Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Fri 21 May, 2004

Sense data are the (alleged) mind-dependent objects that we are directly aware of in perception, and that have exactly the properties they appear to have. For instance, sense data theorists say that, upon viewing a tomato in normal conditions, one forms an image of the tomato in one’s mind. This image is red and round. The mental image is an example of a ‘sense datum’. Many philosophers have rejected the notion of sense data, either because they believe that perception gives us direct awareness of physical phenomena, rather than mere mental images, or because they believe that the mental phenomena involved in perception do not have the properties that appear to us (for instance, I might have a visual experience representing a red, round tomato, but my experience is not itself red or round). Defenders of sense data have presented a variety of arguments for their view, appealing to such phenomena as perspectival variation, illusion, and hallucination. Critics of sense data have objected to the theory’s commitment to mind-body dualism, its difficulty in locating sense data in physical space, and its apparent commitment in some cases to sense data that have indeterminate properties.

1. What Are Sense Data?

The term ‘sense data’ (singular: ‘sense datum’) was introduced by early 20th century philosophers such as H. H. Price, G. E. Moore, and Bertrand Russell, with the stipulation that it should refer to that which we are directly aware of in perception. Originally, the term's meaning was supposed to be neutral between competing theories of perception, so that it was not to be assumed either that sense data must (analytically) be mind-dependent or that they must be mind-independent. However, those who used the term came so consistently to the conclusion that ‘sense data’ are mind-dependent that the term has come, in contemporary philosophy, to include an assumption of mind-dependence as part of its meaning. ‘Sense data’ now means an (alleged) kind of thing that
  1. we are directly aware of in perception,
  2. is dependent on the mind, and
  3. has the properties that perceptually appear to us.

Each of those conditions calls for clarification.

First, condition (i): Everyone in the philosophy of perception agrees that perception makes us aware of something. Most hold that there is a distinction between the things perception makes us directly aware of, and the things it makes us indirectly aware of, where to be indirectly aware of something is, roughly, to be aware of it in a way that depends on the awareness of something else. There are at least two ways of further explicating this notion. One way, adopted by Jackson (1977, pp. 15-20), is to say that we perceive something indirectly if we perceive it by virtue of perceiving something else. For example, consider my perception of the table in front of me. I do not perceive all of the table; I can only see its outer surface, and indeed only the portion of that surface facing me. Yet we still say that I see the table. I count as seeing the table by virtue of seeing something else, namely, the facing surface of the table. Therefore, Jackson would say that I see (or perceive) the table only indirectly. Sense data, on this view, are things that one may perceive not by virtue of perceiving anything else.

Another way of distinguishing direct and indirect awareness is to say, roughly, that one has indirect awareness of x when one's awareness of x is caused by one's awareness of something else. For instance, I might wish to determine the temperature of a pot of water indirectly, by means of a thermometer, rather than sticking my hand in the water. In such a case, I would first become aware of the reading on the thermometer, and this would cause me to be aware of the temperature of the water. Thus, my awareness of the water's temperature would be indirect. On this view, sense data would be things our awareness of which is not causally dependent on any other awareness.

Second, condition (ii): Sense data theorists believe that the things we are directly aware of in perception are dependent on the mind of the perceiver — they cannot exist unperceived. Such things have also sometimes been called "mental images," "ideas," "impressions," "appearances," or "percepts."

Third, condition (iii): "The properties that perceptually appear to us" refers to the qualities we seem to perceive things around us to have. For instance, if I perceive a tomato, and it looks red and round to me, then redness and roundness are properties that perceptually appear to me. According to those who believe in sense data, there is in this case a thing that I am directly aware of, which is both red and round, and which depends on my mind for its existence. Condition (iii) holds true even if I am subject to a sensory illusion or hallucination. Thus, if the tomato is really green, but, due to some sort of color illusion, it looks red to me, then my sense datum is red (not green). Furthermore, if there is no tomato present in reality, but I am hallucinating a tomato, then I will be having a tomato-like sense datum.

