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Method and Metaphysics in Plato's Sophist and Statesman

First published Thu 6 Oct, 2005

The Sophist and Statesman are late Platonic dialogues, whose relative dates are established by their stylistic similarity to the Laws, a work that was apparently still “on the wax” at the time of Plato's death (Diogenes Laertius III.37). These dialogues are important in exhibiting Plato's views on method and metaphysics after he criticized his own most famous contribution to the history of philosophy, the theory of separate, immaterial forms, in the Parmenides. The Statesman also offers a transitional statement of Plato's political philosophy between the Republic and the Laws. The Sophist and Statesman show the author's increasing interest in mundane and practical knowledge. In this respect they seem more down-to-earth and Aristotelian in tone than dialogues dated to Plato's middle period like the Phaedo and the Republic. This essay will focus on method and metaphysics.

1. Introduction

The Sophist and Statesman represent themselves as the first two members of a trilogy, which was to include a third member, the Philosopher, a dialogue Plato never wrote. The conversations in the Sophist and Statesman take place sequentially on a single day and are dramatically linked to the Theaetetus, which occurred on the previous day, shortly before Socrates' trial (Theaetetus 210d, Sophist 216a). The Sophist is also linked more remotely to the Parmenides, a conversation Socrates says he had with the great philosopher of Elea, when Parmenides was very old and he was very young (Sophist 217c). Socrates plays a minor role in the conversations in the Sophist and Statesman, observing the proceedings but replaced as main speaker by a visitor from Elea, a follower of Parmenides, who converses with Theaetetus in the Sophist and with a young man named Socrates (the Younger) in the Statesman.

Although the Sophist and Statesman are dialogues, the interaction between the Stranger and his two young interlocutors seems very different from that between Socrates and his interlocutors in the Socratic dialogues, including the Theaetetus. In that dialogue Theaetetus distinguished himself as a highly promising student, who answered Socrates' questions resourcefully. The respondents in the Sophist and Statesman seem docile by comparison, readily accepting the Stranger's arguments and occasionally asking him to explain, but rarely raising tough objections or making good proposals of their own. Young Socrates in the Statesman is particularly prone to misunderstandings and mistakes. Of all the respondents in Plato's dialogues, the interlocutors in the Sophist and Statesman most closely resemble the respondent in the second part of the Parmenides, a young man named Aristotle (not the famous philosopher), who never objects when he should, and who gives his most enthusiastic assents when Parmenides' argument is most problematic or obscure.

These dramatic features raise questions of philosophical importance. Why does Plato connect the Sophist and Statesman with the Theaetetus and Parmenides, dialogues written in all probability a good deal earlier? Why do the speakers keep anticipating a third dialogue, the Philosopher (Sophist 216c-217b; 253b-254b; Statesman 257a-258c), on a topic plainly dear to Plato's heart, which he then never wrote? Why does Plato replace Socrates with the colorless visitor from Elea? Elsewhere Plato allows speakers to give long speeches (e.g., Timaeus' account of cosmology in the Timaeus), so why does the visitor engage in question and answer, when he does most of the talking and his respondents seem unprepossessing and are chosen precisely because they are young and so likely to cause least trouble (cf. Sophist 217d with Parmenides 137b)?

The Sophist and Statesman strike many scholars as more dogmatic than other Platonic dialogues. The Stranger sets out to define the sophist, the statesman, and the philosopher, claiming that they are three distinct kinds (Sophist 217a-b); the two existing dialogues appear to give successful definitions of their objects and to present and defend significant methodological and metaphysical positions. The Sophist arguably solves the problem of false statement, one of a family of problems that had dogged other Platonic dialogues, including the Theaetetus.

