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Thomas Reid

First published Mon Aug 28, 2000; substantive revision Mon Jan 27, 2003

Thomas Reid (1710-1796) is a Scottish philosopher and one of the founders of the "common sense" school of philosophy. (Also included in the common sense school are such less well-known 18th century philosophers as James Beattie, George Campbell, and Dugald Stewart.) Reid is best known for his epistemology of sensation — he believes that sensations serve to make us directly aware of real objects without the aid of any intervening medium — and for his view of free will — he holds that the only free actions are those that come about through a causal process originated by the agent. In the explication of both he offers perceptive and important criticisms of the philosophy of Locke, Berkeley and especially Hume. He is also well known for his criticisms of Locke's view of personal identity and Hume's view of causation. However, Reid also wrote on a wide variety of other philosophical topics including ethics, aesthetics and various topics in the philosophy of mind.

After studying at the University of Aberdeen, Reid entered the ministry in New Machar in 1737. In 1748 he published a short essay entitled "An Essay on Quantity" which concerned Hutchison's Inquiry into the Origin of Our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue. Although this was his only published work, he was given a professorship at King's College Aberdeen in 1752. There he wrote An Inquiry Into the Human Mind on the Principles of Common Sense (published in 1764). Shortly afterward he was given a much more prestigious professorship at the University of Glasgow. He resigned from this position in 1781 in order to give himself greater time to write, and published Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man in 1785 and Essays on the Active Powers of Man in 1788.

In the Inquiry, which is primarily a work in epistemology, Reid examines each of the five senses and discusses the ways in which we achieve knowledge of the world through employing them. Much of the view developed in the Inquiry reappears in the Essays on the Intellectual Powers, which expands his epistemological picture beyond the apprehension of the world through the senses to consideration of memory, imagination, knowledge concerning kinds of things, the nature of judgment, reasoning and taste. The Essays on the Active Powers examines a collection of topics concerning ethics, the nature of agency generally, and the distinctive features of human agency.

1. Common Sense and Ordinary Language

Reid is a staunch defender of "common sense", or, as he sometimes puts it, the opinions of "the vulgar". In fact, in almost every arena of philosophical inquiry, Reid's positions are in various ways tied up with his overall project of defending common sense. Common sense, for Reid, are those tenets that we cannot help but believe, given that we are constructed the way we are constructed. This is not to say that nobody fails to believe the dictates of common sense. People often have beliefs that are in manifest conflict with common sense, but to have such beliefs, Reid thinks, is to be in deep conflict with one's nature as a human being. What this suggests is that Reid takes on a burden of showing, each time that he claims some particular view to be a dictate of common sense, that belief in it is dictated by human nature. In addition, much of Reid's philosophy proceeds from the assumption that the dictates of common sense could not possibly conflict with one another. Human nature could not be such as to lead us to contradictory beliefs. The collection of tenets that make up common sense are consistent with one another, and non-optional to those who are believing as a human being does.

He sees a close tie between the dictates of common sense and distinctions and positions that could be found buried in the structure of ordinary language. Ordinary language, for Reid, is the mirror of our ordinary, everyday thought. (The connection between ordinary language and common sense that Reid espouses was of great influence on such later philosophers as G. E. Moore and J. L. Austin.) Reid does not believe, however, that every feature of ordinary language is indicative of some important tenet of common sense. Reid often suggests that the relevant features are those that can be found in "the structure of all languages", suggesting that the linguistic features of relevance are features of syntactic structure shared among languages. For example, Reid repeatedly says that it is a dictate of common sense that there is some important difference between the active and the passive, since "all languages" have a passive and active voice. The mere fact, then, that we say something in ordinary language does not imply that, for Reid, it is to be taken as a tenet of common sense. Rather, syntactic structures shared among languages often indicate, Reid thinks, features of our common sense conception of the world. When a certain tenet is implied by some feature shared by "all languages", Reid thinks it very likely that the best explanation for its being so shared is that it is a dictate of common sense.

Reid's attachment to common sense as found in ordinary language is easy to caricature unfairly. Reid did not hold that every position that can be deduced from a linguistic feature shared by all languages is a dictate of common sense, something that we cannot help but believe if we are to be true to our natures. He says, for instance,

A philosopher is, no doubt, entitled to examine even those distinctions that are to be found in the structure of all languages; and, if he is able to shew that there is no foundation for them in the nature of the things distinguished; if he can point out some prejudice common to mankind which has led them to distinguish things which are not really different; in that case, such a distinction may be imputed to a vulgar error, which ought to be corrected in philosophy. But when, in the first setting out, he takes it for granted without proof, that distinctions found in the structure of all languages, have no foundation in nature; this surely is too fastidious a way of treating the common sense of mankind. (Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man, pp.26-27)

However, he does hold that the burden of proof is squarely on the shoulders of those who deny something suggested by a syntactic feature shared across languages. If it is possible to find a claim in another philosopher's argument which sits uneasily with the facts about ordinary language, and the philosopher has failed to show that the claim suggested by ordinary language rests on a deep error, then, on Reid's view, we have found a sufficient reason to reject the philosopher's argument.

What this means is that Reid is not concerned to answer certain questions of justification that can seem enormously pressing to us in certain philosophical moods. He is not, for instance, interested in providing a justification for our belief in the external world by appeal to first principles of some sort. For instance, Reid feels he can refute skeptical hypotheses — such as Descartes's hypothesis of an evil demon who makes us believe that the world is the way we take it to be when it is really vastly different — simply by showing that such a hypothesis is no more likely to be true than the common-sensical belief that the world is much the way we perceive it to be. Since the belief in the external world is a dictate of common sense, it is, Reid thinks, as justified as it needs to be when it is shown to be on the same footing as any alternative. Justification, therefore, does not necessarily require providing positive reasons in favor of common-sensical beliefs; common sense beliefs could be adequately justified simply by undermining the force of the reasons in favor of alternatives to common sense. Common sense, as found in the structure of ordinary language, then, constrains, rather than dictates, acceptable philosophical positions.

2. Epistemology

2.1 Attacking the Way of Ideas

One of Reid's most important critical contributions is his attack on the model of the mental offered by Locke (although Locke derived it in large part from Descartes) and accepted in broad outline by Berkeley and Hume. As Reid reads Locke, all thought-like mental attitudes — as opposed to emotions, desires, choices and the like — whether they be thoughts concerning real objects, imaginative reveries, or even sensations, can be analyzed as "perceptions" of ideas. "Perception" here is used in a somewhat technical sense not to describe any of the the exercises of the five senses — nor even to describe all that is going on when we are aware of external objects — but, instead, to describe a special mental operation, a kind of mental "vision", so to speak. On the Lockean model, for instance, to think about an apple is to perceive an idea of an apple; the idea is a distinctive mental object grasped or perceived through the exercise of one's mental "eyes". It is through the perceiving of an idea — in this technical sense of "perceive" — that we perceive — in a more ordinary sense of the term — objects that correspond to those ideas; we are aware of the apple by perceiving an idea of it. Berkeley, and especially Hume, revise and expand this picture in various ways, but they maintain the overall schema: mental phenomena are perceptions of mental objects.