Those who accept sense data believe that sense data exist whenever a person perceives anything, by any of the senses, and also whenever a person has an experience qualitatively like perceiving (such as a hallucination).

The sense data theory contrasts with two competing schools of thought in the philosophy of perception. First, direct realism holds that in perception, we are directly aware (only) of things in the physical world--for example, a table, or a portion of a table's surface. Direct realists thus deny that there is anything satisfying both conditions (i) and (ii) above, and therefore deny that there are sense data. Second, the adverbial theory (in one version) holds that in perception, we are directly aware of a certain kind of mental state or occurrence, but that this mental state does not actually possess the properties that appear to us. Adverbialists have been known to characterize this mental state in such terms as "being appeared to redly." When a person is in the mental state of being appeared to redly, say the adverbialists, it does not follow that anything is actually red. Thus, adverbialists deny that there is anything satisfying all of conditions (i), (ii), and (iii), and therefore deny that there are sense data.

2. Arguments for Sense Data

The sense data theory was very popular, perhaps the orthodox view in the philosophy of perception, in the early twentieth century. Why? A variety of arguments have been given for recognizing sense data:

2.1 The Argument from Perspectival Variation

Perspectival variation is the kind of variation in one's sensory experiences that normally attends changes in one's spatial or other physical relationship to the physical objects one is observing. Perspectival variation, in this sense, is ubiquitous. For instance, suppose you are viewing a table. If you move closer to or farther from the table, your sensory experience changes (Hume [1758, XII.1] described this change, perhaps incorrectly, by saying that the table "seems to diminish" as you move away from it). If you move laterally, relative to the table, your sensory experience will change in another way (Russell [1997, pp. 10-11] describes this phenomenon by saying that the tabletop appears different shapes when viewed from different angles).

Some have argued that the phenomenon of perspectival variation shows that what we are immediately aware of in perception cannot be the real, external objects, but must instead be only images in the mind (sense data). Here is one way of making out that argument:

  1. In the phenomenon of perspectival variation, the thing we are directly aware of changes (for instance, its size or shape changes).
  2. The real, external object is not changing at this time.
  3. Therefore, the thing we are directly aware of is not the real, external object.

Here is an alternate way of making the argument:

  1. An experience counts as awareness of x only if the properties of the experience covary with (at least some of) the properties of x, so that when x changes, the experience changes, and when x does not change, the experience does not change.
  2. In the phenomenon of perspectival variation, our sensory experience changes, but the real, external object does not change.
  3. Therefore, our sensory experience does not count as awareness of the real, external object.

Modifications might be made to this argument to make it more plausible (the first premise might be phrased in terms of counterfactual relations, rather than actual changes; "direct awareness" might replace "awareness"; and one might specify more carefully in what respects the properties of experience must covary with those of the object of awareness). Something like this argument may be what Hume had in mind, if only implicitly.

Once we have agreed that the immediate object of awareness is not the real, external object, we are then meant to infer that it must be some sort of image of the physical object in our minds, which we perhaps confused with the physical object.

2.2 The Argument from Illusion

An illusion is a case in which one perceives an object, but the object is not the way it appears in some respects. For instance, when one views a straight stick half-submerged in water, the stick may appear bent. Since it is not in fact bent, this is an illusion.

Some philosophers have argued that the possibility of sensory illusions shows that what we are directly aware of in perception is never the real, physical object. Using the bent-stick illusion as an example, one might argue:

  1. When viewing a straight stick half-submerged in water, one sees (or is directly aware of) something bent.
  2. No relevant physical thing is bent in this situation.
  3. Therefore, in this situation, one sees something non-physical.
  4. What one sees in this situation is the same kind of thing that one sees in normal (non-illusory) perception.
  5. Therefore, in normal perception, one sees non-physical things.

A background assumption is that there is only one stick-like thing that one sees in the example, and that thing is either an actual, physical stick, or a mental image of a stick (a sense datum). The argument concludes that it is not the physical stick, so it must be a sense datum.