Perhaps Plato replaces Socrates with the visitor from Elea because Elea was the hometown of Parmenides, and in the Sophist Plato plans to criticize Parmenides' dictum that we cannot speak or think of what is not (237a). Perhaps, too, readers are meant to recall the Parmenides, a dialogue staged some fifty years earlier, in which Parmenides himself led the conversation. After criticizing Plato's middle period treatment of forms (inadequately defended by a youthful Socrates), Parmenides announced that before positing forms Socrates should undertake rigorous philosophical training. Parmenides then demonstrated the exercise in the second part of the dialogue with a youthful respondent, focusing on another thesis for which he was famous, that there is only one thing (Parmenides 128a-b, 137b). By using a visitor from Elea, Plato invites his audience to recall Parmenides' own positions and performance in that earlier dialogue. (For discussion of the dialogue form in these late works, cf. Frede 1996, and C. Gill 1996).

2. Purpose of the Sophist and Statesman

The Sophist and Statesman each undertakes a particular task, the first to define a sophist, the second to define a statesman. But they have a larger purpose. The Statesman gives many indications that the investigation of the statesman is being undertaken not primarily for its own sake but for the sake of a greater project—our becoming better dialecticians (285d).

The Stranger makes this announcement, first reminding Young Socrates of a previous discussion about children learning their letters:

Stranger: Suppose someone should ask us about the children sitting together learning their letters: when one of them is asked of what letters some word or other is composed, do we ever say that the inquiry is more for the sake of the one problem set before him or for the sake of his becoming a better speller in all such cases?

Young Socrates: Clearly for the sake of his becoming a better speller in all such cases.

Stranger: Now again what about our inquiry about the statesman? Is it posed more for the sake of that thing itself [the statesman] or for the sake of our becoming more dialectical about everything?

Young Socrates: This too is clear, that it's for the sake of our becoming more dialectical about everything. (285c-d)

Next the Stranger talks about examples, like weaving, for which there are perceptible likenesses, easy to understand, which an instructor can point to when an inquirer has trouble grasping an account. But there are other things, described as greatest and most valuable, that cannot be imaged. It is for the sake of these harder topics that the inquirers practice giving and receiving an account on simple examples, like weaving, where they can fall back on perceptible images. The Stranger says:

Hence it is necessary to practice being able to give and receive an account of each thing. For immaterial things, being finest and greatest, are shown clearly by an account alone and by nothing else, and all the things said now are for the sake of those. But in everything practice is easier in lesser things, rather than in greater things. (286a-b)

We first practice giving and receiving an account on easy examples like weaving, which can also be imaged. Then we practice on difficult examples, like the statesman. Here we must give and receive an account, without a perceptible image to fall back on. But the statesman is still part of the exercise. Our inquiry about him is itself undertaken to make us better dialecticians, able to deal with all such topics. If we can succeed with the statesman, we will have learned a technique, or how to find a technique, that can be applied to other difficult cases, such as the philosopher.

The Statesman's primary aim is to demonstrate how to undertake all such inquiries. Its own inquiry stimulates the participants (and us readers) to recognize what mistakes to avoid and what paths are worth pursuing and why. But significantly, as one sees from comparing the treatments of the sophist and statesman, different kinds of objects demand different sorts of methods. So we cannot simply extend the methods of the Sophist and Statesman in a mechanical way to the investigation of the philosopher and other great and difficult topics. These dialogues teach us how to go about philosophical investigations. They do not offer a formula that can be simply applied to further cases.

If the Sophist and Statesman are philosophical exercises, there may be a good reason why the final dialogue of the trilogy, the Philosopher, is missing. Plato would spoil the lesson if he wrote it for us (cf. Dorter 1994, 236). If we have learned how to investigate philosophical problems in the Sophist and Statesman, Plato may be challenging his audience to search for the philosopher themselves, using the techniques and recommendations these dialogues provide.

3. Method

The Sophist and Statesman search for definitions, and both dialogues focus on the search. The Sophist speaks often of the hunt in which we are engaged and of the sophist as our quarry. In this hunt the sophist time and again eludes us, taking cover in the darkness of not-being, reappearing occasionally to dispute the very existence of the kind to which we wish to assign him. How can we define the sophist at all, if we cannot get hold of him or coherently characterize the kind to which he belongs? The Statesman repeatedly notices the road traveled—longer roads and shorter roads that will take us to our destination or lead us astray. The dialogue often reflects on better and worse methods of seeking the goal. The Sophist and the first part of the Statesman represent the search by means of an elaborate tree-like system of roads. The inquirers travel down these branching roads; at each fork they must choose which branch to take in the hope of finding their quarry, and that quarry alone, at the terminus. This method of discovery is called division (cf. Phaedrus 265e-266b). A definition, when reached by this means, recounts the steps of a completed division.

