Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Religious Diversity (Pluralism)

First published Tue 25 May, 2004

With respect to many, if not most issues, there exist significant differences of opinion among individuals who seem to be equally knowledgeable and sincere. Individuals who apparently have access to the same information and are equally interested in the truth affirm incompatible perspectives on, for instance, significant social, political, and economic issues. Such diversity of opinion, though, is nowhere more evident than in the area of religious thought. On almost every religious issue, honest, knowledgeable people hold significantly diverse, often incompatible beliefs.

Religious diversity of this sort can fruitfully be explored in many ways — for instance, from psychological, anthropological, or historical perspectives. The current discussion, however, will concern itself primarily with those key issues surrounding religious diversity with which philosophers, especially analytic philosophers of religion, are most concerned at present. Specifically, our discussion will focus primarily on the following questions: How pervasive is religious diversity? Does the reality of this diversity require a response? Can a person who acknowledges religious diversity remain justified in claiming just one perspective to be correct? If so, is it morally justifiable to attempt to convert others to a different perspective? Can it justifiably be claimed that only one religion offers a path into the eternal presence of God? The answers to such questions are not simply academic. They increasingly have great impact on how we treat others, both personally and corporately.

1. The Pervasiveness of Religious Diversity

Religious diversity exists most noticeably at the level of basic theistic systems. For instance, while within Christianity, Judaism, and Islam it is believed that God is a personal deity, within Hinayana (Theravada) Buddhism God's existence is denied and within Hinduism the concept of a personal deity is, in an important sense, illusory. Within many forms of Christianity and Islam, the ultimate goal is subjective immortality in God's presence, while within Hinayana Buddhism the ultimate goal is the extinction of the self as a discrete, conscious entity. However, significant, widespread diversity also exists within basic theistic systems. For example, within Christianity, believers differ significantly on the nature of God. Some see God as all-controlling, others as self-limiting, and still others as incapable in principle of unilaterally controlling any aspect of reality. Some believe God to have infallible knowledge only of all that has occurred or is occurring, others claim God also has knowledge of all that will actually occur, while those who believe God possesses middle knowledge add that God knows all that would actually occur in any possible context. Some believe the moral principles stipulated by God for correct human behavior flow from God's nature and thus that such principles determine God's behavior, while others believe that God acts in accordance with a different set of moral rules, that for God what is right is simply whatever God does. Some believe that only those who have consciously "given their lives to Christ" will spend eternity in God's presence. Others believe that many who have never even heard the name of Jesus will enter God's presence, while others yet do not even believe subjective immortality (a conscious afterlife) to be a reality.

While it is still somewhat popular in philosophical circles today to focus on diversity among basic theistic systems, there is a growing awareness that the same basic questions (and responses) that apply to inter-system diversity (for example, to differing perspectives on the most accurate basic theistic conception of God) apply just as clearly, and in exactly the same sense, to intra-system diversity (for example, to differing perspectives within Christianity over the extent of God's knowledge). And there is increasing awareness that the practical import of intra-theistic diversity is just as significant as is that of inter-theistic diversity. For most Christians, for instance, the practical significance of retaining or modifying beliefs about God's power or knowledge is just as great as retaining or modifying the belief that Christianity is a better theistic explanatory hypothesis than is Islam (Basinger 2001, 2-3).

2. Possible Responses to Religious Diversity

One obvious response to religious diversity is to maintain that since there exists no divine reality — since the referent in all religious truth claims related to the divine is nonexistent — all such claims are false. Another possible response, put forth by religious relativists, is that there is no one truth when considering mutually incompatible religious claims about reality; more than one of the conflicting sets of specific truth-claims can be correct (Runzo 1988, 351-357). However, most current discussions of religious diversity presuppose a realist theory of truth — that there is a truth to the matter.

When the topic is approached in this way, philosophers normally center discussions of religious truth claims on three basic categories: religious exclusivism, religious nonexclusivism, and religious pluralism. For the purpose of our discussion, someone is a religious exclusivist with respect to a given issue when she believes the religious perspective of only one basic theistic system (for instance, only one of the major world religions) or only one of the variants within a basic theistic system (for instance, within Christianity) to be the truth or at least closer to the truth than any other religious perspective on this issue.[1] Someone is a religious non-exclusivist with respect to a given issue when she denies that the religious perspective of any basic theistic system or variant thereof is superior to all other religious perspectives on this issue. And someone is a religious pluralist with respect to a given issue when she claims not only (as a non-exclusivist) that no specific religious perspective is superior but also makes the positive claim that the religious perspectives of more than one basic theistic system or variant thereof are equally close to the truth.[2]

3. Religious Diversity and Epistemic Obligation

No philosopher denies that the awareness of (realization of) seeming religious diversity sometimes does in fact have an impact on an exclusivist — from causing minor uneasiness to significantly reducing her level of confidence in the truth of certain beliefs to precipitating belief abandonment. This is simply an empirical claim about psychological states and behaviors (Alston 1988, 442-446; Plantinga 2000, 189).