From within the Lockean model, there are at least three things that might be said regarding the sense in which we are aware of external objects. The Lockean might say, (1) that we are aware of external objects directly by perceiving representations of them, ideas; (2) that we infer the existence and nature of external objects by perceiving ideas of them, the nature of which we grasp directly; or, (3) that there is no distinction between external objects and ideas, and, thus, when we perceive ideas we are perceiving external objects. On the first approach, the Lockean would need to offer an explanation of what it is that is so special about ideas that makes it the case that whenever we are perceiving one we are directly aware of that which it represents. If this burden can be discharged, then it is possible to say that we are aware of external objects and remain consistent with the Lockean conception of the mental. Reid, however, thinks that the history of philosophy from the Ancients through his own time has been marked by a series of failed efforts to explain how it is that perception of something in the mind could amount, automatically, to perception of some external object. All such attempts make the mistake, he thinks, of giving unexplained and unexplainable powers to the internal mental objects: how could they possibly, all by themselves, attach our minds to objects whenever they are perceived? Since this question cannot be answered, he thinks, we are left with the second and third alternatives: either we infer the nature of external objects from the features of directly perceived ideas, or else Berkeleyan Idealism is true: external objects are ideas.

Reid thinks that nobody who has absorbed Hume's lessons regarding causation would think that we can avoid skepticism about the external world while insisting that we infer its nature from the features of directly perceived ideas. After all, on the Lockean model, external objects are the causes of our ideas. But if Hume is right about causation, then we can only infer the nature of a particular unobserved cause of a particular observed effect when we have had repeated experience of conjunction of similar causes with similar effects. Therefore, we can infer nothing about external objects by examination of the ideas which they cause in us: we have never had any experience of the relevant causes, but only experience of the relevant effects. Thus, Reid thinks, Lockeans about the mental are committed either to outright skepticism or Berkeleyan Idealism.

While his desire to overthrow skepticism and idealism — both of which he takes to be in violation of common sense — is part of Reid's motivation for attacking the Lockean model of the mental, he is careful not to attack the model merely on the grounds that it is in violation of common sense. In fact, Reid offers a range of criticisms that could be accepted quite readily even by those who deny that philosophical theses ought to be constrained by common sense. He says, for instance,

When, therefore, in common language, we speak of having an idea of anything, we mean no more by that expression, but thinking of it. The vulgar allow that this expression implies a mind that thinks, an act of that mind which we call thinking, and an object about which we think. But, besides these three, the philosopher conceives that there is a fourth—to wit, the idea, which is the immediate object. The idea is in the mind itself, and can have no existence but in a mind that thinks; but the remote or mediate object may be something external, as the sun or moon; it may be something past or future; it may be something which never existed. This is the philosophical meaning of the word idea; and we may observe that this meaning of that word is built upon a philosophical opinion: for, if philosophers had not believed that there are such immediate objects of all our thoughts in the mind, they would never have used the word idea to express them. (Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man, p. 31)

Reid can be taken here to be imagining a kind of conversation between "the vulgar" on the one hand and " the philosopher" on the other. The vulgar say, "When I think about an apple in front of me, for instance, the immediate object of my perception is the real apple." The philosopher responds, "No, the immediate object of your perception is a mental object, an idea of the apple." But, Reid points out, the philosopher's response, which seems to be instructing the vulgar on their mistake, is actually predicated on a prior rejection of the vulgar's conception of everyday thoughts about objects. The Lockean claim that there is a "fourth" element in every thought — an idea — is "built upon a philosophical opinion", that is, the model arises from rejection of the common sense view and thus can't be given as a reason to reject the "vulgar" position. What Reid is doing here is shifting the burden of proof on to those who hold the Lockean model; there is nothing inherently superior about the Lockean picture, and hence the common sense picture — under which we are aware of real objects directly and without mediation — is, as yet, no less well defended.

In one of Reid's more powerful arguments against the Lockean model, he points out that the Lockean model is supposed to explain the fact that our mental states manage to connect to real objects, manage to be about real objects. However, this fact about beliefs is only explained by the model if the model is less obscure than the phenomena to be explained by it. But, Reid points out, if we start by noticing that we don't understand how it is that we manage to connect our minds to objects in the world, it can't help to say that we do it by first connecting our minds to mental objects (ideas) unless we understand how it is that we manage to connect our minds to those mental objects. That is, why is mental perception, or awareness, of ideas thought to be any more intelligible than awareness of objects? If it is no more intelligible, then the Lockean model is not serving to explain what it was intended to explain. (One place in which this objection appears is at Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man, p. 185.)

Reid also uses the distinction between real and apparent magnitude developed in Berkeley's New Theory of Vision to respond to one of Hume's arguments for the claim that the immediate objects of awareness are mental objects rather than real objects. (See Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man, pp. 180-181.) As Reid reads him, Hume argues that since, for instance, objects get smaller in our visual field as we move away from them, and real objects don't change size merely as a result of the fact that we move away from them, we must not be directly aware of the real sizes of objects. Reid claims that Hume is equivocating on two different notions of magnitude. The apparent magnitude of the object is the size that the object appears to have when looked at from a certain place. Apparent magnitude is a relational property of objects: the apparent magnitude of an object is a function not just of intrinsic features of the object, but also of the location of a particular observer. Real magnitude, on the other hand, is an intrinsic property of objects, not dependent on the position of any observer. So, when we move away from an object, we are perceiving properties of that object: its apparent magnitude relative to the locations through which we pass. Thus, Reid concludes, the fact that the real magnitude of the object doesn't change as we move away from the object is irrelevant to the question of whether or not the immediate objects of awareness are mental items, like ideas, or qualities of objects. Just because we aren't perceiving the real magnitude of the object as we move away from it doesn't mean that we aren't perceiving a property of the object itself. We are perceiving a property of the object itself, namely, it's apparent magnitude.

None of Reid's arguments against the "way of ideas", as the Lockean model of the mental was sometimes called, are definitive. But they all aim to shift the burden of proof back to those who subscribe to the Lockean model. Since Reid saw the Lockean model as manifestly in violation of common sense, and since he took it to be a violation of correct philosophical methodology to accept any view contrary to common sense which was no better defended than the common-sensical view, he felt that to shift the burden of proof back to the subscribers to the Lockean model was to refute the model.

2.2 Sensation, Conception and Perception

Reid supplants the Lockean model with an act-based conception of the mental. That is, states of the mind cannot be analyzed into mental act and mental object, as on the Lockean model. The mind's states are all acts, loosely conceived; the only objects involved in thought are in the world, not the mind. The three most important mental acts are labelled by Reid "sensation", "conception", and "perception".

While none of these operations is defined or analyzed by Reid with exact philosophical rigor — in fact, Reid suggests that such analyses aren't really possible in this domain — it is possible to make some rough remarks about what Reid has in mind. Sensations are the feelings that are the immediate mental causal consequences of the influence of objects on us. Sensations are always associated with a particular organ of sense; they are always distinctly of, for instance, touch or vision. Conceptions, on the other hand, are ways of being aware of objects. To conceive of an object is to be aware of that object as the bearer of some particular property. One might conceive of an apple as red or as hard or as both red and hard. Further, one could conceive of an object — and thus be directly aware of that object — as possessing a particular relational property: to conceive of an object as having a particular apparent magnitude, for instance, is to be aware of the object itself as possessing the property of appearing a certain way from a certain location. Perceptions are a species of conception. To perceive an object is to be aware of it in a particular way, as the possessor of a particular quality, and, at the same time, to be convinced that the object exists and is as you conceive it to be. Objects, then, act on our bodies and cause us to have sensations — a feeling of coldness, a visual image of color. These sensations, in turn, lead us — Reid sometimes says "suggest to us" — to conceptions of their causes; we become aware of the causes of our sensations as possessing various qualities. Sometimes, although not always, these conceptions are accompanied by a conviction in their accuracy, and when they are, they are called "perceptions".

To defend common sense, Reid thinks, he needs to show that we are directly aware of real objects and are, most of the time, roughly right about the nature of the objects of which we are aware. Reid does not think that anything comparable needs to be shown about sensation. That is, sensation — the direct effect of objects on our minds — needn't, in itself, accurately represent the world. Rather, our sensations must help us — and much of the rest of this section is aimed at explaining how — to place our minds in direct contact with the world. Sensations are merely tools for obtaining what Reid thinks we all believe, common-sensically, to be the case: that in having conceptions, we are aware of real objects that are roughly the way we conceive them to be.