Step (4) seems plausible, since one can imagine first perceiving the stick normally, and then moving it into the water. It would seem absurd to maintain that one is seeing the physical stick up to the moment when it touches the water, at which point the object of one's awareness suddenly changes to a sense datum.

2.3 The Argument from Hallucination

A hallucination is a case in which one has an experience qualitatively like perception, but there is no external object that one is perceiving. For instance, an overdose of LSD might cause me to have an experience of seeming to see a pink rat on this table, where there is in reality nothing pink-rat-like.

Some believe that the possibility of hallucinations shows that even normal perception always involves sense data. Imagine two people, Sally and Sam, each of whom is having an experience of seeming to see a table. Sally is simply perceiving a table in the normal way. Sam, however, is having an incredibly realistic hallucination of a table, induced by futuristic brain scientists who have sophisticated technology for electrically stimulating Sam's brain. And suppose, as is theoretically possible, that Sally and Sam are in the same brain state, which I will call brain state B (where this is the state that is relevant to the character of their visual experience). Sam would be unable to distinguish his experience from a normal perception of a table.

In this scenario, what is Sam directly aware of? Surely not a physical table, since no physical table is present. It seems, then, that he must be aware of a mere mental image of a table. This mental image is caused by brain state B.

Now, what about Sally? Sally's brain state was caused in a different way from Sam's — Sally's was caused by a real table, whereas Sam's was caused by the brain scientists. But that does not change the fact that Sally is now in the same brain state as Sam. We have already said that in Sam, brain state B caused a mental image of a table. Therefore, it seems that if someone else were to have state B, it would also cause a mental image of a table for them. Therefore, it seems that Sally must also be having a mental image of a table, since she is in state B. Therefore, normal perception involves sense data, just as hallucination does. This argument relies on the principle that, if a causal chain of events leads to some effect, E, then any series of events that duplicates the last member of the causal chain will also produce E, regardless of whether the earlier members of the chain are duplicated. As long as Sally and Sam get into the same brain state, regardless of how they got there, both should experience whatever effects result from that brain state.

2.4 The Argument from Double Vision

Hume (1739, I.IV.ii) tells us that one can induce a case of double vision in oneself by merely pushing on one eye with one's finger. The possibility of double vision, he believes, shows that the immediate objects of awareness in perception are not the real, physical objects. The intended argument may be something like this:
  1. In a case of double vision, one sees two of something.
  2. There are not two (relevant) physical objects in this situation.
  3. Therefore, in a case of double vision, one sees something non-physical.

It would be implausible to maintain that one of the two things is a sense datum while the other is a real object. One reason this would be implausible is that there seems to be nothing relevantly different between the two images that could make one of them the ‘real’ object. Therefore, one should conclude that both of the things one sees are sense data, rather than physical objects.

2.5 The Time Gap Argument

There is always a time delay between any event in the physical world and our perception of it. This is most stark in the case of distant stars, which may burn out and yet still be ‘seen’ thousands of years later, as the light continues to travel the distance between the star and us.

Imagine two individuals, Sally and Sam, who are each looking up at the night sky and ‘seeing’ (or seeming to see) qualitatively similar stars. The star responsible for Sally's experience still exists. But the star ultimately responsible for Sam's experience ceased to exist 1000 years ago. Sam still ‘sees' it because the star was over 1000 light years away.

What is Sam directly aware of? Surely not an actual star, since no star presently exists in the place where he is looking. It must be a mere mental image of a star that he is directly aware of. Just as in the case of the argument from hallucination, we can now argue that since Sally is in the same brain state as Sam, she must also be having a mental image of a star. Therefore, sense data are involved in normal perception, even when the physical object responsible for the perception still exists.

One might be tempted to say that what Sam sees is light rays, rather than a sense datum. But if the time gap shows that Sam does not directly perceive the star, it must also show that Sam does not directly perceive anything else outside of him either, since there is some time gap, however small, between any external event and Sam's corresponding sensory experience. Sam's visual experience as of a star will occur at least slightly later than the light rays strike his retina.

