# Plural Quantification

*First published Wed 27 Oct, 2004*

Ordinary English contains two sorts of object quantifiers. In addition
to the usual *singular* quantifiers, as in

(1) There is an apple on the tablethere are

*plural*quantifiers, as in

(2) There are some apples on the table.Ever since Frege, formal logic has favored the two singular quantifiers ∀

*x*and ∃

*x*over their plural counterparts ∀

*xx*and ∃

*xx*(to be read as

*for any things*

*xx*and

*there are some things*

*xx*). But in recent decades it has been argued that we have good reason to admit among our primitive logical notions also the plural quantifiers ∀

*xx*and ∃

*xx*(Boolos 1984 and 1985a).

More controversially, it has been argued that the resulting formal
system with plural as well as singular quantification qualifies as
‘pure logic’ in particular, that it is universally
applicable, ontologically innocent, and perfectly well understood. In
addition to being interesting in its own right, this thesis will, if
correct, make plural quantification available as an innocent but
extremely powerful tool in metaphysics and philosophical logic. For
instance, George Boolos has used plural quantification to interpret
monadic second-order
logic^{[1]}
and has argued on this basis that monadic
second-order logic qualifies as “pure logic.” Plural
quantification has also been used in attempts to defend logicist ideas,
to account for set theory, and to eliminate ontological commitments to
mathematical objects and complex objects.

- 1. The Languages and Theories of Plural Quantification
- 2. The Logicality Thesis
- 3. Applications of the Logicality Thesis
- 4. Ontological Innocence?
- 5. Beyond PFO+?
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. The Languages and Theories of Plural Quantification

The logical formalisms that have dominated in the analytic tradition
ever since Frege have no separate devices for plural quantification. In
introductory logic courses students are therefore typically taught to
paraphrase away plural locutions. For instance, they are taught to
render ‘Alice and Bob are hungry’ as ‘Alice is hungry
& Bob is hungry’, and ‘There are some apples on the
table’, as ‘∃*x* ∃*y* (*x*
is an apple on the table & *y* is an apple on the table
& *x* ≠ *y*)’. However, not only are such
paraphrases often unnatural, but they may not even be available. One of
the most interesting examples of plural locutions which resist singular
paraphrase is the so-called Geach-Kaplan sentence:

(3) Some critics admire only one another

This sentence provably has no singular first-order paraphrase using
only the predicates occurring in the sentence
itself.^{[2]}

How are we to formalize such sentences? The traditional view, defended for instance by Quine, is that all paraphrases must be given in classical first-order logic, if necessary supplemented with a theory of sets. In particular, Quine suggests that (3) should be formalized as

(3′) ∃S(∃u.u∈S& ∀u∀v[(u∈S&Auv→v∈S&u≠v)])

where the quantifier ∃*S* ranges over sets and where
for simplicity the domain of discourse is taken to consist only of
critics (1973, p. 111 and 1982, p. 293).

In two important articles from the 1980s George Boolos challenges
this traditional view (Boolos 1984 and 1985a). He argues that it is
simply a prejudice to insist that plural locutions in natural language
be paraphrased away. Instead he suggests that, just as the singular
quantifiers ∀*x* and ∃*x* get their
legitimacy from the fact that they represent certain quantificational
devices in natural language, so do their plural counterparts
∀*xx* and ∃*xx*. For there can be no doubt
that in natural language we use and understand the expressions
‘for any things’ and ‘there are some
things’.^{[3]}
Since these quantifiers bind variables that
take name (rather than predicate) position, they are
*first-order* quantifiers, albeit *plural* ones.

### 1.1 Regimenting plural quantification

We will now describe a simple formal language which can be used to regiment plural quantification as it occurs in English and other natural languages.

The formal language L. Let the formal language L_{PFO}_{PFO}(forPlural First-Order) be as follows.

- L
_{PFO}has the following terms (whereiis any natural number):

- singular variables
x_{i}- plural variables
xx_{i}- singular constants
a_{i}- plural constants
aa_{i}- L
_{PFO}has the following predicates:

- two dyadic logical predicates = and ; (to be thought of as
identityand the relationis one of)- non-logical predicates
R(for every adicity^{n}_{i}nand every natural numberi)- L
_{PFO}has the following formulas:

R(^{n}_{i}t_{1}, …,t) is a formula when_{n}Ris an^{n}_{i}n-adic predicate andtare singular terms_{j}tTis a formula whentis a singular term andTa plural term- ¬φ and φ&ψ are formulas when φ and ψ are formulas
- ∃
v.φ and ∃vv.φ are formulas when φ is a formula andvis a singular variable andvva plural one- the other connectives are regarded as abbreviations in the usual way.

In L_{PFO} we can formalize a number
of English claims involving plurals. For instance, (2) can be
formalized as

(2′) ∃And the Geach-Kaplan sentence (3) can be formalized asxx∀u(uxx→Au&Tu)

(3′′) ∃xx∀u∀v[(uxx→Cu) & (Auv→vxx&u≠v)].

However, the language L_{PFO} has
one severe limitation. We see this by distinguishing between two kinds
of plural predication. A predicate *P* taking plural arguments
is said to be *distributive* just in case it is analytic that:
*P* holds of some things *xx* if and only if *P*
holds of each *u* such that
*u*
*xx*.^{[4]}
For instance, the predicate ‘is on the
table’ is distributive, since it is analytic that some things
*xx* are on the table just in case each of *xx* is on the
table. A predicate *P* that isn't distributive is said to be
*non-distributive*.^{[5]}
For instance, the predicate ‘form a circle’ is
non-distributive, since it is not analytic that whenever some things
*xx* form a circle, each of *xx* forms a circle. Another
example of non-distributive plural predication is the second
argument-place of the logical predicate
:
for it is not true (let alone analytic) that whenever *u* is
one of *xx*, *u* is one of each of *xx*. It is
therefore both natural and useful to define a slightly richer
language:

The formal language L. The language_{PFO+}Lallows non-distributive plural predicates other than . We do this by modifying the definition of L_{PFO+}_{PFO}so as to allow predicatesRthat take^{n}_{i}pluralarguments.^{[6]}

Should we also allow predicates with argument places that take both
*singular* and *plural* arguments? Lots of English predicates seem to work
this way, for instance ‘ … is/are on the table’. So
if our primary interest was to analyze natural language, we would
probably have to allow such predicates. However, for present purposes
it is simpler not to allow such predicates. We will anyway soon allow
pluralities that consist of just one thing.