Reid, then, is offering a form of "direct realism": the view that our minds connect to the world directly, rather than through some sort of medium (such as ideas) to which our minds connect and which itself, somehow, connects to the world. While there is debate over the precise sense in which, for Reid, we are directly aware of objects, this much seems clear: whatever the sense of "direct" is in which the subscribers to the Lockean model take us to be directly aware of ideas, it is in that sense that Reid takes us to be directly aware of real objects.

2.3 Primary and Secondary Qualities

Intertwined with Reid's view that we can be immediately aware of objects through their relational properties — such as their apparent magnitudes — are Reid's views regarding the distinction between primary and secondary qualities. Locke thought that our ideas of "primary qualities" — shapes, sizes and motions — and configurations of the primary qualities of the stuff out of which bodies are built — texture and construction — resemble the qualities which cause them. However, according to Locke, our ideas of a variety of other qualities — particularly, colors, sounds, tastes and smells — do not. Ideas of colors, sounds, tastes and smells are caused by certain complex configurations of primary qualities — when such configurations are characterized as powers to produce ideas in us, then they are called "secondary qualities" — that bear no resemblance whatsoever to the ideas which they cause. Reid is deeply struck by Berkeley's attack on this distinction (at, for instance, Principles of Human Knowledge, Part 1, Sections 9-15), and agrees with Berkeley that no mental state or object could possibly resemble anything that is not, itself, a mental state or object; as Berkeley puts it "An idea can be like nothing but an idea" (Principles of Human Knowledge, Part 1, Section 8). Mental states and objects have only mental properties, but only something that is, itself, a mental state or object can have a mental property; hence, nothing can resemble — that is, share a property in common with — a mental state or object other than another mental state or object. Berkeley took this point to show that no non-mental cause of an idea could resemble it, whether the relevant idea were an idea of a shape, say, on the one hand, or a color on the other, and, thus, there could be no distinction between primary and secondary qualities of the sort drawn by Locke.

Reid accepts, for roughly Berkeley's reasons, that sensations cannot possibly resemble their causes. Further, he accepts Berkeley's objections to Locke, and takes them to show that no mental events or states, whether sensations or the conceptions of objects that follow them, could possibly resemble any non-mental object. In addition, there is another reason that Reid cannot draw the distinction between primary and secondary qualities in the way that Locke did: he does not accept that the conceptions of objects which we have following the sensations which they cause in us are to be analyzed as perceptions of ideas; they are, rather, awareness of the qualities in the object that caused the sensations. For Reid, there is no immediately perceived mental object that could succeed or fail to resemble its cause; it is the qualities of objects themselves of which we are directly aware when we have conceptions of those objects. All of this would make it seem that Reid would simply side with Berkeley and deny that there is any important difference between primary qualities and qualities like colors, sounds, tastes and smells. However, he does not take Berkeley's side, but, instead, defends the distinction between primary and secondary qualities on grounds quite different from Locke's, grounds that he takes to be immune to Berkeley's criticisms of the distinction.

Reid accepts that the qualities which we ordinarily conceive objects to have — whether shapes, sizes and motions, on the one hand, or colors, sounds, tastes and smells, on the other — are genuinely possessed by those objects (barring illusions and disorders of various sorts, which are, incidentally, difficult for Reid to explain). However, he thinks that shapes, sizes and motions are intrinsic properties of objects while colors, sounds, tastes and smells are relational properties of objects; and, it is to be emphasized, neither resemble the mental states which they immediately cause in us, namely sensations. Colors, sounds, tastes and smells are powers to produce certain characteristic sensations in us in normal conditions; to ascribe such a quality to an object is not to perceive any intrinsic qualities of the object, but is, rather, to perceive that the object bears a certain relation to something else: namely, ourselves. So, for instance, say that the skin of the apple in front of me has a certain molecular structure that results in its reflecting light at a certain wavelength which in turn causes in me a certain characteristic visual sensation of red. If I am speaking correctly when I say, "That apple is red", I am reporting the fact that I conceive of the apple as possessing a particular relational property: I am aware that the apple has the property of being-such-as-to-cause-in-me-sensations-of-red-in-normal-conditions. Ultimately, the apple possesses this relational property because of facts about its molecular structure that account for its reflecting light in a certain way, and facts about me that account for the fact that such wavelengths of light cause certain sensations in me. But when I am aware of the redness of the apple, I am aware of none of that; I am aware only of the fact that there is something about the apple that makes it cause in me certain sensations in normal conditions.

Our conceptions of qualities such as colors are to be contrasted with our conceptions of primary qualities or configurations of primary qualities, such as hardness. Say I'm holding the apple in my hand while I'm looking at it. I'm having, then, two importantly different sensations: a visual sensation of red, and a tactile sensation of hardness. For Reid, neither sensation resembles anything in the object; both give rise to conceptions of the object as possessing certain properties. The visual sensation gives rise to a conception of the object as possessing a particular relational property: its power to produce certain sensations in me in normal conditions; the tactile sensation gives rise to a conception of the apple as possessing a particular intrinsic property: the complex configuration of primary qualities that is hardness.

So, there is a difference between primary and secondary qualities for Reid, although he draws the distinction in an importantly different way from the way in which it was drawn by Locke. For both Locke and Reid, we are aware of objects as they are intrinsically only when our awareness is caused by the primary qualities of objects. But for Reid, and not for Locke, we are genuinely aware of objects as they are when our awareness results from the secondary qualities of objects; but we are aware of those objects only as they are relative to us, and not as they are in themselves.

2.4 Sensation, Natural Signs and Suggestion

The immediate effect that objects have on us is to cause sensations. Further, we become aware of the qualities of objects following the sensations that those objects cause. However, for Reid, the conceptions of objects that follow from our sensations are not derived from our sensations; our sensations, after all, generally do not bear any kind of resemblance to the qualities which cause them. That is, according to Reid, we don't conceive of objects as possessing particular qualities by, say, representing our sensations, or drawing conclusions about the world through some sort of scrutiny of our sensations. Rather, our sensations give rise to our conceptions of objects by a process that he calls "suggestion": the qualities of objects are "suggested" by our sensations and so when we have sensations we come to be aware of those objects as possessing those qualities. But what is suggestion supposed to be?

Suggestion is a pseudo-linguistic notion, for Reid. Signs suggest conceptions of that which they signify. The word "pigs", for instance, leads those who are familiar with the word to think of certain pinkish barnyard animals. However, we don't come to think of such creatures on encountering the word "pigs" by somehow scrutinizing the word and thereby locating, in the world, some object that has some peculiar fitness to the word. After all, the word "pigs" is utterly arbitrary. While there are probably reasons why it came to signify what it signifies, there is no similarity between pigs and the word "pigs": pigs have four legs, for instance, not four letters.

Reid draws a distinction between natural and artificial signs. Artificial signs signify what they signify as a result of some sort of compact or tacit agreement between people: "pigs" signify pigs, according to Reid, only because people have agreed to use a particular sound and a particular configuration of letters to signify pigs. Natural signs, on the other hand, signify what they signify for other reasons entirely. For instance, blushing signifies embarrassment only because of the fact that blushing and embarrassment are customarily found together. The connection between them, just like the connection between the word "pigs" and pigs, is utterly arbitrary: were it the case that, when embarrassed, people stamped their left feet, then the stamping of the left foot would signify embarrassment. (In fact, the distinction between natural and artificial signs has a long history. It can be found in, at least, Locke, Hobbes, Gassendi and the Port Royal Logic.)

