Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to The Traditional Square of Opposition

1. Church 1965, 422 finds it first (implicitly) in Cayley 1871, explicitly in Brentano 1874, and in Peirce 1880, 15–57.

2. This argument is given e.g. in Kneale & Kneale 1962, 55–60.

3. Cf. Kneale & Kneale 1962, 60, and Keynes 1928, 126 note 1.

4. Prior Analytics also contains the doctrine of conversion per accidens: that you can interchange the subject and predicate terms of either universal form if you also turn it into a particular. This is not an additional principle, since it follows from the rules of subalternation together with simple conversion.

5. Cf. Wedin 1990.

6. Ockham (SL I.72): "In affirmative propositions a term is always asserted to supposit for something. Thus, if it supposits for nothing the proposition is false. However, in negative propositions the assertion is either that the term does not supposit for something or that it supposits for something of which the predicate is truly denied. Thus a negative proposition has two causes of truth." Loux 1974, 206.

7. Paul Spade called these facts to my attention.

8. Abelardus Petrus 1970, 186: "And thus in categorical propositions, the only proper and rightly destroying contradiction to any affirmation seems to be a proposition that with a negation appended in front destroys the entire meaning, so that ‘not every human is human’, but not ‘some human is not human’ is the contradictory of ‘every human is human’. For the latter may happen to be false simultaneously with that. For a thing of ‘human’ not existing now, neither will this be true, namely ‘every human is human’ nor that which says ‘some human is not human’  …"

9. Oddly, Aristotle does not mention this form, though it was accepted from the medieval period onward. (It is common to speculate that this form was too trivial to mention.) The same point can be made with a form he did discuss (Darapti): If every A is C and every A is B then some B is C.

10. Aristotle, De Interpretatione 2 and 3.

11. Church 1965, 419 quotes some apparent instances of contraposition endorsed by Aristotle. But the wordings he gives are not actually contraposition; their premises are apparently meant to be universal affirmatives (Every A is B) and their conclusions seem to be of a "nonstandard" negative form: Every non-B is not A. (Such conditionals, though not their converses, are valid.) These examples, however, might easily have been interpreted as contraposition by later commentators, just as Church did.

12. Contraposition is discussed in several twelfth and early thirteenth century anonymous texts edited in De Rijk 1967. It is endorsed in Excerpta Norimbergenses (138–39), Ars Burana (190), Tractatus Anagnini (238), Introductiones Parisienses (362), Logica "Ut dicit" (385), Logica "Cum sit nostra" (426), Dialectica Monacensis (478). Another text, Ars Emmerana (157) endorses contraposition, but then says that it does not hold for the particular negative unless understood with "constancy," a term that had to do with assuming instances of the terms in question.

13. I.15 in Dineen 1990, 8.

14. 3.3 in Kretzmann 1966, 59.

15. 1.8-11 in Perreiah 1984, 127–130.

16. "From any affirmative there follows a negative by changing the predicate according to finite and infinite, keeping the rest the same, but there is no formal consequence from a negative to an affirmative, although there is a consequence under the assumption that all of the terms supposit for something." [Tractatus de Consequentiis I.8.107: King 1985, 226.]

The good direction he gives as:

Every B is A; therefore no B is non-A.

The fallacious direction is illustrated by

A chimera is not a man; therefore a chimera is a non-man.

17. Obversion is discussed in several twelfth and early thirteenth century anonymous texts edited in De Rijk 1967, where it is seen as a type of equipollence. It is endorsed in four of these: Excerpta Norimbergenses (138–39), Logica "Ut dicit" (385), Logica "Cum sit nostra" (426), Dialectica Monacensis (478). Three texts, Ars Burana, Introductiones Parisienses, Tractatus Anagnini omit it (while including a discussion of contraposition). One text, Introductiones Montane Minores (37–38) limits the principle to propositions without empty terms.

18. Chapter 4 in Kretzmann 1979, 233.

19. Kretzmann & Stump 1988, 118.

20. Ashworth 1974, 201–02.

21. These odd views should not be confused with a widely adopted theory which held that in certain circumstances a term is "ampliated" so as to stand for not presently existing things. For example, the past tense of ‘A donkey ran’ makes ‘donkey’ stand for both present and past donkeys, the ‘can’ in ‘A rose can be red’ makes ‘rose’ stand for both actual and possible roses, and the special nature of the predicate in ‘A chimera is imaginable’ makes ‘chimera’ stand for (impossible but) merely intelligible chimeras. But this widely held doctrine does not apply to ‘A chimera is an animal’ since there is no "cause" of ampliation in that sentence; so the doctrine does not prohibit empty terms.

22. Ashworth 1978, 147.

23. Whately 1826, 84–85.

24. Whately 1827, 85. He apparently refers there to an earlier edition of Aldrich 1849.

25. Coppée 1882, 76, Jevons, 1888, 83–5, Davis, 1894, 91, Joseph, 1916, 237–38, R. W. Sellars, 1925, 107.

26. The system of logic including obversion and contraposition is consistent if empty and universal terms are forbidden; see Miller 1938. Miller states that if the system is supplemented by all of the traditional nineteenth century rules for the syllogism, including rules of distribution, the system is inconsistent. But his proof involves applying the rules of distribution to syllogisms that are not in standard form. Miller thinks that authors intended this, but I see no evidence of it.

27. The wording of SQUARE does not rule out the possibility of truth-valueless sentences—so Strawson's view that empty subject terms lead to lack of truth value does not conflict with SQUARE. However, hardly anyone exploited the possibility of sentences without truth value. A few medieval writers appeared to have tried to solve the semantic paradoxes by holding that paradoxical sentences "say nothing," but the idea was not taken seriously by most theorists. (Cf. Spade's summary in Kretzmann, Kenny, and Pinborg 1982, 245–6.) Nor does it occur in Renaissance or Modern or nineteenth century texts.

Paul Spade points out (personal communication) that a very few authors held that future contingent propositions are now without truth-value (and will stay that way until the future event comes out one way or the other). The most prominent mediaeval author to hold this was the Frenchman Peter Auriol (early 14th century). But the Englishman Roger Swyneshed (fl. 1330s) also appears to accept it in an offhand comment in one passage. Many authors (e.g., Ockham) thought it was Aristotle's view of future contingents (De interpretation, ch. 7), but did not accept it themselves.

28. Strawson 1952, 152 calls what he is discussing "traditional formal logic." His source is Miller 1938, which bears the title The Structure of Aristotelian Logic, which might lead one to think he is discussing the ancient and medieval doctrine. But Miller makes explicit (pages 11–12) that the subject matter under discussion is the version of logic that existed when he wrote: in particular, "the system of deductive logic expounded in the principal introductory textbooks of logic; for example, the well-known manuals by Whately, Jevons, Joseph, Wolf, Creighton, Hibbons, and Sellars." Miller's logical work is excellent, but his historical remarks should not be trusted. For example, he sees the use of the notion of distribution in testing for the validity of syllogisms as part of a longstanding tradition (6), followed by the introduction of negative terms in the nineteenth century (3). In fact negative terms were in the original theory (they were in Aristotle), and the use of rules of distribution to test for validity were probably first used seventeen centuries later (by Buridan in the fourteenth century; perhaps earlier, but certainly no earlier than the twelfth century).

29. Smiley 1967. Church 1965 also criticizes Strawson's proposal, but without actually saying what is wrong with it.