For now, the formal languages L_{PFO}
and L_{PFO+} will be interpreted only by
means of a translation of them into ordinary English, augmented by
indices to facilitate cross-reference (Boolos 1984, pp. 443-5 (1998a,
pp. 67-9); Rayo 2002, pp. 458-9). (More serious semantic issues will be
addressed in Section 4, where our main question will be whether our
theories of plural quantification are ontologically committed to any
sort of “set-like” entities.) The two clauses of this
translation which are immediately concerned with plural terms are

(4)Tr(x_{i}xx) = it_{j}_{i}is one of them_{j}

(5)Tr(∃xx.φ) = there are some things_{j}_{j}such thatTr(φ)

The other clauses are obvious, for instance: *Tr*(φ &
ψ) = (*Tr*(φ) and *Tr*(ψ)). By induction on
the complexity of formulas one easily proves that this translation
allows us to interpret all sentences of
L_{PFO} and
L_{PFO+},
relying on our intuitive understanding of English.

### 1.2 The Theories PFO and PFO+

We will now describe a theory *PFO* of plural first-order
quantification based on the language L_{PFO}. Let's begin with an axiomatization of
ordinary first-order logic with identity. For our current purposes, it
is convenient to axiomatize this logic as a natural deduction system,
taking all tautologies as axioms and the familiar natural deduction
rules governing the singular quantifiers and the identity sign as
rules of inference. We then extend in the obvious way the natural
deduction rules for the singular quantifiers to the plural ones. Next,
we need some axioms which for suitable formulas φ(*x*)
allow us to talk about the φs. In ordinary English, it seems that
we are entitled to use an expression of the form ‘the
φs’ just in case there are at least two objects satisfying
φ(*x*). But given our present concerns, it is convenient
to relax this requirement slightly and demand only that there be at
least one object satisfying φ(*x*). (Most people who write
on the subject make this concession.) This gives rise to the
*plural comprehension axioms*, which are the instances of the
schema

(Comp) ∃where φ is a formula in Luφ(u) → ∃xx∀u(uxx↔ φ(u))

_{PFO}that contains ‘

*u*’ and possibly other variables free but contains no occurrence of ‘

*xx*’. Since this assures that all pluralities are non-empty, we may also adopt the axiom

(6) ∀Letxx∃u(uxx).

*PFO+*be the theory based on the language L

_{PFO+}which arises in an analogous way, but which in addition has the following axiom schema of extensionality:

(7) ∀xx∀yy[∀u(uxx↔uyy) → (φ(xx) ↔ φ(yy))]

This axiom schema ensures that all coextensive pluralities are indiscernible.

*Note on terminology*. For ease of communication we will use
the word ‘plurality’ without taking a stand on whether
there really exist such entities as pluralities. Statements involving
the word ‘plurality’ can always be rewritten more
longwindedly without use of that word. For instance, the above claim
that “all pluralities are non-empty” can be rewritten as
“whenever there are some things *xx*, there is something
*u* which is one of the things *xx*.” Where an
ontological claim *is* made, this will be signalled by instead
using the locution ‘plural entity’.

### 1.3 The proof-theoretic strength of the theories PFO and PFO+

(Readers less interested in technical issues may want to skim this
part.) PFO and PFO+ are very strong theories. As Boolos observed, PFO
is strong enough to interpret monadic second-order
logic.^{[7]}
Let
*MSO* be some standard axiomatization of (full impredicative)
monadic second-order logic in some suitable language
*L _{MSO}*
(Shapiro 1991, ch. 3; Boolos

*et al*. 2002, ch. 22). Boolos first defines a translation

*Tr*′ that maps any formula of L

_{MSO}to some formula of L

_{PFO}. This definition, which is by induction on the complexity of the formulas of L

_{MSO}, has as its only non-trivial clauses the following two, which are concerned with the second-order variables:

(8)Tr′(X) =_{j}x_{i}x_{i}xx_{j}(9)

Tr′(∃X.φ) = ∃_{j}xx._{j}Tr′(φ) vTr′(φ*)

where φ* is the result of substituting *x _{i}*
≠

*x*everywhere for

_{i}*X*. The idea behind these two clauses is to replace talk about properties (or whatever entities one takes the monadic second-order variables to range over) with talk about the objects having these properties. Thus, instead of saying that

_{i}x_{i}*x*has the property

_{i}*X*, we say that

_{j}*x*is one of

_{i}*xx*. The only difficulty is that some properties have no instances, whereas all pluralities must encompass at least one thing. But the possibility that a property be uninstantiated is accommodated by the second disjunct on the right-hand side of (9).

_{j}
By induction on derivations in MSO one easily proves that each
theorem of MSO is mapped to some theorem of PFO. Moreover, it is easy
to define a “reverse” translation that maps formulas of
L_{PFO} to formulas of
L_{MSO} and to prove that this
translation maps theorems of the former to theorems of the
latter. This shows that PFO and MSO are equi-interpretable. A similar
result can be proved about PFO+ and an extension *MSO+* of MSO
which allows predicates of (first-order) properties, provided MSO+
contains an axiom schema to the effect that coextensive properties are
indiscernible.