We discover that blushing is a sign of embarrassment through experience in ourselves and others of the co-occurrence of the two states: it is because of our acquaintance with human nature and with the conjunction of blushing and embarrassment that we think of embarrassment when we encounter blushing. However, some natural signs lead us to think of what they signify without any experience whatsoever. Reid describes this category of natural signs in unhesitatingly mystical terms. He says that there is a category of natural signs

which, though we never before had any notion or conception of the things signified, do suggest it, or conjure it up, as it were, by a natural kind of magic, and at once give us a conception, and create a belief of it. (Inquiry, ch. 5, section 3, p. 60)

Reid has an example in mind of a natural sign which works "magically" in this way: the sensation of hardness. This tactile sensation leads us immediately to conceive of that which caused it as being hard, as having a certain resistive construction. (Reid assumes, perhaps wrongly, that the quality of hardness is a non-relational quality.) But we are aware of this quality, in the object which caused the sensation, automatically, "as it were, by a natural kind of magic". We cannot hope to understand why it is that we think of this special kind of construction after having the right kind of tactile sensation, but must "conclude, that this connection is the effect of our constitution, and ought to be considered as an original principle of human nature" (Inquiry, ch. 5, section 3, p. 61). In fact, this is the defining feature of the kind of natural signs of which the tactile sensation of hardness is an instance: these are signs that lead us to conceive of what they signify simply because we are built in such a way as to have such conceptions on encountering such signs; such a tendency is an inescapable feature of our constitution.

When does one's conception of an object as having a particular quality amount to a perception, a conception accompanied by a conviction of its accuracy? The answer is: when one comes to have that conception because one has encountered a natural sign which leads one to the conception, and that natural sign leads one to the conception merely because of one's constitution. Conviction in the accuracy of a conception is bestowed on the conception, Reid thinks, just when the relevant conception comes about because of our nature or constitution. When we conceive of an object in a particular way merely because it is in our nature to conceive of the object that way, then the conception is non-optional, unavoidable, and is thus one that we cannot help but trust; the conception of an object which one has when one encounters a natural sign which signifies merely because of one's constitution is given with one's constitution; we can no more reject it than we can give up our own humanity. Perceptions, then, are dictates of common sense: to be aware of an object in perception is to have a belief which you cannot give up given your constitution.

So, for Reid, a quality of an object impinges on our bodies causing a sensation that has no resemblance whatsoever to the quality. This sensation, in turn, leads us to conceive of the object as having the quality — and thus to be directly aware of the object as possessing the quality — merely because we are wired in such a way as to have such a conception after having the sensation; that is what it is for the sensation to "suggest" the conception of the quality. And, further, since the conception comes to be had as a result of our natures as human beings, we cannot help but trust it, and thus we are convinced of its accuracy and can be said to be perceiving the object.

This account of perception can seem problematic when we try to use it to understand one ubiquitous form of perception, namely, the visual perception of shape. The visual shape of an object — Reid calls it the "visible figure" of the object— is a confusing property. There is no doubt that visual shape and actual shape can be different: the coin in my palm looks elliptical, although it is actually circular. One might think that the ellipticality of the coin is not an intrinsic property of the coin at all; rather, we might treat visual shape in the same way that Reid treats secondary qualities. We might say, that is, that the object has an actual shape (round, for instance) and a tendency to cause certain sensations in us (as of ellipticality, for instance); and all that we are really attributing to the object when saying that it possesses a particular visual shape is the power to produce the relevant sensation. If we were to go this route, we would have to say that there is some particular sensation that corresponds to visual shape, a sensation that is caused by the object's actual shape. However, Reid thinks that this can't be right. The reason is that if it were so, then there would be similarity between a particular sensation and the quality that causes it. Why? Because one could deduce what visual shape an object has given nothing but its actual shape and the laws of geometric optics. Even a blind person, Reid notes, could construct the visual shape of an object when equipped with information about the actual shape of the object, the location of the observer, and the laws of geometrical optics. Notice that a blind person could not perform a similar trick with respect to an object's color: the color of an object is not mathematically derivable from the intrinsic properties of the object and the mind. If there were a visual sensation of the coin's ellipticality, just as there is a visual sensation of the apple's redness, then this sensation would have to be unlike all other sensations; it would have to be a sensation the features of which could be deduced from the nature of the cause and the effect. Since there are no sensations of this sort, Reid thinks, there can be no sensation that corresponds to visual shape in just the way that there is a sensation of red corresponding to red. Many scholars conclude that, for Reid, the perception of visual shape proceeds without the aid of sensation and is, therefore, different from the perception of every other quality. But this view is mistaken. The visual shape of an object is perceived the same way everything else is perceived: it is suggested by a sensation. But what sensation? Reid's answer is this: the sensation of an object's color suggests both the color and the visual shape of the object. So, although a blind person could deduce what visual shape an object has, the blind person cannot deduce anything about the sensation that a person who sees that shape would have; that sensation is just a color sensation, and there is no deducing anything about it from the qualities of the object and the mind.

Notice that a person who looks at a coin in his palm from an angle usually knows, instantly, that the coin is actually round, even though the coin looks elliptical. As Reid would put it, we often conceive of the actual shape immediately after conceiving of the visual shape. In fact, this movement of the mind from the conception — that is, perception — of visual shape to the conception of actual shape is so quick, and so hard to notice, Reid thinks, that it is much like, although not in fact, perception. Reid calls such conceptions, in keeping with Berkeley's terminology, "acquired perceptions". Often, we acquire a perception of an object as having a certain quality simply by correlating data from more than one sense. The real shapes of objects are immediately suggested by our tactile sensations; such sensations are natural signs of those shapes and signify only because of our constitutions. However, since we often have the visual sensations that suggest visual shape (sensations of color) at the same moment that we have the tactile sensations that suggest actual shape, we come to infer that a body that is merely seen would give rise to a certain tactile sensation were it touched, a tactile sensation that is itself a natural sign of the real shape of the object. Thus we come to conceive of the object as possessing a particular actual shape merely on seeing it despite the fact that our visual sensations are not natural signs of actual shape. Since such deliverances of conceptions do not come only from our nature, they do not, in general, bring with them a conviction of their accuracy. Even if we are convinced of their accuracy, such a conviction is not guaranteed by the history of their occurrence, as is the case in direct perception, but comes from some other source.

In summary, then, on Reid's view our minds come to be connected to the world in something like the way that we come to grasp objects through a language designed for the purpose. However, when we come to be aware of objects through our senses, we do so by utilizing something like a language embedded in our constitutions: our sensations function like a language that nature has constructed, and that nature has constructed us to understand, for the purpose of signifying real objects. So while it is in a sense only a metaphor to say that, for Reid, we know about the world because the world speaks to us, it is a metaphor that illuminates the facts as he sees them.