How should, though, an exclusivist coming to an awareness of religious diversity — the awareness that seemingly sincere, knowledgeable individuals differ with her on an issue of religious significance — respond to the reality of such diversity? How should, for instance, the devout Buddhist or Hindu or Christian who comes to realize that others who seem as knowledgeable and devout hold incompatible religious perspectives respond? Or how should the Christian who believes the Bible clearly portrays a God with total control over all aspects of reality respond to the realization that other seemingly sincere, devout, "Bible-believing" Christians see the Bible as clearly portraying a God who has chosen not to control what occurs in those contexts in which humans have been granted meaningful moral freedom? Can an exclusivist justifiably disregard such diversity? If not, is the exclusivist under some obligation to attempt to resolve such epistemic conflicts — engage in belief assessment? Or would it at least be a good idea for her to do so?

Philosophers continue to differ significantly on which response is correct. There are, of course, religious individuals (and groups) who believe it is inappropriate to subject religious beliefs to assessment of any sort. Certain individuals (sometimes called fideists) have argued, for instance, that religious beliefs are not of a type properly subject to rational assessment and/or that assessing such beliefs demonstrates a lack of faith (Peterson et al. 2003, 45-48). But few philosophers currently hold this position. Most maintain that the exclusivist has at least the right to assess her beliefs in the face of religious diversity.

There continues, however, to be significant debate on whether an exclusivist is under an obligation to engage in such belief assessment. Some philosophers agree with Robert McKim that "disagreement about an issue or area of inquiry provides reason to think that each side has an obligation to examine beliefs about the issue" (McKim 2001, 140). The underlying assumption here is that when an individual's perspective on any issue, be it personal, social, economic, political, or religious, has important consequences for that person or others, then that individual is under an obligation to find the truth of the matter — to maximize truth. And an individual, in this case a religious exclusivist, can only attempt to maximize truth or avoid error in the face of diverse claims, it is argued, if she attempts to resolve the conflict.

The contention here, it must be emphasized, is not that such resolution is always possible or that an exclusivist must necessarily give up her belief if no resolution is forthcoming. Discussion concerning those issues is yet to come. The claim, rather, is only that the exclusivist is obligated at the very least to assess the evidence for and against the beliefs in question and to try to "get a sense of the appeal and of the concern of those who advocate them" (McKim 2001, 146).

Others philosophers disagree. For example, Alvin Plantinga acknowledges that if a proponent of a specific religious perspective has no reason to doubt that those with whom he disagrees really are on equal epistemic footing, then he is under a prima facie obligation to attempt to resolve the conflict. However, Plantinga denies that the Christian exclusivist need ever acknowledge that he is facing true epistemic parity — need ever admit that he actually is differing with true epistemic peers. Although the Christian exclusivist, we are told, may grant that those with whom he is in disagreement have not violated any epistemic duty and may know of no arguments that would convince those with whom he is in disagreement that they are wrong and he is right, the exclusivist is likely to believe that he "has been epistemically favored in some way." He might believe, for instance, that he has been graced by "the Internal Witness of the Holy Spirit; or perhaps he thinks the Holy Spirit preserves the Christian church from serious error, at least with respect to the fundamentals of Christian belief; or perhaps he thinks that he has been converted by divine grace, so that he now sees what before was obscure to him — a blessing not so far bestowed upon the dissenters" (Plantinga 1997, 296).

Moreover, if any beliefs of this type are true, Plantinga contends, then the Christian exclusivist is quite probably "in a better position, epistemically speaking," than those who reject the exclusivistic belief in question. Therefore, since it cannot be demonstrated that Christian belief of this sort is very likely false, the Christian remains justified in maintaining that the proponents of other religious perspectives are not actually on equal epistemic footing. And the same, Plantinga acknowledges, might well be true for exclusivists in other religious belief systems (Plantinga 1997, 296).

The strength of this line of reasoning depends in part on the debatable issue of who shoulders the burden of proof on the question of equal epistemic footing. Those siding with Plantinga argue in essence that unless an exclusivist must acknowledge on epistemic grounds that are (or should be) accepted by all rational people that those holding incompatible beliefs are actually on equal footing, the exclusivist can justifiably deny that this is so and thus need not engage in belief assessment. Those supporting obligatory belief assessment argue that it is the exclusivist who shoulders the burden of proof. Unless it can be demonstrated on epistemic grounds that are (or should be) accepted by all rational people that proponents of the competing perspectives are not actually on equal epistemic footing, the exclusivist must consider his challenger on equal epistemic footing and is thus obligated to engage in belief assessment (Basinger 2001, 26-27).

