation of the Simplest QML

Finally, we consider to a new form of actualism that has been
proposed recently. This form of actualism refocuses our attention on
the Simplest Quantified Modal Logic (SQML) and offers a way to
reinterpret this formalism to eliminate its apparent commitment to
*possibilia*. On this form of actualism, the truth conditions
for the modal claim "There might have been Aliens" are just what they
appear to be, namely, that in some possible world, there is an object
that is an Alien at that world. However, these truth conditions do not
commit us to possibilia. Instead, the new form of actualism is based on
the idea that these truth conditions are committed only to the
existence of *nonconcrete* objects which might have been Aliens.
This theory has been recently put forward by Linsky and Zalta ([1994]
and [1996]) and Williamson ([1998] and [1999]), though Williamson
simply eschews the word ‘actual’ in his formulation of the
theory. These philosophers claim that the nonconcrete objects in
question are not Aliens, but instead have the modal property of
possibly being an Alien. In other words, modal claims such as "There
might have been Aliens" (formalized, once again, as (1)) can be
interpreted to be true in virtue of the *actual* existence of
objects that are nonconcrete (and hence which are not Aliens) at our
world, but which are Aliens (and hence concrete) at some other possible
world. Thus, the nonconcrete objects involved in the truth conditions
of such modal claims do exist and are actual. To say this is to use a
sense of "existence" and "actual" similar to that used by Platonists
when they claim that mathematical objects exist and are actual.
However, unlike mathematical objects, which are nonconcrete at
*every* possible world, the actual objects required by the truth
of modal claims are only *contingently* nonconcrete — they
are nonconcrete at our world but concrete at other possible worlds.
Similarly, ordinary concrete objects (like the rocks, tables, planets,
etc., of our world) are assumed to be contingently concrete —
they are concrete at some worlds (including ours) and not at other
worlds.

With this basic idea in hand, the ‘new actualists’ point out that our ordinary modal claims can be given a straightforward analysis by: (1) regimenting ordinary modal discourse in the simplest possible way using the language and logic of the simplest quantified modal logic (SQML) and (2) semantically interpreting SQML by appealing to contingently concrete objects and contingently nonconcrete objects (both of which are assumed to actually exist). This interpretation, the new actualist argues, reveals that the problematic theorems of SQML — most notably, the Barcan Formula (BF), the Converse Barcan Formula (CBF), and the Necessary Existence (NE) theorems — do not contradict our modal intuitions, once those intuitions are understood in terms of a more subtle conception of the abstract/concrete distinction.

To see why, reconsider the definition and discussion of SQML and
reexamine BF. From the fact that there might have been aliens
(◊∃*xAx*), BF requires only that there exist something
that *could have been* an Alien (∃*x◊Ax*). But,
it was asked, doesn't this contradict the intuition (described at the
very outset) that *nothing could have been an Alien*? Here, the
new actualist argues that this intuition is true only when it is
properly understood as the intuition that *no concrete object could
have been an Alien*. Recall our thought experiment at the outset,
which asked us to "imagine a race of beings that is very different from
any life-form that actually exists anywhere in the universe; different
enough, in fact, that no actually existing thing could have been an
Alien, any more than a given gorilla could have been a fruitfly." The
relevant intuition, that nothing could have been an Alien, is grounded
in the fact that when we look around us and examine all the concrete
objects that there are, we note that none of those objects could have
been an Alien (just as no gorilla could have been a fruitfly). However,
this leaves room to claim that there exist (contingently)
*non*concrete objects which could have been Aliens. According to
the new actualist, these contingently nonconcrete objects have been
overlooked because (1) no one has correctly drawn the proper
distinction between contingently nonconcrete and necessarily
nonconcrete objects, and (2) everyone has assumed that concreteness was
an *essential* property of concrete objects (see below).

Thus, according to the new actualist, whenever there is a true claim
of the form "There might have been something which is *F*", BF
doesn't imply anything that is incompatible with our modal intuitions.
For the conclusion that it forces, namely, that "There exists something
that might have been an *F*", does not require us to suppose
that there is some concrete object which might have been *F*. BF
need only require the existence of contingently nonconcrete objects
which might have been *F*. Similar reasoning is developed in the
supplementary document
Why CBF and NE Are Harmless Consequences of SQML for the New Actualist.

Once it is seen that BF requires only contingently nonconcrete objects and not possibilia, it is natural to reconceive the nature of concrete objects. According to new actualism, ordinary concrete objects are concrete at some worlds and not at others. This is the sense in which they are contingent objects. Traditional actualists have described worlds where these objects are not concrete as worlds where these objects don't exist or have any kind of being. By contrast, the new actualist just rests with their nonconcreteness at the world in question, and argues that that should suffice to account for our intuition that such objects "are not to be found" in such a world. Moreover, new actualists reconceive the idea of an "essential" property of a concrete object. Instead of saying that Socrates is essentially a person because he is a person in every possible world where he exists, new actualists say that he is essentially a person because he is a person in every world where he is concrete.

So by recognizing the existence of contingently nonconcrete objects
and by reconceiving both the contingency of concrete objects and the
notion of an essential property in what seem to be harmless ways, there
appears to be a way to interpret SQML so that it is consistent with
actualism. Specifically, in the "intended" new actualist model,
everything in the one domain **D** both exists and is
actual.**D** includes: (1) (contingently) concrete
objects, (2) necessarily concrete objects (if there are such), (3)
contingently nonconcrete objects, and (4) necessarily nonconcrete
objects (if there are such). All of these objects in **D**
are said to actually exist.

New actualism appears to lack the awkward features that plague other forms of actualism. In contrast to Kripke's System, the metalanguage does not quantify over possibilia and object language quantifiers can range over everything the metalanguage quantifiers range over. In contrast to Prior's approach, no distinction between two kinds of necessity is needed. In contrast to Plantinga's haecceitism, there is an objectual interpretation of quantified modal logic which is expressible in terms of the basic notion of an individual exemplifying properties (rather than in the less basic terminology of coexemplification). In contrast to Adams' world story approach, there is no puzzle arising from propositions which do not exist at worlds where their constituents do not exist — propositions and their constituents exist necessarily, though the contingent constituents of propositions fail to be concrete at some worlds. In particular, all objects exist necessarily for the new actualist, and hence can be quantified over relative to any possible world, it should be clear that the new actualist has no trouble with the semantics of iterated modalities. (Details are provided in the supplementary document New Actualism and Iterated Modalities for the interested reader.) In contrast to Fine's world propositions approach, object language modal operators are fully interpreted in terms of worlds alone, and hence can be thought of as providing a genuine semantical analysis of the modal operators — although, admittedly, this will depend on a conception of worlds that does not itself involve a primitive notion of propositional possibility. At the least, the account provides as much explanatory power as Fine's in a manner that is both ontologically simpler and more direct. In contrast to McMichael's role theory, modal truths such as "Socrates might have been a carpenter" are genuinely about Socrates. In contrast to the no-worlders, the idea that necessary truth is truth in all possible worlds is preserved. The intended interpretation has in its domain all of the objects that actually exist and extensions can be distributed to properties at the various worlds in just the way that is required by the modal facts. Modal discourse, then, is directly about an independent reality free of possibilia, and the relationship between the formal language and the intended model exactly mirrors the relationship between ordinary modal language and the reality that grounds modal truth.

#### Problems with this Account

Objections to new actualism are addressed in the document Problems with the Actualist Accounts.

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