### 1.4 Relations

Although plural quantification provides a fairly natural
interpretation of quantification over (monadic) *properties*,
it provides no natural interpretation of quantification over
(polyadic) *relations*.

This limitation can be overcome if there is a pairing function on
the relevant domain, that is, if there is a function π such that
π(*u*, *v*) = π(*u*′,
*v*′) just in case *u* = *u*′ and
*v* = *v*′. For then quantification over dyadic
relations can be represented by plural quantification over ordered
pairs. Moreover, by iterated applications of the ordered pair function
we can represent *n*-tuples and thus also quantification over
*n*-adic relations. The question is how this pairing function is
to be understood. One option is to proceed as in mathematics and simply
postulate the existence of a pairing function as an abstract
mathematical object. But this option has the obvious disadvantage of
stepping outside of what most people are willing to call “pure
logic.” A cleverer option, explored in the Appendix to Lewis 1991
and in Hazen 1997 and 2000, is to simulate talk about ordered pairs
using only resources that arguably are purely logical. It turns out
that talk about ordered pairs can be simulated in monadic
*third-order* logic, given some plausible extra assumptions.
Monadic third-order logic can in turn be interpreted either in a theory
which combines plural quantification with mereology (Lewis 1991, Ch. 3;
Burgess and Rosen 1997, II.C.1) or in terms of the higher-level plural
quantification to be discussed in Section 5.

## 2. The Logicality Thesis

It is often claimed that the theories PFO and PFO+ qualify as
“pure logic.” We will refer to this (admittedly vague)
claim as the Logicality Thesis. Since the corresponding languages are
interpreted by the translation *Tr* into ordinary English, this
is a claim about the logicality of certain axioms and inferences rules
of ordinary English.

Even before the Logicality Thesis is made more precise, it is possible to assess its plausibility for at least some of the axioms and inference rules of PFO and PFO+. First there are the tautologies and the inference rules governing identity and the singular quantifiers. There is broad consensus that these qualify as logical. Next there are the inference rules governing the plural quantifiers. Since these rules are completely analogous to the rules governing the singular quantifiers, it would be hard to deny that they too qualify as logical. Then there are the extensionality axioms and the axiom that all pluralities are non-empty. These axioms are unproblematic because they can plausibly be taken to be analytic. What remains are the plural comprehension axioms, where things are much less clear. For these axioms have no obvious singular counterparts, and their syntactical form indicates that they make existential claims. So it is not obvious that these axioms can be taken to be purely logical.

This is not to say that it has not *struck* people as obvious
that the plural comprehension axioms are purely logical. For instance,
Boolos asserts without argument that the translation of each plural
comprehension axiom into English “expresses a *logical*
truth if any sentence of English does” (Boolos 1985b, p. 342
(1998a, p. 167); his emphasis). And Keith Hossack first argues that the
plural comprehension axioms are ontologically innocent, whence he
concludes — with no further argument or explanation — that
“the axioms of plural logic are genuine logical truths”
(Hossack 2000, p. 422).

In order to assess the Logicality Thesis in a more principled way, more will have to be said about what it might mean for a theory to be “purely logical.” So we will now survey some of the features commonly thought to play a role in such a definition. Although people are free to use the word ‘logic’ as they please, it is important to get clear on what different usages entail; in particular, theories that qualify as purely logical are often assumed to enjoy a variety of desirable philosophical properties such as epistemic and ontological innocence. In the next section, where various applications of plural quantification will be discussed, we will carefully note which strains of the notion of logicality our theories PFO and PFO+ must possess for the various applications of them to succeed.

Perhaps the least controversial candidate for a defining feature of
logic is its *absolute generality*. A logical principle is valid
in any kind of discourse, no matter what kind of objects this discourse
is concerned with. For instance, modus ponens is valid not only in
physics and mathematics but in religion and in the analysis of works of
fiction. Frege captures the idea nicely when he says that a logical
principle is valid in “the widest domain of all; […] not
only the actual, not only the intuitable, but everything
thinkable” (Frege 1884, p. 21). Thus, whereas the principles of
physics are valid only in the actual world and in worlds that are
nomologically similar to it, the principles of logic govern everything
*thinkable*. If one of these principles is denied,
“complete confusion ensues” (*ibid*.).

Another feature widely believed to be defining of logic is its
*formality*: the truth of a principle of logic is guaranteed by
the *form* of thought and/or language and does not in any way
depend upon its *matter*. What this feature amounts to will
obviously depend on how the distinction between form and matter is
understood. The most popular explication of the distinction between
form and matter derives from the widely shared view that no objects
exist by conceptual necessity (Field 1993; Yablo 2000). On this view it
is natural to regard anything having to do with the existence of
objects and with their particular characteristics as belonging to the
matter of thought rather than to its form. This gives rise to two
features that are often regarded as defining of logic. Firstly, logic
has to be *ontologically innocent*; that is, a principle of
logic cannot introduce any new ontological commitments (Boolos 1997;
Field 1984). Secondly, the basic notions of logic must not discriminate
between different objects but must treat them all alike. This latter
idea is often spelled out as the requirement that logical notions must
be invariant under permutations of the domain of objects (Tarski
1986).

A third feature which is often regarded as defining of logic is its
(alleged) *cognitive primacy*. Primitive logical notions must be
completely understood, and our understanding of them must be direct in
the sense that it doesn't depend on or involve an understanding of
notions that must be classified as extra-logical. Assume, for instance,
that certain set theoretic principles must be regarded as
extra-logical. Then our understanding of the primitive logical notions
cannot depend on or involve any of these principles.