Another influential type of challenge to obligatory belief assessment in the face of religious diversity has been raised by Jerome Gellman. The focus of his challenge centers on what he identifies as rock bottom beliefs. Such beliefs, as Gellman defines them, are the epistemic givens in a religious belief system — the assumed, foundational truths upon which all else is built. Gellman grants that if a religious belief affirmed by an exclusivist is not rock bottom (is not a foundational assumption), then it may well be subject to obligatory belief assessment in the face of religious diversity. However, he argues, since belief assessment only makes sense when one isn't certain that the belief in question is true, and since rock bottom religious beliefs are among the foundational truths — the basic, assumed truths — in an exclusivist's epistemic system, no assessment is necessary. Rather, when an exclusivist encounters a challenge to such a belief — for example, a challenge to her rock bottom belief in God's ultimate control over all earthly affairs — she can, utilizing the G. E. Moore switch, justifiably maintain that because her rock bottom belief is true, the competing belief can be rejected (Gellman 1993, 345-364; Gellman 1998, 229-235).

Furthermore, Gellman has added more recently, even if we grant that rock bottom beliefs are at times open to belief assessment, the exclusivist need not engage in such assessment in the face of religious diversity unless she finds the awareness of such diversity causes her to lose significant confidence in her own perspective. In the absence of this type of internal conflict, she "may rationally invoke her unreflective religious belief to defeat opposing religious claims, without having to consider the question any further" (Gellman 2000, 403).

Some, though, remain uneasy with Gellman's contention that we need only assess those basic, rock bottom beliefs in which we have lost confidence. It is clearly the case that exclusivists do sometimes lose confidence in beliefs in which they once had a great deal of confidence, and that this was frequently due to the fact that these beliefs were rationally assessed. Consequently, if we assume, as it seems Gellman does, that one of our epistemic goals should be to maximize truth, then it doesn't appear, some maintain, that the fact that a challenged basic belief isn't at present "squeaking" is a sufficient reason for the religious exclusivist faced with diversity of opinion not to engage in belief assessment (Basinger 2001, 42-43).[3]

4. Religious Diversity and Justified Belief

What if we assume, as do most philosophers today, that belief assessment in the face of religious diversity will not normally resolve debate over conflicting religious perspectives in an objective manner? That is, what if we assume that while the consideration of criteria such as self-consistency and comprehensiveness can rule out certain options, there exists no set of criteria that will allow us to resolve most religious epistemic disputes (either between or within religious perspectives) in a neutral, nonquestion-begging fashion (Peterson et al. 2003, 40-53)? In what epistemic position does this then place the exclusivist?

The answer, as some see it, is that the exclusivist can no longer justifiably maintain that her exclusivistic beliefs are true. J.C. Schellenberg, for example, argues that because no more than one among a set of incompatible truth claims can be true, a disputant in a debate over such claims is justified in continuing to maintain that her claim is true only if she possesses nonquestion-begging justification for believing the incompatible claim of any competitor to be false. However, since no disputant in religious conflicts possesses such justification, no disputant can be justified "in holding her own claim to be true." Or, as Schellenberg states this conclusion in another context, we must conclude that in the absence of objective, nonquestion-begging justification, none of the disputants in religious conflicts "has justification for supposing the others' claims false" (Schellenberg 2000, 213).

David Silver comes to a similar conclusion: "[Exclusivists] should provide independent evidence for the claim that they have a special source of religious knowledge … or they should relinquish their exclusivist religious beliefs" (Silver 2001, 11). Julian Willard goes even further. He argues that when exclusivists become aware of diversity and cannot demonstrate that their perspective is superior to that of their competitors, they not only lose the right to hold the exclusivistic belief in question justifiably, they have an epistemic obligation to "set about abandoning" the religious practices based on this exclusivistic belief (Willard 2001, 68).

Others have not gone this far, arguing rather that while the exclusivist need not abandon religious belief in the face of unresolved conflict, she should hold her exclusive religious beliefs tentatively. Such tentativeness, as McKim puts it, does not entail never-ending inquiry. What it means, rather, is that in the face of unresolved religious diversity, one should be open to the possibility “that one or more of the [alternatives] may be correct … that the position one had thought to be correct may be wrong [while] one of the other positions may be right" (McKim 2001, 154-55). Joseph Runzo and Gary Gutting agree. According to Runzo, "all faith commitments must be held with the humbling recognition that they can be misguided, for our knowledge is never sure" (Runzo 1993, 236). Gutting argues that only interim, not decisive assent is justified in the face of unresolved diversity and that "those who give merely interim assent must recognize the equal value, as an essential element in the continuing discussion, of beliefs contrary to theirs" (Gutting 1982, 108). Moreover, argues McKim, such tentativeness in the face of diversity has an important payoff. It can lead to deep tolerance: the allowance “that those with whom you disagree are people whom it is worthwhile to approach with rational arguments" (McKim 2001, 178) And personal tolerance of this sort, we are told, may well lead to a more tolerant and open society that will permit and even encourage a diversity of opinion on all issues, including opinions on religious matters.