3.1 Names, Kinds, and Collection

Where does an investigation into a topic like sophistry or statesmanship begin? At the start of the search for the sophist, the Eleatic visitor remarks that he and Theaetetus may share merely the name “sophist” in common but may mean quite different things by the name. The aim of the inquiry is to reach an agreement about the kind to which they ascribe the name (218b-c). They are looking for a real definition—a definition that applies to all and only members of a kind, and one that explains why an instance is an instance of that kind: the inquirers are seeking the essence of the target kind, the property or collection of properties that make the kind what it is.

A preliminary step in locating the essence of a kind is to figure out what people understand by the name of that kind. This opening maneuver can occur in several ways: First, what does the name connote, and what associations does it conjure up? The word “sophist” is cognate with the word “sophos,” which means “wise man.”[1] That connection suggests that the sophist has some sort of wisdom (sophia) or expertise (technê) (Sophist 221c-d). This idea enables the inquirers to locate the sophist's ability and practice at the outset in the wide kind art or expertise (technê). The word “statesman” in Greek (politikos) is cognate with the word “city” (polis), and so people associate the statesman's activity with affairs of a city (Statesman 305e). In addition, the statesman and king are taken to be related (258e), and kings were associated in the Greek imagination with an image from Homer's Iliad of Agamemnon as shepherd of the people (cf. Miller 1980, 40). The image of a herdsman quietly guides the initial attempt to define the statesman, who is identified as herdsman of the human flock.

Second, what sorts of individuals does the name pick out, and what features do those individuals share? Readers of the Socratic dialogues will recall that when Socrates asks his “What is X” question (e.g., What is piety? What is courage? What is knowledge?), the respondent frequently opens with some sort of list. Euthyphro, when asked what piety is, says: “I say that piety is doing what I'm doing right now, prosecuting the wrongdoer, be it about murder or temple robbery or anything else, whether the wrongdoer is your father or your mother or anyone else” (Euthyphro 5d-e). Theaetetus, when asked what knowledge is, first replies: “I think the things Theodorus teaches are knowledge—I mean geometry and the things you enumerated just now. Then again there are crafts (technai) such as cobbling, whether you take them together or singly” (Theaetetus 146c-d). Socrates regularly objects that the interlocutor has merely given him a list, whereas he wants to know what all the items on the list have in common, and what it is that makes them all instances of one kind. Although Socrates complains about the list, it helps to orient the investigation, because reflection on the list enables the inquirers to see the common character shared by all the items enumerated.

The Phaedrus calls this technique collection, and it is used together with division, a procedure that is new in the late dialogues. A collection can occur at the beginning of an investigation and at any step of a division. By means of collection an inquirer brings together a number of disparate things or kinds of things, often called by different names, into one kind (Phaedrus 265d). The Statesman offers a good example of a collection at the outset of its inquiry. The visitor gathers together several kinds of things, called by different names, into one kind—the target kind to be defined:

Stranger: Shall we posit the statesman, the king, the slave-master, and further the household manager, as one thing, although we call them all these names, or should we say there are as many arts as the names used? (Statesman 258e)

The visitor remarks that although we call these people by different names, they all have in common a power to maintain their rule by the strength of their understanding with little use of their hands and bodies (259c). This is a rough and ready description of the target kind which the inquirers hope to find at the terminus of their division. This crude description enables them to pick out a wide kind to be divided (knowledge), and to take a number of steps in the division: Knowledge is divided into practical and theoretical; then theoretical knowledge is divided into strictly theoretical and directive. The statesman's expertise is pursued down the directive branch of theoretical knowledge.