2.6 The Illusoriness of Secondary Qualities

Many philosophers have held that the so-called ‘secondary qualities' — including such qualities as colors, tastes, smells, and sounds — do not exist in the external world, and that we must instead recognize them as properties of sense data. Consider the case of colors. A sense data theorist might argue:
  1. Everything we (directly) see has color.
  2. No physical thing is colored.
  3. Therefore, everything we (directly) see is non-physical

The first premise seems obvious on its face. The second premise may seem unbelievable, but there are several arguments for it. One of these arguments appeals to differences of color perception among people. Not only color blind people, but even people with normal vision differ among themselves slightly in how they perceive the colors of things. If colors are really out there, then there would have to be an answer to the question, Whose color perceptions are right? But not only is there no way of determining the answer to that; it seems hard to think of what facts might make one person's color perceptions more right than another's. A related argument appeals to the differences of color perception among different species of animals. Again, there seems no answer to the question of which species is right.

Another argument appeals to the fact that our experiences of color are caused (mostly) by the wavelengths of light that physical objects reflect. Therefore, it seems that if colors belong to physical objects, they must be reducible to spectral reflectance distributions. However, there is in general no single spectral reflectance distribution, or even a single (continuous) range of spectral reflectance distributions, corresponding to each of the colors we see. Two objects with very different spectral reflectance distributions may both appear orange to us in normal lighting conditions, for example. (This phenomenon is known as ‘metamerism.’) Some believe that this fact precludes our reducing colors to spectral reflectance properties.

Some philosophers hold that colors are dispositions to cause certain kinds of sensory experiences in us, rather than dispositions to reflect light in certain ways. But others object that this is not so, because (among other reasons) colors ought to be properties that we directly perceive things to have, whereas we do not perceive things as having dispositions to cause experiences in us.

There is much more to be said about color. But if the sense data theorist can succeed in refuting the alternative views of color, we will have to say that colors are properties only of our mental images of objects, and not of the physical objects themselves. Once we admit that, we would surely have to admit that what we are directly aware of in perception is the mental images.

3. Objections to Sense Data

3.1 Criticisms of Arguments for Sense Data

Each of the arguments discussed in section 2 has been criticized by opponents of the sense data theory. Of the arguments for sense data, the Argument from Illusion is the best known, and it is also the target of the most famous criticisms, due to J. L. Austin (1962). Among other things, Austin questioned the assumption that, when it appears to us that there is something having some property, there must be something that has that property. In the Argument from Illusion, the sense data theorist assumes that, if a stick appears bent to us, then there must be something that we are aware of that is bent. Austin maintained that, in the case of the bent-stick illusion, we see (only) the actual, physical stick, which appears bent but is straight; there is no need to posit any alternate, sticklike object that is actually bent. Austin used the following analogy to illustrate the absurdity of the Argument from Illusion:
If, to take a rather different case, a church were cunningly camouflaged so that it looked like a barn, how could any serious question be raised about what we see when we look at it? We see, of course, a church that now looks like a barn. We do not see an immaterial barn, an immaterial church, or an immaterial anything else. And what in this case could seriously tempt us to say that we do? (p. 30; emphasis Austin's)

A similar response might be made to the argument from perspectival variation. For this sort of reason, some sense data theorists have abandoned the argument from illusion, resting their case on other arguments. (Jackson 1977, pp. 107-11)

3.2 The Appeal to Physicalism

One reason the sense data theory has lost favor is no doubt the ascendance of physicalism in the philosophy of mind. Physicalists believe that the world is entirely physical; in particular, they believe that mental states either do not exist or are reducible to physical states (such as brain states). Physicalism is contrasted with dualism, which holds that mental states/events are distinct from physical states/events.