2.5 Responding to External World Skepticism

We are now in a position to understand the force of Reid's most important response to any argument purporting to show that the external world either might not exist, or might not be anything like the way we take it to be. In one canonical statement of his position, Reid says,

The sceptic asks me, Why do you believe the existence of the external object which you perceive? This belief, sir, is none of my manufacture; it came from the mint of Nature; it bears her image and superscription; and, if it is not right, the fault is not mine: I even took it upon trust, and without suspicion. Reason, says the sceptic, is the only judge of truth, and you ought to throw off every opinion and every belief that is not grounded on reason. Why, sir, should I believe the faculty of reason more than that of perception? — they came both out of the same shop, and were made by the same artist; and if he puts one piece of false ware into my hands, what should hinder him from putting another? (Inquiry, ch. 6, section 20, pp. 168-169)

The mistake that the skeptic makes, according to Reid, is to deny the truth of something that is demanded by our constitutions. To perceive an object as possessing a particular property is to have a conception of the object which was, itself, delivered by one's nature. What makes us convinced of the accuracy of the conceptions of objects involved in perception is that they arise from our constitutions. But, asks Reid here, why do we find skeptical arguments so compelling? Why do we accept that skeptical conclusions follow from, for instance, Descartes's hypothesis of the evil demon? Ultimately, we think that such arguments lead to their conclusions because we accept certain logical principles — such as the law of non-contradiction, or modus ponens — which appear to us to be self-evident. But to say that such principles are self-evident is just to say that we cannot help but accept them; it is to say only that we are compelled to believe them. But the irresistibility of a belief is a very good indicator, Reid thinks, that we hold that belief merely because of the way we are built, merely because of our constitution. But then the skeptic has merely placed the skeptical conclusion on the same footing as the common sense belief about the external world: both rest on something that we are compelled to believe by our constitutions. However, in order to overthrow common sense, the skeptic must place the skeptical conclusion, rather, on a firmer footing than the common sense conclusion. Thus, the skeptic gives us no reason whatsoever to reject common sense beliefs about the external world.

Reid, therefore, takes himself to have defended common sense through construction of an epistemological model that serves as an alternative to the Lockean view and, he thinks, thereby manages to avoid denial of our conception of ourselves as creatures capable of knowing about a non-mental world directly through our senses, a denial which he takes the work of Berkeley and Hume to show to be the inevitable result of acceptance of the Lockean picture.

3. Causation and Free Will

3.1 Objecting to Hume

Much of what Reid has to say about the nature of causation is motivated by his response to Hume's remarks about the concept. As Reid sees it, Hume starts with the assumption that if we are to learn what causation is — if we are to understand the nature of the relation between those events that we call causes and those we call effects — we must first determine from what aspect of our sensory experience the concept of causation is derived; as Hume would put the point, we need to determine from what impression our idea of causation is copied. However, Hume then takes himself to discover that there is nothing in our sensory experience corresponding to our ordinary notion of the causal relation. Ordinarily, we think that causes necessitate their effects; causes see to it, as it were, that their effects will come to pass. But we don't have sensory awareness of this necessitation. We see the first billiard ball hit the second, and we see the second move; but we don't see the movement of the first assure, or necessitate, the movement of the second. Thus, Hume holds, causation must be something different from what we take it to be ordinarily. But what is it? To answer this question, we must determine from what sensory experiences we derive the idea of causation; whatever those sensory experiences are really of is what causation really is. It turns out, as Reid reads Hume, that the sensory experiences that give rise to our idea of causation are sensory experiences of what Hume calls constant conjunction . The heating of the water is regularly followed by the water's boiling. To say that the one event causes the other is just to say that the two events always co-occur, or that there is a brute law linking them; it isn't to say that the first event necessitates the second, in any meaningful sense. The necessitation that we ordinarily take to be involved in causation is really in our heads; it is nothing more than our expectation of the boiling given the heating, for instance, an expectation that we are habituated to have after seeing the relevant sorts of events conjoined.

Reid accepts much of the negative side of Hume's view of causation while entirely disagreeing with Hume's view of the import of those negative discoveries. Reid agrees, that is, that we have no sensory experience of the necessitation of an effect by its cause. He doesn't think it follows, however, that our ordinary concept of causation is mistaken. Instead, Reid thinks, what the insensible nature of causal necessitation shows is that the concept of causation is not derived from sensory experiences in the sense in which Hume has in mind; the concept is not copied from any impression. Reid's thought, here, is tied tightly to his view of perception and the role of sensations in perception. (See Sensation, Natural Signs and Suggestion, above.) For him, sensations never bear any resemblance to the qualities they help us to perceive. It's hardly a surprise, then, that the sensory experiences from which our thoughts about causation spring bear no resemblance to the causal relation. But this fact no more impugns our concept of causation than the lack of resemblance between our sensory experiences of ordinary physical objects and those objects themselves impugns our thoughts about such objects. Our thoughts about ordinary physical objects are genuinely about those objects, despite the fact that the sensations from which those thoughts spring bear no resemblance to the objects they lead us to think about. Similarly, our thoughts about the causal relation are genuinely about the causal relation, despite the fact that the sensations from which those thoughts spring (the sensations of the relation of constant conjunction) bear no resemblance to the relation they lead us to think about, the relation of causal necessitation. We have no sensations resembling necessitation, and, yet, causes necessitate their effects.

However, Reid also offers criticisms of Hume's view of causation that can be accepted entirely independently of the Reidian view of perception and sensation. Two of his most influential criticisms are of Hume's view that our ordinary concept of causation is reducible to the relation of constant conjunction. He writes,

[I]t would follow from [Hume's definition of causation], that whatever was singular in its nature, or the first thing of its kind, could have no cause. (Essays on the Active Powers, p. 335)

Reid's point is that if the relation of causation is really that of constant conjunction, then the first time that two types of event are conjoined, the first cannot be the cause of the second; if there is no history of conjunction, there is no causation. It would seem to follow from Hume's definition, for instance, that if an earthquake razes Mexico City, and no earthquake has ever done so before, then the earthquake is not, in fact, the cause of the city's fall. This is obviously an undesirable consequence, however. Still, there are moves to be made, that Reid does not anticipate, in response to this objection and in defense of the equation between causation and constant conjunction. For instance, one might note that many putative counterexamples to the equation are not. For instance, prior to the earthquake's destroying Mexico City, earthquakes had destroyed other cities; and even prior to the first time that any earthquake destroyed any city, the trembling of a surface was followed by the objects on it falling. However, whether or not this response shows Reid's objection to be mistaken, the objection poses a question with which any Humean must wrestle: Which constant conjunctions are the genuine ones on the basis of which the causal relation can be said to hold, and which are not? The more specifically any two events are described, the more likely that there will be no history of conjunction of the relevant sorts of events. But what degree of specificity or generality in description is the right degree?

The problem is made even clearer by Reid's second famous objection to the equation between causation and constant conjunction. He writes,

It follows from [Hume's] definition of a cause, that night is the cause of day, and day the cause of night. For no two things have more constantly followed each other since the beginning of the world. (Essays on the Active Powers, p. 334)

Since we don't ordinarily think that day is the cause of night, or vice versa, Hume must deny that the two are actually constantly conjoined, or, rather, he must insist that the constant conjunction between the two of them is not of the right sort for the relation between them to be one of causation. Hume thinks that there is causation between two events just in case there is a law linking them and also thinks that there is a law linking two events just in case they are constantly conjoined. Reid's first objection shows that it is not the case that where-ever there is no constant conjunction there is no law. His second objection shows that it is not the case that where-ever there is constant conjunction there is a law. Constant conjunction is neither necessary nor sufficient for the presence of a genuine law. The hard problem that remains for the Humean, then, is to produce criteria for distinguishing genuine laws from regularities that are not laws at all. Reid's objections, then, should be taken as objections to Hume's assumption that all and only the constantly conjoined events are the events that are conjoined by law.