## 3. Applications of Plural Quantification

We will now outline some applications of the theories PFO and PFO+. In the previous section three strains of the notion of logicality were disentangled. Special attention will be paid to the question which of these three strains PFO and PFO+ must possess for the applications to succeed. (The reader may want to skip the discussion of applications in which he or she isn't interested.)

### 3.1. Establishing the Logicality of Monadic Second-Order Logic

Boolos defined an interpretation of the theory MSO of monadic second-order logic in the theory PFO of plural quantification (Section 1). He sought to use this to establish the logicality of MSO. Doing so will require two steps. The first step is to argue that PFO is pure logic, that is, to establish the full Logicality Thesis (however that is interpreted). The second step is to argue that the interpretation of MSO in PFO preserves logicality.

Some of the intricacies of the first step will be examined in Section 4. But the second step too should not be underestimated. Perhaps the greatest worry here is that Boolos's translation renders expressions from one syntactic category (that of monadic predicates) in terms of expressions from another category (that of plural referring expressions). For instance, ‘… is an apple’ is rendered as ‘the apples’. But these categories are very different; for instance, the former consists of expressions that are unsaturated (in Frege's sense) — that is, that contain gaps or argument places — whereas the latter consists of expressions that are saturated (Higginbotham 1998, Section 7; Oliver and Smiley 2001; Rayo and Yablo 2001, Section X; Yi forthcoming).

However, since the thesis that MSO is pure logic is very abstract, most of its cash value will presumably lie in its applications. And given the equi-interpretability of MSO and PFO (Section 1), it is likely that most applications of the logicality of the former can equally well be served by the logicality of the latter. This reduces the importance of carrying out the second step.

### 3.2. Logicism

Both Fregean and post-Fregean logicism make essential use of
second-order quantification. Frege defined the various objects of pure
mathematics as extensions of concepts, and his famous Basic Law V
stated that two concepts *F* and *G* have the same
extension just in case they are co-extensive:

(V)û.Fu=û.Gu↔ ∀u(Fu↔Gu)

But as is well known, Russell's paradox shows that the second-order theory with (V) as an axiom is inconsistent.

Philosophers have attempted to rescue some ideas of Fregean logicism
by using axioms weaker than (V). One of the most important such
attempts is Bob Hale and Crispin Wright's *neo-logicism*, which
gives up Frege's theory of extensions but holds on to the central idea
of his definition of cardinal numbers, namely that the number of
*F*s is identical to the number of *G*s just in case the
*F*s and the *G*s can be one-to-one correlated. This has
become known as *Hume's Principle*, and can be formalized
as

(HP)Nu.Fu=Nu.Gu↔F≈G

where *F*≈*G* says there is a relation that
one-to-one correlates the *F*s and the *G*s. The
second-order theory with (HP) as an axiom is consistent and allows us
to derive all of ordinary (second-order Peano-Dedekind) arithmetic,
using some very natural definitions (see the entry on
Frege's Logic, Theorem, and Foundations for Arithmetic).

Even more modest is Boolos's *sub-logicism*, which rejects the
idea (endorsed by both logicists and neo-logicists) that there are
logical objects, but insists that Frege's definition of the
*ancestral* of a relation can be used to show, as against Kant,
that at least some non-trivial mathematics is analytic (Boolos 1985b).
Recall that a relation *R* stands to its ancestral *R**
as the relation *is a parent of* stands to *is an ancestor
of*. (More precisely, *R** holds between two objects
*x* and *y* just in case *x* and *y* are
connected through a finite sequence of objects each of which bears
*R* to its successor.) Frege gives a second-order definition of
the ancestral relation *R** by laying down that *x* and
*y* are related by *R** just in case *y* has
every property that is had by *x*'s *R*-successors and
inherited under the *R*-relation:

(DefR*)xR*y↔ ∀F[∀u(xRu→Fu) & ∀u(Fu&uRv→Fv) →Fy]

Using this definition, Frege 1879 proves some non-trivial
mathematical truths, such as that the ancestral *R** is
transitive and that, for any functional relation *R*, the
*R*-ancestors of any object are *R**-comparable (that is,
he proved: Functional(*R*) & *xR*y* &
*xR*z* → *yR*z* v *zR*y*).

It has been suggested that PFO be used to accommodate the
post-Fregean logicists' need for second-order quantification. Since the
ancestral of a dyadic predicate can be defined using only monadic
second-order quantification, PFO does indeed serve the logical needs of
Boolos's
sub-logicism.^{[8]}
But since the neo-logicist definition of
*F*≈*G* uses *dyadic* second-order logic,
PFO alone does not have sufficient expressive power to accommodate the
needs of neo-logicism. The neo-logicist may attempt to solve this
problem by regarding equinumerosity as a primitive logical quantifier
or by simulating dyadic second-order quantification in some suitable
extension of PFO, as discussed in Section 1.4.

Which strains of the Logicality Thesis are needed for these applications to succeed? Since these logicists attempt to show that parts of mathematics are analytic (or at least knowable a priori), this would require that PFO be analytic (or at least knowable a priori), which in turn is likely to require that PFO enjoy some form of cognitive primacy. Moreover, PFO would have to be either ontologically innocent or committed only to entities whose existence is conceptually necessary (or at least establishable a priori).

### 3.3. Set Theory

Another application of the Logicality Thesis is concerned with set theory. One may for a variety of reasons want to talk about and quantify over collections of sets (Linnebo 2003, pp. 80-81). For instance, one may want to assert

(10) There are some sets which are all and only the non-self-membered sets.

If we formalize this as

(10′) ∃R∀x(Rx↔xx),

how is the quantifier ∃*R* to be understood? It clearly
cannot be taken to range over all sets, since this would lead straight
to Russell's paradox: (10′) would then assert the existence of
the Russell-set. Three other responses are prominent in the
literature.