William Alston represents an even more charitable response to exclusivism. His perspective is based on what he sees as a crucial distinction between two types of epistemic disputes: those in which "it is clear what would constitute non-circular grounds for supposing one of the contestants to be superior to the others” and those in which it is not. In the former case — in those cases in which there is a commonly accepted "procedure for settling disputes" — it isn't clear, he acknowledges, that it is rational for a person to continue to maintain that her position is superior (Alston 1988, 442-443).

However, as Alston sees it, there exists no such common ground for settling basic epitemic disputes over religious truth claims, and this, he contends, alters the situation drastically. It still remains true, he grants, that the reality of religious diversity diminishes justification. But the fact that "we are at a loss to specify [common ground]” means, he argues, that with respect to those religious perspectives that are self-consistent, it is not "irrational for one to remain an exclusivist" — not irrational for the proponent of any religious perspective to continue to hold that her perspective is true. That is, as Alston sees it, given the absence of common ground for resolving disputes, the proponent of any self-consistent religious perspective can justifiably continue to believe this perspective to be true "despite not being able to show that it is epistemically superior to the competition" (Alston 1988, 443-446).

In fact, at one point he goes even further. Because there exists at present no neutral ground for adjudicating religious epistemic conflicts, it is not only the case, Alston argues, that an exclusivist is justified (rational) in continuing to consider her own perspective superior. Since we do not even know in most cases what a non-circular reason for demonstrating superiority would look like, the "only rational course" for an exclusivist "is to sit tight" with the beliefs "which [have] served so well in guiding [her] activity in the world." Or, to generalize this point, Alston speaks for those who maintain that, given the absence of common ground for adjudicating disputes concerning self-consistent religious perspectives, it is not rational for an exclusivist to stop maintaining that her system is superior (Alston 1988, 444).[4]

Philip Quinn represents yet another, increasingly popular approach. While he agrees with Alston that in the face of diversity an exclusivist may well be justified in continuing to "sit tight" — in continuing to maintain that her religious perspective is true — he denies that this is the only rational course of action available (Quinn 2000, 235-246). The basis for this position is his distinction between a pre-Kantian and a Kantian understanding of religious belief. To have a pre-Kantian understanding of religious belief is to assume that we have (or at least can have) access to the truth as it really is. It is to believe, for instance, that we do (or at least can in principle) know what God is really like. To have a Kantian understanding of religious belief is to assume that although there is a literal noumenal reality, our understanding of this reality (and thus our truth claims about this reality) will of necessity be relative to the cultural/social/psychological grids through which our conceptualization of this noumenal reality is processed. It is to believe, for instance, that although there is a divine reality about which we can make truth claims, our understanding of (and thus our truth claims about) this divine reality will necessarily to some extent be conditioned by the ways in which our environment (our culture in the broadest sense) has shaped our categories of thought (Quinn 2000, 241-242).

Alston, Quinn contends, is essentially working off of a pre-Kantian model of religious belief when he encourages religious exclusivists to sit tight in the face of peer conflict since, in the absence of any objective basis for determining which perspective is right, the exclusivist has no sufficient reason not to do so. Quinn does not deny that this pre-Kantian approach is justifiable and thus does not deny that someone who follows Alston's advice to sit tight is rational in doing so. However, Quinn believes that "it should not be taken for granted that any of the [contending perspectives] in its present form is correct." Hence, he believes it is equally justifiable for an exclusivist to adopt a Kantian approach to religious belief. Specifically, he believes it is equally justifiable for an exclusivist to assume that whatever any of us can know about the truth of the matter will never be a description of religious reality that is free of significant "cultural" conditioning. Accordingly, it is also rational, he maintains, for exclusivists encountering diverse truth claims to "seek a more inclusivist or pluralistic understanding of their own faith" by modifying their beliefs to bring them "into line with such an understanding" (Quinn 2000, 242).

In short, as Quinn sees it, those who hold a position such as Alston's have left us, at least implicitly, with a false dilemma: either we find common ground on which we can objectively determine which religious perspective is the truth or we sit tight with what we have. However, Quinn holds that, once we realize it is perfectly reasonable for a person to assume that the proponent of no religious perspective has (or even could have) an accurate understanding of divine reality as it really is, another rational alternative appears. We then see that it is also perfectly rational for a person to begin to revise her own phenomenological perspective on the truth in a way that will allow for greater overlap with the phenomenological perspectives of others.