3.2 Models and Division

At the beginning of the investigation into the sophist, the Stranger says they need to practice their investigation on a model (paradeigma), before they embark on the difficult and controversial topic before them. What is a model?

Plato speaks often of models, but the Sophist and Statesman offer a new conception. In the Phaedo, Parmenides, and Timaeus, a paradeigma is some original object—a paradigm—to which other things are likened as images. Plato characterizes his separate, immaterial forms as models, abstract perfect particulars, and sensible particulars as likenesses of them, images that somehow fall short of the original. This more usual notion of a model recurs in the Sophist, in the Stranger's discussion of imitation (Sophist 235e). But the Sophist and Statesman use another conception as well. A model is a mundane example whose definition is somehow relevant to the definition of the more difficult kind under investigation. In the Sophist, an angler, defined as a sort of hunter, guides the initial search for the sophist, who is also identified as a sort of hunter.

A model is not merely an example (or paradigmatic example) of some general concept, as angling is an example of hunting and more generally of expertise. The search for the definition of the example reveals a procedure, which can be transferred to the harder case, independent of content. Different models introduce different procedures. The model of the angler introduces the method of dichotomous division—division of a kind into two sub-kinds—and the definition of the angler recounts the steps of that division. Both the procedure and definitional structure are featured in the harder case. The Statesman's main model, weaving, is offered much later in the investigation, after an initial attempt to define the statesman by dichotomous division has failed. Again, the example shares properties in common with the target kind—both the weaver and the statesman engage in the art of combination, among other things. The model also introduces a procedure that can be extended to the target. The new procedure is called division “by limbs” (Statesman 287c). By means of such division the kind to be defined (weaver or statesman) is marked off from other sorts of experts, who are related to it in various ways and operate in the same domain. The main function of Plato's models in the Sophist and Statesman is to reveal a productive next move or series of moves in an investigation. A model indicates how to go on—how to take the opening steps in an investigation or how to get beyond an impasse.

4. The Problem of the Sophist

The divisions in the Sophist and Statesman are divisions of arts (angling, sophistry, weaving, statecraft), and only secondarily of experts who possess those arts. The art is what makes the expert the sort of expert he is. The initial attempts to define the sophist and statesman, using the method of dichotomous division, each reveal a problem with the target kind, which is then resolved in some other way, or at least in conjunction with some other method. The problem with the sophist is that his art turns up, not at a single terminus like angling, but at many different termini. Reflection on this peculiarity enables the inquirers to recognize something they had previously missed—the essence of the sophist—which ties together the various previous appearances.

4.1 The Angler and the Sophist

The model of the angler demonstrates the method of dichotomous division and steers the first attempt to define the sophist. An angler has a humble profession, familiar to everyone (Sophist 218e): an angler hunts water creatures using a special sort of hook. The visitor arrives at his definition by first locating the angler's profession in a wide kind, art or expertise (technê). He then divides art into two subordinate kinds, productive and acquisitive, then continues to divide the acquisitive branch until he reaches the terminus, where angling is located, marked off as what it is, apart from everything else. The sophist resembles the angler in possessing expertise, but more intimately as well. He, too, is a sort of hunter, but one who hunts terrestrial creatures rather than aquatic. The sophist is first defined as a hired hunter of rich young men (223b; 231d).

So far angling seems well suited to direct the inquirers toward their goal. Set on the right track, the rest of the division is readily completed. But at the end of the first division, the Stranger remarks that the sophist's art is really quite complicated (223c). He then turns his attention to a feature mentioned toward the end of that division. The sophist earns wages from those he hunts. He has a product to sell. Returning to acquisitive art, the Stranger this time ignores the branch that leads to hunting, and instead follows the other branch, beginning from the art of acquisition by exchange, and defines the sophist as someone engaged in commerce, who sells products for the soul (224c-d; 231d). In the pages that follow, the Stranger focuses on various features of the sophist's activity and defines him in five different ways. Each time the sophist turns up at the tips of branches that stem from acquisitive art. Then on a sixth round the Stranger makes a fresh initial division of art, marking off the art of separation, and finds the sophist at the terminus of a branch originating from there.