The first response is that ∃*R* ranges over
*classes* but that some classes are too large (or otherwise
unsuited) to be sets. In particular, (10) asserts the existence of the
Russell-class, which isn't a set. This response has been found
problematic because it postulates the existence of different kinds of
“set-like” entities (Boolos 1984, p. 442 (1998a, p. 66) and
1998b, p. 35). It has also been objected that this response only
postpones the problem posed by (10). For it would also be true that

(11) There are some classes which are all and only the non-self-membered classes.

What kind of entity would this collection of classes be? A super-class? If so, we will be forced to postulate higher and higher levels of classes. Lewis (1991, p. 68) argues that Russell's paradox is still inescapable because, when we consider all set-like entities, we realize that the following is true:

(12) There are some set-like things which are all and only the non-self-membered set-like things.

However, Hazen (1993, pp. 141-2) has forcefully responded to Lewis's
objection that its attempt to talk about all set-like entities in one
fell swoop violates essential type-restrictions: although we can
quantify over *each* level of classes, we can never quantify
over *all levels simultaneously*.

The second response is that (10) asserts the existence of a set
*R*, but that *R* isn't in the range of the quantifier
∀*x*. This prevents us from instantiating the quantifier
∀*x* with respect to *R*, which means that we
cannot draw the fatal conclusion that *R* is a member of itself
just in case it isn't. However, this response entails that the
quantifier ∀*x* cannot be chosen to range over absolutely
all sets; for if it could be so chosen, we would not be able say that
*R* isn't in this range of quantification. This means that the
universe of sets has a certain *inexhaustibility*: whenever we
have formed a conception of quantification over some range of sets, we
can define a set which isn't in this range (Dummett 1981, ch. 15 and
1991, ch. 24; Glanzberg forthcoming; Parsons 1977). However, this
response has been criticized for being, at best hard to state, and at
worst self-refuting (Boolos 1998b, p. 30; Lewis 1991, p. 68; Williamson
2003, Section V).

Because of the difficulties involved in the first two responses, a
third response has become popular in recent years (Boolos 1984 and
1985a; Burgess forthcoming; Cartwright 2001; Rayo and Uzquiano 1999;
Uzquiano 2003). This is that the quantifier ∃*R* is a
plural quantifier (and would thus be better written as
∃*rr*) and that plural quantification is ontologically
innocent. (10) does therefore not assert the existence of any
“set-like” entity over and above the sets in the range of
the quantifier ∀*x*. But as we will see in Section 4, the
claim about ontological innocence is controversial.

### 3.4. Mathematical Nominalism

Some of the most popular applications of the plural quantification are concerned with ontological economy. The idea is to pay the ontological price of a mere first-order theory and then use plural quantification to get for free (a theory with the force of) the corresponding monadic second-order theory. That would obviously be an ontological bargain. Applications of this sort fall into two main classes, which will be discussed in this sub-section and the next.

One class of applications of plural quantification aim to make
ontological bargains in the philosophy of mathematics. In particular, a
number of philosophers have attempted to use plural quantification as
an ingredient of nominalistic interpretations of mathematics. A nice
example is Geoffrey Hellman's modal nominalism, according to which
mathematical statements committed to the existence of abstract objects
are to be eliminated in favor of statements about the *possible*
existence of concrete objects. For instance, instead of claiming, as
the platonist does, that there exists an infinite collection of
abstract objects satisfying the axioms of Peano arithmetic (namely the
natural numbers), Hellman claims that there *could exist* an
infinite collection of concrete objects related so as to satisfy these
axioms (Hellman 1989 and 1996). However, even this modal claim appears
to talk about *collections* of concrete objects and
*relations* on these objects. To forestall the objection that
this smuggles in through the back door abstract objects such as sets,
Hellman needs some alternative, nominalistically acceptable
interpretation of this talk about collections and relations. Plural
quantification may offer such an interpretation.

For this application of plural quantification to work, PFO must be
applicable to all kinds of concrete objects, and it must be
ontologically innocent, or at least not committed to any entities that
share those features of abstract objects that are found to be
nominalistically objectionable. Moreover, in order to simulate
quantification over relations, we will need not just PFO but a theory
more like monadic *third-order* logic (Section 1.4).

### 3.5. Eliminating Complex Objects

Another class of applications attempt to eliminate the commitments
of science and common sense to (some or all) complex objects. For
instance, instead of employing usual singular quantification over
tables and chairs, it is proposed that we use plural quantification
over atoms (or whatever simple objects of which tables and chairs are
composed) arranged tablewise or chairwise (Dorr and Rosen 2002; Hossack
2000; van Inwagen 1990). For instance, instead of saying that there is
a chair in one's office, one should say that there are some atoms in
one's office arranged chairwise. In this way one appears to avoid
committing oneself to the existence of a chair. Note that such analyses
require PFO+, not just PFO, since the new predicates ‘are
arranged *F*-wise’ are non-distributive.

Let's set aside purely metaphysical worries about such analyses as
irrelevant to our present concern. What *we* would like to know
is what demands these analyses put on the theory PFO+, in particular,
which strains of the Logicality Thesis are needed. The most obvious
demands are that PFO+ be applicable to all kinds of simple objects and
that it be ontologically innocent, or at least not committed to complex
objects of the sort to be eliminated.

A less obvious demand has to do with the need to analyze ordinary plural quantification over complex objects, for instance

(13) There are some chairs arranged in a circle.

We have already “used up” ordinary plural quantification and predication to eliminate apparent commitment to individual chairs (Uzquiano 2004). In order to analyze (13), we will therefore need something like “super-plural” quantification — quantification that stands to ordinary plural quantification as ordinary plural quantification stands to singular — and corresponding non-distributive predication. The legitimacy of such linguistic resources will be discussed in Section 5.