The approach to conflicting religious perspectives Quinn outlines has in fact become increasingly popular in exclusivistic circles. Consider, for example, the ongoing debate among Christians over how God brought the rest of reality into existence. Some still claim the Bible clearly teaches that God created the "heavens and the earth" in six twenty-four hour periods about ten thousand years ago. Others still maintain that the fact that "a day is to the Lord as a thousand years" means that while God is directly responsible for what the Bible says was created each "day," it is most reasonable to believe that the time frame for each instance of creative activity could well have been millions, or even billions, of years. And then there are those who still hold that God's direct creative activity consisted primarily of orchestrating the "Big Bang." However, more recently, many Christians have taken a more Kantian approach. Based on their assumption that we may well not have access, even through Scripture, to exactly how God was involved in the creative process, they have modified what is to be considered essential to Christianity on this issue. Rather than affirming any of the specific explanations of how God created all else, they affirm a more general contention compatible with each of these specific explanations: that God is in some manner directly responsible for the existence of all else. They have, in Quinn's terms, thinned their core theologies in a way that reconciles the divergent perspectives.

Everyone realizes, though, that moving toward a thinner theology and thicker phenomenology can resolve the epistemic tension produced by religious diversity only to a certain extent. Even if we assume that it is perfectly reasonable, and possibly even preferable, for exclusivists to thin their theologies (and thus thicken their phenomenologies) in an attempt to minimize that core of truths that must be accepted to remain proponents of the specific theological perspectives in question, to be an exclusivist — even a strongly Kantian exclusivist — is still to believe that one's religious perspective is superior in the sense that it is in some important way closer to the truth than are the competing perspectives of others. Accordingly, while thinning her theology may be a rational choice that can minimize conflict, no one is arguing that it can be the sole response for an exclusivist. At some point, a person must either cease to be the exclusivist she was or choose one of the other options: acknowledge that the belief in question isn't true, hold it more tentatively, or sit tight with what she has.

5. Religious Diversity and Apologetics

Let us assume that an exclusivist is justified in retaining her exclusivistic belief in the face of religious diversity. Specifically, let us assume that the exclusivist can justifiably defend the epistemic right to retain her exclusivity in the face of such diversity. Ought she stop there or can she justifiably go further? Can she justifiably try to convince others that she is right — can she justifiably try to convert others to her perspective? And if so, is she in any sense obligated to do so?

Most who believe that such proselytization is not justified challenge the moral character of an exclusivist who attempts to convince those with whom she differs to accept her perspective as the sole truth. For instance, Wilfred Cantwell Smith argues that "except at the cost of insensitivity or delinquency, it is morally not possible actually to go out into the world and say to devout, intelligent fellow human beings [that] we believe that we know God and we are right; you believe that you know God, and you are totally wrong" (Smith 1976, 14). And when Runzo claims that exclusivism can be "highly presumptive" and "morally repugnant" (Runzo 1988, 348) or John Hick maintains that exclusivists often manifest a sort of arbitrariness or arrogance (Hick, 1989, 235), they too appear to be challenging the moral character of those who attempt to convert others to their perspective.

Not surprisingly, most exclusivists deny that it is insensitive or arrogant or presumptive for an exclusivist to attempt to convince others that her perspective is the correct one — to tell others that she is right and they are wrong. Since we are justified in believing our position to be superior to others — closer to the truth — it is difficult to see, exclusivists argue, how our attempts to convince others that they should agree can be considered arrogant or presumptive or insensitive, especially if we believe that it is important for the welfare of those we are attempting to convert that they do so. Moreover, exclusivists continue, while it is surely true that some conversion is attempted for what we would all agree are morally inappropriate reasons — for instance, for financial gain or to gain power over others — there is little empirical evidence that exclusivists in general have these motives. It is probably true, rather, that many, if not most, exclusivists who proselytize do so primarily because they believe they have what others need and are willing (sometimes at great personal cost) to share it with them.

Are, though, exclusivists required to proselytize? Many exclusivistic religious systems do require proselytization, and most philosophers who believe that exclusivists are justified in retaining their exclusivistic beliefs in the face of religious diversity believe also that these exclusivists can justifiably feel obligated to attempt to "convert" their epistemic competitors. With very few exceptions, though, philosophers deny that exclusivists are under any general obligation to proselytize, regardless of whether the exclusivistic system in question demands or encourages such proselytization.[5]

6. Religious Diversity and the Eternal Destiny of Humankind

The discussion of religious diversity thus far has been framed in terms of truth claims (in terms of justified belief) because it is increasingly recognized by philosophers as the best way to access the most important questions that the reality of such diversity forces upon us. Historically, however, there has been one specific "diversity issue" with which philosophers have been most concerned: the question of the eternal destiny of humankind, that is, the question of who can spend eternity in God's presence — who can obtain salvation.

