Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Social Institutions

1. Jonathan Turner (Turner 1997: p. 6) offers a typical and relatively plausible general definitional account of a social institution: “a complex of positions, roles, norms and values lodged in particular types of social structures and organising relatively stable patterns of human activity with respect to fundamental problems in producing life-sustaining resources, in reproducing individuals, and in sustaining viable societal structures within a given environment”.

2. The fact that a society might engage in trade with other societies and, as a consequence, rely on other societies for certain purely physical resources does not affect this point. However, if it came to rely on cultural or educational resources then matters would be different. Moreover, increased economic interdependence and integration with other societies certainly puts pressure on the concept of a society. As far as political independence is concerned, perhaps a society which is temporarily politically subsumed by another society, e.g. in an empire, might nevertheless remain a society if it maintained a degree of integrity and distinctiveness in relation to its governance structures.

3. One way of drawing the distinction is as follows. Having an end is some form of mental state; but mentality is not necessarily an element of a function or possessed by the things that have functions, e.g. the function of the heart is to ensure that blood is circulated throughout the body. Naturally, the explanations for the possession of an end are multifarious; perhaps, for example, some collective ends are “wired-in”. Consider the desired end for sexual union. And if “wired-in” they might, nevertheless, exist in a relatively inchoate form; hence the need for social forms to refine and articulate prior collective ends.

4. Earlier versions of the material in this section appeared in Miller 2001 Chapter 6.

5. Here there is simplification for the sake of clarity. For what is said here is not strictly correct, at least in the case of many actions performed by members of organisations. Rather, typically some threshold set of actions is necessary to achieve the end; moreover the boundaries of this set are vague.

6. The terms “good” and “bad” are being used here in a relatively wide sense so as to embrace a range of objective goods, as opposed to things that are merely believed to be good, or simply wanted or aimed at. Such objective goods are principally ethical or moral goods. (The terms “ethical” and “moral” are being used interchangeably.) But they also include, for example, aesthetic goods.

7. Here and elsewhere in this entry it is not necessary to distinguish objective from subjectively felt moral considerations. Suffice it to say that social norms necessarily embody subjectively felt moral considerations, but not necessarily objectively correct ones.

8. The term “social mechanism” is used in a variety of senses, but especially to refer to underlying causal processes that produce recurring social outcomes and mechanism models that seek to explain the emergent effects of collective behaviour. See Mayntz 2004.

9. Paul Grice first introduced this notion of a resultant procedure as opposed to a resultant action in Grice 1989, p. 129.

10. On the other hand, radical revision, especially in relation to legitimate and central institutional purposes, might destroy an institution. Some think the contemporary western university is under threat by virtue of a process of radical revision of academic purposes in favour of economic ones.

11. An earlier version of the material in this section and the following section appeared in Miller 2003.

12. Joint rights also need to be distinguished from conditional individual rights. By mutual consent A might have a right to fish in B's river on condition that B has a right to hunt in A's woods. However, neither A nor B has a joint right; rather each has a conditional individual right. For one thing, the content of A's right brings with it no essential reference to the content of B's. For another, A can unilaterally extinguish B's right, as B can A's.

13. Managers and workers might in effect have waived this joint right by virtue of their employment contracts. But this does not affect the substantive point in relation to their prior joint moral right.

14. Searle, in particular, might claim that the point of the deontic power is to enable the performance of the function. No doubt, but the function of money viz. exchange can be performed by shells (without deontic status), and the function of surgeons by non-accredited persons with surgery skills. That is, it is false that deontic powers are necessary for the performance of these functions.

15. I am not concerned here with the possibility of human-like non humans, such as rational and morally sentient Martians.