## 4. Ontological Innocence?

The traditional view in analytic philosophy has been that all plural
locutions should be paraphrased away, if need be, by quantifying over
sets (Section 1). But George Boolos and others have objected that it is
both unnatural and unnecessary to eliminate plural locutions: since
such locutions are found in natural languages, they are unproblematic
and perfectly well understood, and we should therefore extend our
logical formalisms so as to accommodate these locutions. This led to
the theories PFO and PFO+. Proponents of plural quantification claim
that these theories allow plural locutions to be formalized in a way
that is fundamentally different from the old set-theoretic paraphrases.
In particular, they claim that these theories are ontologically
innocent in the sense that they introduce no new ontological
commitments to sets or any other kind of “set-like”
entities over and above the individual objects that compose the
pluralities in question. Let's call this latter claim *Ontological
Innocence*.

Other philosophers question Ontological Innocence. For instance, Michael Resnik expresses misgivings about the alleged ontological innocence of the plural rendering (3′′) of the Geach-Kaplan sentence (3). For when (3′′) is translated into English as instructed, it reads:

(3′′′) There are some critics such that any one of them admires another critic only if the latter is one of them distinct from the former.

But (3′′′), Resnik says, “seems to me to refer to collections quite explicitly. How else are we to understand the phrase ‘one of them’ other than as referring to some collection and as saying that the referent of ‘one’ belongs to it?” (Resnik 1988, p. 77). Related worries have been expressed in Hazen 1993, Linnebo 2003, Parsons 1990, and Rouilhan 2002; see also Shapiro 1993.

### 4.1. Some Arguments in Favor of Ontological Innocence

We begin by observing that what is sometimes thought to be a knock-down argument in favor of Ontological Innocence is less conclusive than it appears. The argument begins by asking us to consider

(10) There are some sets which are all and only the non-self-membered sets.

and admit that it is true. It continues by arguing that, if plural expressions were committed to collections or any other “set-like” objects, then the truth of (10) would lead straight to Russell's paradox. However, as we saw in Section 3.3, Russell's paradox will follow only if two alternative views are ruled out. Since these views cannot be dismissed out of hand, a lot of work will remain before this argument can be said to be conclusive.

Let's therefore turn to what is probably the most popular argument
for Ontological Innocence. Since this argument is based on our
intuitions about ontological commitments, we will refer to it as
*the Argument from Intuitions*. Consider for instance

(14) George Boolos ate some Cheerios for breakfast on January 1, 1985.

When you assert (14), you don't have the feeling that you are committing yourself ontologically to a collection or to any other kind of “set-like” object, or so the argument goes. Nor do you have any such feeling when you assert the Geach-Kaplan sentence or any other translation of a sentence of PFO or PFO+ into English.

However, in its current form the Argument from Intuitions is vulnerable to the objection that people's intuitions provide a poor ground for settling theoretical disputes about ontological commitments. We have seen that there are competent speakers of English, such as Michael Resnik, who don't share these intuitions. Moreover, as Davidson's popular analysis of action sentences in terms of events makes clear, ordinary people's intuitions about ontological commitments cannot always be trusted (Davidson 1967). For instance, someone may sincerely assert that Tom walked slowly, without being aware that he has committed himself to the existence of an event (namely a walking which is by Tom and which is slow). A better approach to questions about ontolological commitment would use our best linguistics and philosophy of language in an attempt to determine the real logical-semantic structure of the sentence in question (Section 4.2).

Although this objection has force, we will now consider two ways in which the Argument from Intuitions can be sharpened. The first way asks what forms of existential generalization are warranted on a sentence containing plurals (Boolos 1984, p. 447 (1998a, p. 70); McKay forthcoming, Chapter 2; Yi 2002, pp. 7-15). For instance, we may ask whether the following can be inferred from (14).

(15) There is an object such that Boolos ate all of its elements (or constituents) for breakfast on January 1, 1985.

This inference is, at the very least, very peculiar. So this provides evidence that (14) isn't committed to any kind of “set-like” entity that can be the value of a singular first-order variable.

A second sharpening of the Argument from Intuitions is suggested by
Boolos's remark that “It is haywire to think that when you have
some Cheerios, you are eating a *set*” (1984, pp. 448-9
(1998a, p. 72)). What Boolos is suggesting is that analyses that deny
Ontological Innocence are likely to get the subject of plural
predications wrong. To this it may perhaps be responded that the
predicate has to be changed accordingly; for instance, instead of the
ordinary relation *x eats y*, plural contexts such as (14)
involve the related but different relation *x eats-the-elements-of
y*. The problem with this response, however, is that natural
language provides no evidence that the word ‘eat’ is
ambiguous in this way. On the contrary, any such ambiguity seems
unlikely given the possibility of ellipsis as in

(16) Boolos ate some Cheerios, but his guest, only a candy bar.

For if ‘eat’ were used ambiguously, this ellipsis would be disallowed. For instance, it is because ‘make’ is used ambiguously in ‘make breakfast’ and ‘make up one's mind’ that the following ellipsis is disallowed

(*17) Boolos made breakfast, but his guest, only up his mind.

So this second sharpening of the Argument from Intuitions has force as well: it shows that it would be highly artificial to take plural terms to denote any kind of “set-like” entities that can be values of singular first-order variables.

The upshot is that the two sharpened versions of the Argument from
Intuitions succeed in placing strict constraints on *the kinds
of* ontological commitment that plural locutions can have. If
plural locutions incur ontological commitments (over and above the
uncontroversial commitment to the individual objects which compose the
plurality in question), these ontological commitments cannot be the
kind of commitments that are incurred by *singular first-order
quantifiers*. For instance, if (14) is ontologically committed to
anything over and above individual Cheerios, this commitment cannot be
of a sort that would allow us to make an inference from (14) to (15).
More generally it follows that, if the only kind of ontological
commitment there is is the kind incurred by singular first-order
quantifiers, then Ontological Innocence will be true.