Those who are religious exclusivists on this question claim that those, and only those, who have met the criteria set forth by one religious perspective can spend eternity in God's presence.[6] Adherents of other religious perspectives, it is acknowledged, can affirm truth related to some or many issues. But with respect to the question of salvation (one's eternal destiny), a person must be told about, acknowledge, and follow the unique way. Or, to be more specific, as salvific exclusivists see it, the criteria for salvation specified by the one correct religious perspective are both epistemologically necessary in the sense that those seeking salvation must be aware of these conditions for salvation and ontologically necessary in the sense that these conditions must really be met (Peterson et al. 2003, 270).[7]

It is important to note, though, that not only Christians are salvific exclusivists. There are Muslims, for example, who hold that only those who commit themselves to Allah can spend eternity with the Divine. Also important to note is that differing, sometimes even conflicting, exclusivistic claims can exist within the same world religion. For instance, significant intra-Christian debate has centered historically on the eternal fate of young children who die. For some, the answer was (and still is) that all children who die are separated from God eternally. Others have believed that God "elects" some for heaven and allows the rest to spend eternity in hell, while still others have held that only the deceased children of believers are allowed to enter heaven or that salvation for children who die is tied to the sacrament of baptism. A more common belief today among Christians, though, is that all those who die in early childhood (or die having possessed only the mental capacities of young children) enter automatically into God's eternal presence (Basinger 1991, 4).

But what of those “adults” who die having never been aware of the salvific conditions of the one true religion? Is it not clearly unjust for exclusivists to claim that they cannot spend eternity with God because they have not met the criteria for salvation stipulated by this religion? For salvific inclusivists, the answer is yes. Like exclusivists, inclusivists believe that eternal existence in God's presence is only possible because of the salvific provisions noted in the one true religion. However, religious inclusivists allow that some adherents of other religions can be saved because of these provisions, even if the individuals in question haven't made the personal commitments normally stipulated as necessary to appropriate these salvific provisions. Put in philosophical language, as inclusivists see it, particular salvific events may be ontologically necessary for salvation in the sense that salvation cannot occur without them but not epistemically necessary in the sense that one need not know about them to be saved or liberated (Peterson et al. 2003, 280).

Probably the best known Christian proponent of this inclusivist perspective is Karl Rahner. Christianity, he argues, cannot recognize any other religion as providing the way to salvation. However, since God is love and desires everyone to be saved, God can apply the results of Jesus's atoning death and resurrection to everyone, even to those who have never heard of Jesus and his death or have never acknowledged his lordship. Just as adherents to pre-Christian Judaism were able, through the redemptive acts of Jesus of which they were not aware, to enter God's presence, so, too, is it possible for adherents of other religions to enter God's presence, even though they are not aware of the necessary redemptive acts of Jesus that makes this possible (Peterson et al. 2003, 280-281). Inclusivists, it should be noted, differ on the conditions such “anonymous Christians” must meet. Some stipulate, for instance, that those who have never heard "the gospel" still have both some innate knowledge of God and the freedom to establish a relationship with God and, therefore, that the eternal destiny of those in this category is dependent on the extent to which they commit as much as they knows of themselves to as much as they know of God through, or even apart from, a religion other than Christianity. Other inclusivists don't want to be as specific, maintaining only that, because God is just, there will surely be some adherents of other religions who will be in God's presence because they have met some set of divine conditions they have it within their power to meet (Paternoster 1967). But all agree these "anonymous Christians" are the recipients of supernatural grace.

Salvific pluralists, however, find such reasoning no more convincing than that offered by exclusivists. Inclusivists are right, pluralists grant, to say that individuals need not necessarily know of or fulfill certain requirements normally specificed in a given religion to attain salvation. But inclusivists, like exclusivists, are wrong to argue that this salvation is, itself, possible only because of certain conditions or events described in the one true religion. There is no one true religion and, therefore, no one, and only one, path to eternal existence with God.

Why, though, ought we consider this pluralistic salvific hypothesis more plausible than that offered by the exclusivist or inclusivist? According to Hick, the most influential proponent of pluralism, three factors make a pluralistic perspective the only plausible option. First, and foremost, he argues, is the reality of transformation parity. An efficacious salvific process is not just other-world centered — does not simply give individuals a "ticket" to eternal existence with God. It begins "the transformation from self-centeredness to Reality-centeredness" in this life (Hick 1984, 229). That is, an efficacious salvific process changes lives in the sense that it begins to turn people from thinking about, and acting only to enhance, their own personal well-being to viewing themselves as responsible participants in a much greater, more expansive reality. In short, an efficacious salvific process makes its participants better people. And all the evidence we have, Hick maintains, shows that many religions are equally transformational, given any general standard for positive transformation we might want to consider (Hick 1989, chapter 3).

There continues to be debate, however, over whether the same basic personal transformation actually does occur within various religions — over whether there is real transformational parity. Few claim that there is a strong experiential basis for denying such transformational parity or that it can be demonstrated on other objective, nonquestion-begging grounds that such parity does not exist. However, proponents of many basic theistic systems claim that while transformational parity may appear to be the case, this is actually not so — that is, claim that the transformation within their systems actually is qualitatively different than that produced by allegiance to other systems. It is sometimes argued, for instance, that the transformation within other systems will not last, or at least that this transformation, while possibly real and even lasting for a given individual, is not what it could have been for that individual within the one true theistic system. And some exclusivists have argued that unless it can be demonstrated in an objective, nonquestion-begging sense that they are not justified in affirming a religious perspective that makes such claims (which even Hick does not attempt to demonstrate), they are justified in denying that such parity actually exists (Clark 1997, 303-320).