For various reasons, most contemporary thinkers in philosophy of mind embrace some form of physicalism and reject dualism. If they are right to do so, then there is a reason for rejecting sense data: namely, that sense data do not seem to fit into the physicalist picture. Sense data are supposed to have the properties that perceptually appear to us. But, in cases of normal perception, the only physical things that have the properties that perceptually appear to us are the external objects (tables, trees, and so on) that the direct realists say we are perceiving; and in cases of illusions and hallucinations, there are no physical things that have the properties that perceptually appear to us. In particular, our brain states manifestly do not ordinarily have the properties that perceptually appear to us (except in the odd case that we happen to be looking at a brain!). So sense data, if they exist, must be non-physical things. Of course, those prepared to embrace mind-body dualism need not worry about this objection.

3.3 Where Are Sense Data?

If sense data have the properties that perceptually appear to us, then among other things, visual sense data have sizes and shapes. If so, then they occupy space. It is therefore fair to ask where in space they are located. But there does not seem to be any plausible answer to this. (Huemer 2001, pp. 149-68)
  1. One might propose that one's sense data are literally inside one's head. This view would probably seem plausible only if one identified sense data with brain states (as Russell [1927, p. 383] does). But this is problematic since one's brain states do not generally have the properties that perceptually appear to one. The brain state involved in seeing a table, for example, is not table-shaped. Therefore, if one's sense datum is table-shaped, then the sense datum is not the brain state.
  2. One might propose that sense data are located wherever the physical objects causing them are. Thus, when I look at a table, my sense datum of a table is located right where the table is. But this view would have trouble assimilating the sense data supposedly involved in hallucinations. For this reason, the sense data theorist could probably be pushed to the following view.
  3. One might propose that sense data are located wherever they appear to be. One problem with this view concerns experiences of non-existent locations. For instance, one might have a vivid dream about a fictional locale. If sense data are involved in illusions and hallucinations, then presumably something like them is also involved in dreams. But in this case, since the dreamt of place does not exist, one cannot say that the sense data are located there.

A further objection to both answers (2) and (3) is that they conflict with the special theory of relativity, since in some cases, they would require one's brain state to cause a sense datum to appear outside one's forward light cone, and the theory of relativity precludes causal relations with events so situated.

  1. Unable to find any plausible location for sense data in physical space, some philosophers have proposed that sense data occupy their own, separate space, known as ‘phenomenal space.’ This view raises questions about how events in physical space can interact with those in phenomenal space, and it also conflicts with the theory of special relativity, which precludes the kind of separation between space and time that the doctrine of phenomenal space requires.

3.4 The Argument from Indeterminacy

As we have noted, sense data are supposed to have precisely the properties that are presented to us (that we seem to perceive) in perceptual experience. If one has an experience of seeming to see something red, then one's sense datum is red; equally importantly, if one is not having an experience of seeming to see something red, then one does not have a red sense datum.

A problem with this is raised by the observation that it is sometimes indeterminate what properties objects appear to us to have. To say that it is indeterminate what properties an object appears to have is to say that the object appears to instantiate some determinable (for example, it appears to be in a certain range of colors), but there is no specific determinate falling under that determinable that it appears to instantiate (for instance, there is no exact shade of color that it appears to have). Chisholm (1942) discusses a case in which one sees a speckled hen for a moment, but one is unable to say how many speckles one saw. Ayer (1963, pp. 124-5) implies that in such a case, there is no definite number of speckles that the sense datum had. Other, perhaps more convincing pieces of evidence for indeterminate appearances include our inability to say exactly how far away certain objects are, our inability in some cases to say whether two objects are the same color, and our inability to read blurred or far-away words.

If the apparent properties of objects of perception are sometimes indeterminate, then the sense data involved would have to be metaphysically indeterminate — that is, they would have to actually lack definite characteristics. This, however, is logically impossible — an object cannot be speckled but have no particular number of spots; an object cannot be colored but have no particular shade of color; and so on. This sort of problem only arises when we analyze appearance in such a way that there must always be an actual object that has all and only the properties that appear to the subject.

Sense data theorists may wish to respond to this problem by denying (pace Ayer) that the properties of one's sense data are always transparent to one.


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