However, there is an influential philosophical tradition which holds
that quantifiers of *all syntactic categories* incur ontological
commitments, not just singular first-order
quantifiers.^{[9]}
The most
famous exponent of this tradition is Frege, who held that second-order
quantifiers are committed to concepts, just as singular first-order
quantifiers are committed to objects. In order to explain this
tradition and assess its bearing on the issue of Ontological Innocence,
we cannot rely on our intuitive understanding of English and other
natural languages but need to consider the relevant semantic
theories.

### 4.2. Semantic Values and Ontological Commitments

Semantic theories of the form with which we will be concerned are
based on two core Fregean assumptions. First it is assumed that the
significance of a sentence consists in its being true or false. Then it
is assumed that each simple component of a sentence makes some definite
contribution to the truth or falsity of the sentence; in particular,
that the truth-value of the sentence is determined as a function of the
semantic contributions of its various simple components. (This second
assumption is known as *compositionality*.)

The semantic contribution made by an expression **E**
is known as its *semantic value* and is symbolized as
[**E**]. The semantic value of a sentence is normally
taken to be its truth-value. As Frege observed, it will then be very
natural to take the semantic value of a proper name to be its referent
(that is, the object to which it refers); for the truth-value of a
sentence **S** remains unchanged whenever a proper name
occurring extensionally in **S** is replaced with some
co-referring proper name. Once we have fixed the kinds of semantic
values assigned to sentences and proper names, it is easy to determine
what kinds of semantic values to assign to expressions of other
syntactic categories. For instance, the semantic value of a monadic
predicate will have to be a function from objects to truth-values.
(Frege calls such functions *concepts*.)

As an example, let's consider the simple subject-predicate sentence

(18) Socrates is mortal.

The logical form of (18) is **M**(**s**),
where **M** is the predicate ‘is mortal’ and
**s** is the singular term ‘Socrates’. In
accordance with the previous paragraph, the semantic values are as
follows:

(19) [s] = Socrates

(20) [M] = the functionffrom objects to truth-values such thatf(x) is the true ifxis mortal andf(x) is the false otherwise

The truth-value of (18) is thus determined as

(21) [(18)] = [M(s)] = [M] ([s]) =f(Socrates) = the true if Socrates is mortal and the false otherwise.

Frege took the connection between semantic values and ontological
commitments to be a very close one. For on the above analysis, (18)
supports two kinds of existential generalizations: not just to
∃*x*.**M**(*x*) (which is true just in
case there exists some object which is mortal) but also to
∃*F.F*(*s*) (which is true just in case there
exists some concept under which Socrates falls). According to Frege,
this shows that sentences such as (18) are ontologically committed not
just to an object but also to a concept.

What matters for present purposes is not the truth or falsity of Frege's claim about concepts but whether a cogent argument of this sort can be developed for plural locutions. To investigate this, we need to understand the semantics of plural terms. Fortunately it suffices to consider a simple non-distributive plural predication such as

(22) These apples form a circle.

The logical form of (22) appears to be
**C**(**aa**), where **C** is
the predicate ‘form a circle’ and **aa** is
the plural term ‘these apples’. (If you think complex
plural demonstrative have internal semantic structure, use instead some
plural name stipulated to refer directly to the apples in question.)
The natural view will then be as follows.

(23) [aa] =a_{1}and … anda(where the_{n}aare all and only the apples demonstrated)_{i}

(24) [C] = the functiongfrom pluralities to truth-values such thatg(xx) is the true ifxxform a circle andg(xx) is the false otherwise

The truth-value of (22) will then be determined as

(25) [(22)] = [C(aa)] = [C] ([aa]) =g(a_{1}and … anda) = the true if_{n}a_{1}and … andaform a circle and false otherwise_{n}

which is what one would expect, given the syntactic similarity between (18) and (22).

Assume that this argument is sound and that each plural term thus has some objects as its semantic value(s), just as each singular term has one object as its semantic value. What will this mean for the issue of Ontological Innocence?

One answer is that it will mean that plural locutions *are*
committed to plural entities and that Ontological Innocence thus is
false. This answer is based on the following argument. A semantic
theory assigns to each significant expression a unique semantic value
which constitutes this expression's semantic contribution to the
sentences in which it occurs. For instance, in (23) the plural term
**aa** is assigned as its semantic value a certain
plurality. The semantic theory regards this plurality as *one*
entity: it is *the* contribution of *one* syntactic
expression. Granted, this plural entity is not an object, if with Frege
we mean by ‘object’ the referent of a singular first-order
term. Nevertheless, this plural entity does represent an ontological
commitment.

It may be objected that this argument is guilty of a
“singularist prejudice” in the meta-language. For it is
essential to this argument that it uses singular locutions in the
meta-language to describe the semantic contribution of plural terms
such as **aa**. It would be more neutral, the objection
continues, to allow the meta-language to have the same expressive
resources as the object language; in particular, the meta-language
should be allowed to contain plural locutions. But once this is
allowed, the semantic contribution of a plural term such as
**aa** can be characterized by a relation of the form
SemVal(**aa**, *xx*), where the first argument
place is singular and the second is plural, and where the relation
holds when *xx* collectively are the semantic value(s) of
**aa**. A proponent of Ontological Innocence can then
argue from the premise that plural quantification is innocent in the
meta-language to the conclusion that it is innocent in the object
language. This argument won't satisfy opponents of Ontological
Innocence, who will reject its premise. But the argument does show that
Ontological Innocence can be affirmed without semantic incoherence.