Others have argued that focusing on transformational parity can also be used as an argument against salvific pluralism. The basis for this claim is the fact that people making a "secular" (non-religious) commitment to some goal, value, or metaphysical perspective — be it concern for the environment or world hunger or emotional health — often appear to have their lives transformed in ways quite similar to the ways in which the lives of religious believers are transformed. They, too, appear to have changed from self-centeredness to a focus on reality outside of self. If this is so, however, then might it not be that the religious transformational parity we observe is simply a sub-set of the general transformational parity we find among individuals who commit themselves to any perspective on life that centers reality outside of self, and thus that it is just as plausible to assume that all religious transformational parity is the result of some form of internal conceptual realignment than the result of some form of connection with an external divine reality? And if this is the case, it is argued, then transformational parity is at least weakened as support for any salvific perspective, whether pluralistic, inclusivistic, or exclusivistic (Basinger 2001, 64-69).

Seeming transformational parity is not, however, Hick's only reason for believing non-pluralistic salvific perspectives to be untenable. A credible perspective, he tells us, must account for the fact, "evident to ordinary people (even though not always taken into account by theologians) that in the great majority of cases — say 98 to 99 percent — the religion in which a person believes and to which he adheres depends upon where he was born" (Hick 1980, 44). And given this fact — given that "religious allegiance depends in the great majority of cases on the accident of birth" — it seems implausible to hold that "being born in our particular part of the world carries with it the privilege of knowing the full religious truth" (Hick 1997a, 287).

This contention, though, has also been challenged. No one denies that the admittedly high correlation between where and when a person is born and the religious perspective she affirms is relevant and might in fact negatively affect an exclusivist's confidence. But many exclusivists deny that a pluralistic explanation should be seen as the only plausible option. As they see it, exclusivists need not consider the high place-time/religious allegiance correlation in question in isolation from other relevant beliefs. For example, the Christian exclusivist need not consider this correlation in isolation from her basic belief that the Bible is an authoritative source of truth and that the Bible teaches that only the Christian perspective contains a totally accurate view of reality. And it is justifiable, some maintain, for exclusivists to consider the plausibility of such relevant background beliefs to outweigh the seeming counterevidence posed by the correlation in question (Plantinga 2000, 187; Plantinga 1997, 198).

Finally, Hick argues, a credible religious hypothesis must account for the fact, of which "we have become irreversibly aware in the present century, as the result of anthropological, sociological, and psychological studies and the work of philosophy of language,” that there is no one universal and invariable pattern for the interpretation of human experience, but rather a range of significantly different patterns or conceptual schemes "which have developed within the major cultural streams." And when considered in this light, a "pluralistic theory becomes inevitable" (Hick 1984, 232).

While no one denies that culture shapes reality to some extent, it has again been argued that when comparing the plausibility of specific beliefs, we must consider not only these specific beliefs themselves but also the basic background beliefs in which they are embedded. Thus, even if we grant that a pluralistic response to the obvious shaping power of culture is preferable to any exclusivistic response when such shaping power is considered in isolation, it isn't clear to all exclusivists that Hick's hypothesis is so strong that it renders implausible the whole set of basic background beliefs out of which the exclusivist's response to the profound shaping influence of culture on religious belief arises. Hence, it isn't clear to all exclusivists that they can't justifiably reject Hick's contention that a pluralisitic cultural/religious interpretation of reality must inevitably be considered superior (Basinger 2001, 74).

Hick argues for salvific pluralism on what might best be called metaphysical or epistemological grounds. Other philosophers, however, have attempted to make a moral case for salvific pluralism (or at least against salvific exclusivism.) For instance, Kenneth Himma has argued recently that moral considerations require Christian salvific exclusivism to be rejected (Himma 2002, 1-33). It follows both from God's perfection and conceptual truths about punishment, Himma maintains, that God would not punish individuals who are not morally culpable for their behavior. But those with non-Christian beliefs are generally not morally culpable for the fact that they hold these beliefs. Not only is it not the case that any objective line of reasoning demonstrates the Christian (or any other religious) path to salvation to be the correct one, religious traditions are, themselves, extremely elastic. That is, because of the shaping, foundational nature of basic religious belief, devout proponents of any given religion are capable of (in fact, usually simply find themselves) offering self-consistent responses to almost any challenge to their salvific perspective, no matter how strong or damaging this challenge might seem on the surface. Furthermore, recent sociological, psychological, and anthropological studies have confirmed that while one's basic religious beliefs are not inevitable, they are quite often to a significant extent "beyond the direct volitional control of the believer" (Himma 2002, 18). So we must conclude, argues Himma, that it would not be morally just for the Christian God to deny salvation to devout people of other faiths.