However, once Reid's criticisms are so understood, it leaves him free to hold that there is a legitimate causal relation between two events whenever the two are conjoined by a law of nature, even if laws of nature do not simply amount to constant conjunctions. And, in fact, Reid does hold this. He uses the term physical causation to refer to the relation that holds between two events just in case they are conjoined by natural law, and he takes the discovery of the physical causes of phenomena to be central both to the sciences and to ordinary life (cf. Inquiry 6.12, p. 122; Essays on the Active Powers, p. 33; Essays on the Active Powers, p. 279). But he also holds that genuine causation, what he calls efficient causation, is not reducible to physical causation. The reason is that, for him, a law of nature is not a brute conjunction between events. Rather, it is a regularity in the behavior of the efficient cause of observed phenomena. He writes,

[S]upposing that all the phenomena that fall within the reach of our senses, were accounted for from the general laws of nature, justly deduced from experience; that is, supposing natural philosophy brought to its utmost perfection, it does not discover the efficient cause of any one phenomenon in nature. The laws of nature are the rules according to which the effects are produced; but there must be a cause which operates according to these rules. The rules of navigation never navigated a ship. The rules of architecture never built a house. (Essays on the Active Powers, p. 46)

It is a law that unsupported objects, close to the earth, fall. What this means, Reid thinks, is that the efficient cause of the fall of an object regularly causes objects to fall when they are unsupported. Physical causation, for him, is parasitic upon the more basic kind of causation, namely efficient causation. But what is efficient causation? Reid defines the notion as follows:

In the strict and proper sense, I take an efficient cause to be a being who had power to produce the effect, and exerted that power for that purpose. (Works, v. 1, p. 65b)

Efficient causation is necessitation of the sort that Hume thought not to exist. To efficiently cause an event is to be capable of seeing to it that the event occurs, and to make an effort to see to it that it does. Thus, at the bottom of Reid's theory of causation are his notions of power and exertion.

3.2 Power, Exertion and Moral Liberty

Reid is clear that power is not the sort of thing that admits of a logical definition. We cannot reduce it to some set of simpler qualities. However, this doesn't mean that we can't say anything about what power is. On the contrary, Reid makes a variety of claims about power. Importantly, he claims that power is the quality that, when coupled with exertion, necessitates a particular effect; taking a cue from ordinary language, he holds that it is a contradiction to say that an entity has the power to do something, and exerts that power, and yet the effect fails to come about. If the effect fails to come about when the entity exerts itself, we might say, what that shows is that the entity only seemed, but didn't actually, have the power to bring about the effect. Reid also claims that any agent who has the power to do something also has three other inter-related powers: the power not to do the thing, the power to try to do that thing (that is, the power to exert his power to do the thing), and the power not to try to do that thing. He claims further that any agent who has the power to do something must believe himself to have that power. Any one of these claims can be questioned, even if Reid is right that they are embedded in our ordinary concept of power. Take, for instance, the claim that an agent who has the power to do something also has the power not to do it. Locke offers the following example, that seems, at least, to be a counterexample to this claim:

[S]uppose a Man be carried, whilst fast asleep, into a Room, where is a Person he longs to see and speak with; and be there locked fast in, beyond his Power to get out: he awakes, and is glad to find himself in so desirable Company, which he stays willingly in, i.e. prefers his stay to going away. I ask, Is not this stay voluntary? I think, no Body will doubt it: and yet being locked fast in, ‘tis evident he is not at liberty not to stay, he has not freedom to be gone. (John Locke, Essay Concerning Human Understanding, II.XXI.10)

The man in Locke's example seems to have the power to stay in the room, while lacking the power not to stay. After all, he's staying whether he likes it or not, but that fact doesn't seem to undermine the fact that he has the power to stay and exerts that power; he has reason to stay, and acts on that reason. Reid would probably deny that Locke's prisoner actually has the power to stay in the room, and there is some intuitive force to this view. The man, it seems, is in the hands of forces outside of his control. Whatever it is (God, say) that made it the case that the lock is too strong for him to break is the cause of his staying, even if the man happens to be content with his predicament. For Reid, what is in a person's power and what is ‘up to ’ him or her are the same. Since, intuitively, it is not up to the man whether he stays (even if he thinks it is), it is not in his power to stay.

Reid endorses the idea that what's in our power is just what's up to us. He claims that the only entities that can have power are entities with minds. That is, sticks and stones are never invested with power, and are not, therefore, ever the efficient causes of any events. The earthquake might be the physical cause of the fall of the city, but it is not the efficient cause, Reid thinks, because it does not have a mind. Since it is not up to the earthquake whether or not the city falls — since the earthquake lacks a mind, nothing is up to it — the earthquake lacks the power to raze the city. Reid offers various reasons for thinking that where-ever there is power there is a mind. One of the most compelling is expressed in the following passage:

[I]f we had not will, and that degree of understanding which will necessarily implies, we could exert no active power, and consequently could have none: for power that cannot be exerted is no power. It follows also, that the active power, of which only we can have any distinct conception, can be only in beings that have understanding and will. (Essays on the Active Powers, p. 35)

Reid's idea is that the only conception we can have of the exertion of power is of that distinctive sort of mental effort in which we engage when we will to do something. And, since he holds that the power to act is always accompanied with the power to exert that power, it follows that the only entities that can have power are those who are capable of engaging in the peculiar sort of mental effort with which we are all familiar from our own case. But then it follows that the only entities that can have power are those with minds. When coupled with the claim, that Reid also makes, that every event is efficiently caused, it follows that every event in nature is directed towards an end; everything that happens is chosen to occur.

Nicolas Malebranche held that in the strictest sense there is only one cause of every event, namely God. While we say that the earthquake caused the city to fall, this is not strictly correct. Strictly speaking, God caused the city to fall on the occasion of the earthquake's occurrence. Reid's view, however, is somewhat different from Malebranche's. Reid agrees that the efficient cause of natural events, such as the city's falling, is God. God is endowed with active power and exerts his power to bring about a vast number of the events that we see every day. However, in contrast to Malebranche, Reid holds that human beings, also, are endowed with the power to bring about events. In fact, Reid holds that all and only our free actions are those events of which we are the efficient causes. An agent who has the power to bring about a particular action is said, by Reid, to have ‘moral liberty ’.

There is a puzzle that one encounters when trying to make sense of Reid's notion of power and which sheds some light on Reid's concept of moral liberty. The puzzle is this: Say that I have the power to do a cartwheel. According to Reid it follows that if I exert my power and thereby do a cartwheel, then I will be the efficient cause of my cartwheel. Imagine that I do this and imagine that every event is efficiently caused. Is my exertion of my power to do the cartwheel an event? If so, then it must have an efficient cause. Am I the efficient cause of the exertion? If not, then it doesn't seem that my cartwheel is a free action. After all, if I'm not the efficient cause of the exertion, then it wasn't up to me whether or not I tried to do the cartwheel, and it seems to follow that it wasn't up to me whether or not I did it. So, Reid seems forced to say that I am the efficient cause of the exertion to do the cartwheel. But then it follows from the definition of efficient causation that I exerted my power to exert myself to do the cartwheel. And, therefore, we can ask if I am the efficient cause of my exertion to exert myself to do the cartwheel. If not, then I didn't do the cartwheel freely; if so, then we will find ourselves having to ask about the efficient cause of the exertion to exert my power to exert. In short, Reid's views of power, efficient causation and moral liberty appear to be inconsistent with one another.

The way out of the puzzle is to see that the relation between an agent and the event he or she efficiently causes is not the same as the relation between the agent and her exertion of power. Trying, on this view, is not something that an agent does in order to do something else; it is not a separate action on the way to performing another act. If I am going to build a birdhouse, I first have to buy nails. Buying nails is a distinct act from building the birdhouse that must be done on the way to building the birdhouse. But trying to buy the nails is not distinct from buying them in the way that buying them is distinct from building the birdhouse. If I manage to buy the nails, I haven't done two things, buy them and try to, but only one. But if I manage to build the birdhouse, then I did do two things: buy the nails, and build the birdhouse. So, there is something wrongheaded about even asking whether the agent is the efficient cause of the exertion of power. The agent is the efficient cause of the act, and there is no separate act, the exertion, of which he or she needs to be the efficient cause in order to have acted freely.