What have we achieved, then, by taking up the semantic perspective
of this section? Have we just shifted the problem of Ontological
Innocence from the object language to the meta-language? I will now
suggest that our semantic perspective represents progress because it
allows a more principled approach to the question of Ontological
Innocence. In the meta-language we can specify, for each sentence of
the object language, what is required of the world for this sentence to
be true. Some of these requirements are expressed by means of
quantifiers in the meta-language. Let's call such requirements
*commitments*. If we allow the same expressive resources in the
meta-language as in the object language, there will be as many forms of
commitment as there are kinds of quantification in the object language:
in addition to *object commitments*, recorded by first-order
singular quantifiers in the meta-language, there may be *concept
commitments*, recorded by monadic second-order quantifiers in the
meta-language, and *plurality commitments*, recorded by plural
first-order quantifiers in the meta-language. Once we realize that
there are all these different but related forms of commitment, it
becomes unclear why we should be more concerned with object commitments
than with other kinds of commitment (Linnebo 2003; Parsons 1990;
Shapiro 1993).

Unless a differential treatment of object commitments and other kinds of commitments can be justified, the most interesting notion of ontological commitment will be the umbrella notion that covers all the different forms of commitment. But on this understanding of ontological commitment, Ontological Innocence will be false, since plural quantifiers will then introduce ontological commitments over and above the commitments to the objects that compose the pluralities in question.

## 5. Beyond PFO+?

One way of going beyond PFO+ would be by allowing quantification
into predicate positions, including those of predicates taking plural
arguments. Doing so would result in an extension which stands to PFO+
as ordinary (singular) second-order logic stands to ordinary (singular)
first-order logic. Such extensions will not be discussed here: for
whether they are legitimate, and if so what axioms they may support,
has less to do with plurals and plural quantification than it does with
predication and quantification over the semantic values of
predicates.^{[10]}

What *is* relevant for present purposes is whether we can
iterate the operation that takes us from a range of entities already
accepted to plural quantification over this range. In other words, is
there some form of “super-plural” quantification that
stands to ordinary plural quantification as ordinary plural
quantification stands to singular quantification? If so, let's call
this *second-level* plural quantification. More generally, we
may attempt to introduce plural quantification of any finite level.
This would result in a theory just like a simple type theory (Hazen
1997, p. 247; Linnebo 2003, Section IV; Rayo forthcoming).

It is unproblematic to develop formal languages and theories of
higher-level plural quantification. For instance, we can introduce
variables of the form *xxx* to be thought of as ranging over
second-level pluralities and the relation *xx*
_{2}
*xxx* to be understood in
analogy with the relation *x*
*xx*. But can these formal theories of higher-level plural
quantification be justified by considerations similar to those that
justify the theories PFO and PFO+?

Boolos and many other philosophers deny that higher-level plural
quantification can be thus justified. Two kinds of arguments are given
for this view. Firstly, it is argued that a plurality is always a
plurality of *things*. But since plural quantification is
ontologically innocent, there are no such things as pluralities. There
is thus nothing that can be collected into a second-level plurality
(McKay forthcoming, Ch. 2). Secondly, ordinary plural quantification is
justified by the fact that it captures certain quantificational devices
of English and other natural languages. But English and other natural
languages contain no higher-level plural quantification (Lewis 1990,
pp. 70-71; Uzquiano 2004).

Both arguments are controversial. Concerning the first, it is not clear why ontology should be relevant to the legitimacy of higher-level plurals quantification. It should be sufficient that the base-level objects can be organized in certain complex ways. For instance, the second-level plurality based on Cheerios organized as oo oo oo may be no more ontologically problematic than a first-level plurality based on the same objects organized as oooooo, although the former has an additional level of structure or articulation (Linnebo 2003, pp. 87-8).

The second of the above two arguments is also problematic. To begin
with, the claim that there are no higher-level plural locutions in
natural language appears to be false. In Icelandic, for instance, the
number words have plural forms which count, not individual objects, but
*pluralities* of objects that form natural groups. Here is an
example:

einn skór | means | one shoe | ||

einir skór | means | one pair of shoes | ||

tvennir skór | means | two pairs of shoes |

This allows us to talk about pairs of shoes as a second-level
plurality rather than as a first-level plurality of objects such as
*pairs*.

Moreover, the very idea that the legitimacy of higher-level plural
quantification is decided by the existence or non-existence of
higher-level plural locutions in English and other natural languages is
problematic (Hazen 1993, p. 138 and 1997, p. 247; Linnebo 2003, p. 87).
What really matters is presumably whether we can iterate the principles
and considerations on which our understanding of ordinary first-level
plural quantification is based: if we can, then higher-level plural
quantification will be justified in much the same way as ordinary
first-level plural quantification; and if not, not. Thus, even if there
were no higher-level plural locutions in natural languages, this would
at best provide some weak *prima facie* evidence that no such
iteration is possible. And this *prima facie* evidence could be
defeated by pointing to independent reasons why higher-level plural
locutions are scarce in natural languages. One such independent reason
may simply be that ordinary speakers aren't very concerned about their
ontological commitments and thus find it more convenient to express
facts involving second-level pluralities by positing objects to
represent the first-level pluralities (for instance by talking about
two *pairs* of shoes) rather than by keeping track of additional
grammatical device for second-level plurals (as for instance in the
above example from Icelandic).

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## Other Internet Resources

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## Related Entries

Frege, Gottlob | Frege, Gottlob: logic, theorem, and foundations for arithmetic | generalized quantifiers | logic and ontology | mereology | neologicism | Russell's paradox | set theory### Acknowledgments

Thanks to Allen Hazen, Tom McKay, Frode Kjosavik, Agustín Rayo, and Gabriel Uzquiano for discussions and written comments on earlier drafts.