Not surprisingly, many nonexclusivists and pluralists will find this basic line of reasoning persuasive. However, some (although not all) exclusivists reject the basic moral assumption on which Himma's argument is based: that we are in a position to correctly identify some of the basic moral principles that guide God's interaction with us as humans. Specifically, while many Christian exclusivists do believe that God's behavior is guided by the same basic principles of justice and fairness that are so fundamental to our human moral thinking, this is not true for all. There is a strong Christian tradition that holds that God is under no obligation to treat any individual in what we would consider a just, fair fashion. God can do what God wants (including how God responds to those who haven't affirmed Christian beliefs) for whatever purposes God has, and it is right simply because God has done it.[8] And even among those Christian exclusivists who come to acknowledge Himma's basic point — that a just God cannot condemn those who aren't culpable for their non-Christian beliefs — the response has normally not been to reject their overall exclusivistic perspective. It is often simply assumed, rather, that “God's ways are above our ways” in some manner unfathomable to the human mind.

However, even if we were to agree with pluralists that both exclusivists and inclusivists are wrong to claim that the basis for true salvation can be found in only one religion, the question of what type of pluralistic hypothesis we ought to affirm remains. Hick, himself, favors what might be called a selective pluralism that centers on the world's great religions. Hick has never denied that the major world religions — Christianity, Hinduism, Buddhism, Islam — make conflicting truth claims. In fact, he believes that "the differences of belief between (and within) the traditions are legion" and has often discussed these conflicts in great detail (Hick 1983, 487). His basic pluralistic claim, rather, is that such differences are best seen as differing ways in which differing cultures have conceived of and experienced the one ultimate divine Reality. Each major religious perspective "constitutes a valid context of salvation/liberation; but none constitutes the one and only such context" (Hick 1984, 229, 231).

Why, however, select only the paths offered by the world's great religions as ways to salvation? For Hick the answer lies in the fact that, unlike "Satanism, Nazism, the Order of the Solar Temple, etc.," the world's great religions offer paths that lead us away from "hatred, misery, aggression, unkindness, impatience, violence, and lack of self-control" to love, joy, peace, patience, kindness, goodness, faithfulness, gentleness, and self-control (Hick 1997b, 164). Some, though, see this sort of ethical standard for acceptable salvific perspectives to be as arbitrary as the standard for acceptable paths to salvation set forth by exclusivists or inclusivists (Meeker 2003, 5). In fact, some have questioned whether, given this rather specific ethical criterion for assessing the salvific adequacy of religions, Hick's perspective should actually be considered pluralistic at all.

S. Mark Heim, for instance, argues that pluralists such as Hick are really inclusivists in disguise in that they advocate only one path to salvation — the transformation from self-centeredness to Reality-centeredness — and thus in essence deny that diverse religions have real, fundamental salvific differences. A better, more honest salvific pluralism, we are told, is to acknowledge that each religion has its own path to salvation that may be either similar to or different from that of other religions. That is, a more honest pluralistic perspective is to deny that the seemingly different salvific paths offered by various religious traditions are all just culturally distinct manifestations of the same fundamental path and maintain instead that salvific paths of various religions remain incompatible, but equally valid ways to achieve salvation. This is not to say, of course, it is acknowledged, that all the details of all the salvific paths are actually true since some of the relevant claims are inconsistent. But the appropriate response to this is not to claim there is one true path to salvation. It is rather to claim that many distinct paths, while remaining distinct, can lead to salvation (Heim 1995).

Critics, however, wonder whether part of this seeming disagreement is verbal in nature. Heim can appear to be bypassing the question of whether there is some sort of final, ultimate eschatological salvific state that the proponents of various religious perspectives will all experience, emphasizing rather that many distinct religious paths can liberate people (produce salvation) here and now (Peterson et al. 2003, 280). Hick, on the other hand, seems most concerned with the nature salvific reality — with what it means to experience salvation — while not denying that there exist in this world distinct ways that remain distinct to access this ultimate reality.

7. Conclusion

As we have seen, discussions of religious diversity lend themselves to no easy answers. The issues are many, the arguments complex, and the responses varied. It would be hard, though, to overstate the practical significance of this topic. While some (many) issues that philosophers discuss have practical implications for how we view ourselves and treat others, none is more relevant today than the question of religious diversity. Exclusivistic religious convictions have not only motivated impassioned behavior in the past — behavior that has affected significantly the lives of many — such convictions clearly continue to do so today. So to the extent that such exclusivistic behavior is based on inadequate conceptual tools and/or fallacious reasoning, the continuing philosophical discussions of religious diversity that clarify issues and assess arguments may well be of great practical value.


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