It is on the basis of this, or some other closely related line of thought, that Reid is often described as having an ‘agent causal ’ theory of freedom. In the contemporary philosophical literature, event-causation is thought of as the kind of causation that occurs when one change in nature brings about another change; the motion of the first billiard ball is the event-cause of the motion of the second. (The closest thing to event-causation in Reid's view is physical causation, defined in Objecting to Hume, above.) Agent-causation is the kind of causation that occurs when an object or agent, rather than an event, causes a change. Many people believe that there is no agent-causation. They hold that there are only causal relations between events, and every case of apparent agent-causation is merely apparent; every such case is actually a veiled case of event-causation. Philosophers who hold that free human actions require that certain events be agent-caused, and also believe that some human actions are free, hold that there are some events that are caused by agents but not by any events; they hold that there is a basic causal relation between agents and events that is instantiated every time a person acts freely. Given that, for Reid, the relation between an agent and the action of which the agent is the efficient cause must be a basic causal relation — it does not consist, not even in part, in some further distinct relation between the agent and the exertion of power — it follows that Reid holds an agent-causal view of free action.

3.3 Motives and Actions

Why should we believe that human beings have moral liberty? Why should we think, that is, that we are endowed with power to produce our actions? Why not believe, instead, that our actions are just like ordinary events in nature which, if they are efficiently caused at all, are efficiently caused by God? In fact, there seems to be good reason to think that we are not the efficient causes of our own behavior: our actions are motivated; they seem to come about according to psychological laws linking them to prior motives for action. Jealous, generous, prideful and benevolent motives, for instance, all lead, in law-like ways, to various characteristic behaviors. We are not the authors of these laws any more than we are the authors of the law of gravitation. But if we are not the authors of these laws, then why should we think that we are any more the efficient causes of the behavior that occurs in conformity with them than we are the efficient causes of the falls of our unsupported bodies towards the earth? If it is a fact that our conduct comes about according to laws, then it seems that the author of the laws, if there is one, is the real author of our actions, rather than we ourselves. Hume, in fact, can be construed as making precisely this point: he thinks that he has shown that we make inferences about what people will do given their motivations, and about what their motivations must have been given their actions, and thus takes himself to have shown that our conduct is governed by laws and is not, therefore, efficiently caused by us.

Reid's response is simply to deny that there are, in fact, any laws linking motives with behavior. Or, to put the point in his terms, he denies that motives are the physical causes of action. He offers a variety of fascinating arguments for this claim. The most important of these arguments is summarized quite clearly in Reid's correspondence, and presented at greater length in Essays on the Active Powers (essay 4, chapter 4). In the correspondence, he writes:

It is a question of fact, whether the influence of motives be fixed by laws of nature, so that they shall always have the same effect in the same circumstances. Upon this, indeed, the question about liberty and necessity hangs. But I have never seen any proof that there are such laws of nature, far less any proof that the strongest motive always prevails. However much our late fatalists have boasted of this principle as of a law of nature, without ever telling us what they mean by the strongest motive, I am persuaded that, whenever they shall be pleased to give us any measure of the strength of motives distinct from their prevalence, it will appear, from experience, that the strongest motive does not always prevail. If no other test or measure of the strength of motives can be found but their prevailing, then this boasted principle will be only an identical proposition, and signify only that the strongest motive is the strongest motive, and the motive that prevails is the motive that prevails — which proves nothing. (Letter to James Gregory, Works v. 1, p. 66b)

Reid assumes that anybody who holds that there is a law linking motives and behaviors will thereby accept the claim that human beings always act on the strongest of their motives. However, Reid claims that there are various ways in which the notion of the strongest motive can be defined — there are various measures of strength of motive — and depending which definition is employed we find that it is either false or trivial and uninformative to say that people always act on the strongest motive.

Reid identifies three particularly important senses in which the strength of a motive can be measured: by, to use his terms, its ‘prevalence ’, its ‘animal strength ’, or its ‘rational strength ’. According to the view that associates strength with prevalence, the strongest motive is just the motive on which the agent acts. Under this view, there is no way of assessing the strength of motives prior to seeing what the agent does; what the agent does tells us, after the fact, which of his or her motives was strongest. The animal strength of a motive is the degree to which it is felt, the degree to which the agent might be said to have an urge for its object. The rational strength of a motive is the degree to which the act it dictates is judged to be worthwhile by the agent.

As Reid puts the point in the above quotation, the claim that people always act on their strongest motive when strength is associated with prevalence is ‘an identical proposition ’; that is, it is true, but trivial and fails to show that people are not the efficient causes of their own behavior. After all, under the view of strength as prevalence the term ‘strongest motive ’ can be replaced with the term ‘the motive on which the agent acts ’ and thus ‘People always act on their strongest motive ’ becomes ‘People always act on the motive on which they act ’. True, but hardly the sort of truth from which anything interesting follows.

On the other hand, under either the view that the strongest motive is the strongest animal motive, or the view that the strongest motive is the strongest rational motive, it is false that people always act on the strongest motive, thinks Reid. People sometimes do what they judge to be right, even though they have a much stronger urge to do something else. And people sometimes give in to their urges, contrary to their better judgment. Both of these claims can be questioned. We might say, for instance, that people who act as dictated by their judgment actually have an urge to do so, an urge that counterbalances their urge to do otherwise. And, we might say that people who act on their urges, and counter to their best judgment, don't actually judge the alternative to be better, but do so only in some water-downed sense; we might say, for instance, that a person who goes to the beach while judging work to be the best of his options actually thinks that work is what most people think he ought to choose, or might think that work is what is best for him in normal circumstances, although not in these; either way, he doesn't truly judge work to be the best of his options when he chooses to go to the beach. Notice, however, that anyone who objects to Reid on either of these two grounds seems to accept, already, that people always act on the strongest of their motives in one sense or another. It's that prior acceptance that motivates the objection. Reid, by contrast, takes the facts that we sometimes act as dictated by our urges, sometimes as dictated by our judgments, to be a prior fact that any theory must account for, rather than a consequence of a theory of motivation. Hence, he takes any theory that does not allow for these consequences to be flawed, and takes himself to have shown that there is no satisfactory sense in which people always act on the strongest of their motives.

Reid's argument does not decisively settle the question of whether or not human conduct comes about in accordance with laws linking it to prior motives. There remains the possibility that there is some further notion of ‘strength of motivation ’ under which it is both true and non-trivial that people always act on the strongest of their motives. Reid has not ruled out the in-principle-possibility of such an account of strength. Rather, what he has shown is that we cannot accept the claim that human conduct is law governed through simple reflection from the armchair. We do need to do careful conceptual work in order to provide a non-trivial definition of strength that is different from either the animal or rational definitions; but we also need to do careful empirical work in behavioral psychology in order to determine if people do, indeed, always act on the strongest of motives in the sense of strength that we develop. His argument, then, makes a contribution to the question of whether or not people are the efficient causes of their own behavior by posing a further, and difficult problem for those, like Hume, who deny it on the grounds that our behavior is law-governed.

3.4 The Three Arguments for Moral Liberty

Reid does not rest content to defend the claim that human beings are the efficient causes of their own behavior by responding to the best objections to it; he also provides three positive arguments for the claim which he labels, prosaically, the ‘first ’, ‘second ’ and ‘third argument for moral liberty ’. (The arguments appear in chapters 6, 7 and 8, respectively, of essay 4 of Essays on the Active Powers.)

The first argument for moral liberty parallels Reid's response to external world skepticism (see Responding to External World Skepticism, above). Reid claims that the belief that we our endowed with power to produce our own actions is a first principle and then employs his general form of defense of first principles in order to argue that it must be so. If we put aside questions that might be quite legitimately raised about Reid's defense of first principles, the interesting thing about Reid's first argument for moral liberty are the reasons that he gives for thinking that people all naturally and non-inferentially believe themselves to be endowed with power. He claims that this is so since various activities in which we engage would make no sense if we did not believe ourselves to be endowed with power. For instance, he claims that the activity of deliberating, of weighing reasons for and against various possible actions, proceeds under the assumption that we have power; if we didn't believe that, he thinks, then we would not bother deliberating.

What gives Reid's claim appeal is the fact that when we deliberate we think that what we are deliberating about is up to us, and for Reid, what is up to us is identical to what is in our power. However, it's not clear that we have to think of actions as being in our power in order to be motivated to deliberate; the thought that our actions are ‘up to us ’, a thought which is undeniably involved in deliberation, might be understood in some way which does not presuppose power. For instance, in thinking that what we do is ‘up to us ’, we might just be thinking that if we're sufficiently motivated to do it, we will. By way of example, note that it's generally true that people who deliberate before they act do things that are more in their interests than those who simply act impulsively, without deliberation. Hence, if you are motivated to avoid impulsive action, that motive might lead you to deliberate, and your deliberation might, in turn, lead you to do something better than you would have done had you not deliberated. It is not clear that a person who was motivated to deliberate for this reason would be presuming him or herself to be endowed with power in Reid's sense. Such a person might think merely that deliberation will produce motives that happen to give rise, for reasons entirely out of the agent's control, to better actions. In short, if we think of deliberation as motivated action, and if we can imagine a person being motivated to engage in it even in the absence of the belief that he or she is endowed with power, then Reid is wrong.

Still, it is quite possible that Reid is right. The question turns on whether or not it is possible to provide an adequate picture of the psychology of deliberation without appeal to the belief that we are endowed with power. What the first argument from moral liberty serves to do is not to silence the opposition, but, instead, to force the opposition not to oversimplify the phenomena. Those who deny that human beings are endowed with power in Reid's sense need to explain what we are thinking when we deliberate; the explanation must not gloss over the complexity of ordinary deliberation, but also must not show us to be thinking ourselves to be endowed with power in Reid's sense whenever we deliberate about what to do.

In the second argument for moral liberty, Reid claims that none of our moral practices — our practices of holding ourselves and others accountable for their behavior — would make any sense if we did not believe ourselves and others to be endowed with power over conduct. He claims, in short, that the very concept of a morally accountable being presupposes that that being has power over his conduct. Since we are, he thinks, morally accountable beings, it follows that we are endowed with power over our conduct.

Just as the first argument for moral liberty depends upon the inadequacy of any account of deliberation that leaves out the belief that our conduct is in our power, the second depends upon the inadequacy of any account of what makes a person morally accountable that does not include the power to control action. Someone who wished to deny that human beings have power over their conduct, but are still morally accountable, might note, for instance, that one of the primary purposes of certain forms of punishment, most notably imprisonment, is to prevent the offender from acting similarly in the future. However, such a purpose does not presuppose that the person has power over his or her conduct. If the thief is going to steal again, then that's reason enough to imprison him, we might say, even if he's going to steal only because his desires will inevitably give rise to such behavior and not because he has power that he is resolved to exercise objectionably in the future. Reid's second argument for moral liberty fails if purposes of this sort exhaust the purposes of punishment. The second argument turns, that is, on a retributivist conception of punishment — a conception according to which a punishment is appropriate only if it is deserved — and a further claim to the effect that a punishment is never deserved in the retributivist's sense if the crime was not efficiently caused by the agent to whom the punishment is issued.

When Reid was writing, most, perhaps all, philosophers who denied that human beings were the efficient causes of their own behavior, but who nonetheless took us to be morally accountable, were drawn to conceptions of the purpose of punishment that do not require power on the part of the recipient for punishment to be appropriate. (This was true of Hume, Anthony Collins, Locke, Hobbes and Reid's philosophical enemy Joseph Priestley, among others.) But it remains an open question whether or not a retributivist conception of punishment could be coherently married to a view that denies that human beings are endowed with power. Reid's second argument for moral liberty raises this question in a powerful form.

In the third argument for moral liberty, which is the most obscure of the three, Reid claims that a person could not engage in planned conduct if not endowed with power. Since it's obvious, he thinks, that we do engage in planned conduct, it follows that we must have power over our actions. Reid links the third argument for moral liberty with the argument from design for God's existence. According to the argument from design, God must exist since the world is so complex, and yet so orderly, that there must have been an all-powerful, all-knowing being who designed it and made it according to plan. Similarly, Reid argues, planned conduct is at once so complicated and so orderly that there must have been some author of it. He then claims that since it is obvious that we think up our own plans, we must also be the one's who execute them. So, he thinks, we must be endowed with power.

There is room to object not just to the third argument, but also to the argument from design, by noting that ordered complexity can arise through mechanisms other than a guiding hand. Most of us think, for instance, that the mechanisms of natural selection result in the production of enormously complicated and yet ordered biological structures, like the human eye; but none of us think that there is any designer of these structures who is the efficient cause of them. The reason, we might say, that people act on their plans is that creatures who formed plans but never acted on them didn't live long enough to reproduce. We don't need power, in Reid's sense, in order to execute our plans; we just need to be the sorts of creatures whose minds are hooked up to their bodies in such a way that they do what they plan. It could be, that is, that by forming plans we engage powers that are not our own by engaging laws linking plans with execution, laws of which we are not the authors.

This is a powerful objection, but it is not the end of the debate. Notice that someone who rejects the argument from design is likely to think both that there is no efficient cause of the complex order which we encounter in nature, and that nobody planned the order that we find. But there is no doubt that when a person, say, builds a house that there was somebody who formed the plan to build the house. The question is whether or not that person must have had the power to build it in order to bring the plan to fruition. Reid's point is that our attribution of the wisdom to form the plan goes hand-in-hand with the attribution of the power to execute it. We might think that nobody was either wise enough or powerful enough to create the world; but if we do think someone was wise enough, then we must also think that person powerful enough. In the case of planned conduct, we know that there is a person wise enough — namely the person whose plan it was — so surely we must also think that person powerful enough. As he puts the point:

Every indication of wisdom, taken from the effect, is equally an indication of power to execute what wisdom planned. And, if we have any evidence that the wisdom which formed the plan is in the man, we have the very same evidence, that the power which executed it is in him also. (Essays on the Active Powers, p. 322)

Even this point — that where there's wisdom there's power — can be questioned, but there is surely something right about it. Traits of character, of which wisdom is an example, are both cognitive and volitional: we think of a person who has one as both capable of understanding things, and of doing them. To be wise isn't just to know how to do something, but also to be able to do it. So, when we ascribe someone with the intelligence to think up a complex plan, and on those grounds take the person to be wise, we are also taking the person to have the power to execute the plan. This is the idea that drives Reid's third argument for moral liberty.

None of Reid's arguments for moral liberty are decisive, by any means. Each, however, lays bare a manner in which the notion of power is naturally construed to be implicated in our ordinary beliefs and our ordinary practices. While it remains possible that what is implicated is actually something less, something that can be described and explained without appeal to Reid's very strong notion of power, Reid's arguments nonetheless make clear what an account of human agency that does without power would need to account for if it is to be satisfactory.


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action | Berkeley, George | causation: the metaphysics of | Collins, Anthony | free will | Gassendi, Pierre | Hobbes, Thomas | Hume, David | Locke, John | Malebranche, Nicolas | ordinary language | perception: epistemological problems of | primary and secondary qualities | punishment | realism | Scottish Philosophy: in the 18th Century | skepticism