What are we to make of the fact that the sophist turns up all over the tree, and not at a single terminus like the angler? The angler differs from the sophist in two main respects. First, the essence of the angler is evident from his activity and is easy to spell out using dichotomous division. As the Stranger says in the Statesman (quoted above § 2), some things are easily pictured. The angler's essential activity, fishing by means of a special hook, is perceptible and can be readily depicted. The essence of the sophist, too, might seem easy to picture from his activities. He engages in many activities, which we can observe. So it seems appropriate to define him in a number of ways. But the essence of the sophist, as we soon discover, is none of those things. His essential activity cannot be pictured, as angling can.

Second, the nature of angling is uncontroversial. The Stranger and Theaetetus mean the same thing by the name (Sophist 218e). By contrast, people have various conceptions of what sophistry is, witnessed by the numerous divisions. They may also disagree about what objects fall under the concept. Because sophistry is a disputed notion, people may have incompatible conceptions of it, and some conceptions may be simply mistaken.

4.2 Appearances

The sophist is not unique in his tendency to turn up all over a tree. Any concept, including very simple ones, can do the same, because different people's conceptions of things are based on their diverse experience of them. People are likely to share the same conception of an angler, because he engages in a single observable activity. But anything of any complexity, which engages in several activities, is apt to be conceived in different ways by different people. Some of those conceptions may capture the entity by a feature or activity essential to it, but many others will capture it in some accidental way. Division does not itself guarantee that one is attending to essential features. Furthermore, a dispute might arise about virtually any object, but in many cases disputes can be settled by perception or by some straightforward decision-procedure (disputes about number can be settled by counting; disputes about size or weight by measuring or weighing; cf. Euthyphro 7b-8e; Phaedrus 263a-c). But in many cases there is no ready way to settle disputes. In Plato's Socratic dialogues, Socrates hoped to find definitions of disputed moral and aesthetic concepts that would enable people to decide whether an action is pious or impious, just or unjust, beautiful or not beautiful. His efforts repeatedly failed.

The anomalous sixth division of the sophist (Sophist 226b-231b) is important because it exhibits that sophistry itself is a disputed concept. Whereas the first five divisions locate the sophist somewhere under acquisitive art, the sixth division locates him in a quite different place, under the art of separation, which was not even marked off in the original dichotomous division. This sophist purifies souls of beliefs that interfere with learning. He looks a lot like Socrates. The Stranger queries using the label “sophist” in this case and calls the art he has just uncovered the “noble” art of sophistry. The sixth division exploits the fact that many people mistook Socrates for a sophist (cf. Aristophanes' depiction of Socrates in the Clouds and Socrates' defense against the charge in Plato's Apology). This definition fails to capture the sophist by even an accidental feature. Instead it snares a distinct kind, which merely has the same name owing to a superficial resemblance.

What is special about the sophist is not the fact that he turns up all over the tree, or that some conceptions pick out different kinds altogether that are merely called by the same name. What is unique about the sophist is that the phenomenon in his case does not merely reflect something about us and our experience: it is in part explained by something about him and his art. The Stranger restates the six definitions of the sophist (231c-e), and then says in a key passage:

Do you know that, when someone appears to know many things, and is called by the name of one art, this appearance (phantasma) is not sound, but it is clear that the person experiencing it in relation to some art is unable to see that [feature] of it toward which all these sorts of learning look, and so he addresses the person having them by many names rather than one? (232a)

The sophist has been defined as a hired hunter of rich young men, as engaged in selling his own and other people's wares for the soul, as an expert in disputation for financial profit, and so on. Why is the appearance not sound, and why does it indicate that we, who experience that appearance, have failed to see that feature “toward which all these sorts of learning look”? We have been calling all six conceptions by the name “sophist.” Why does the Stranger say that those who experience this unhealthy appearance call the object by many names instead of one?

The Stranger will go on to point out that the sophist makes people think he knows things he doesn't know (232b-233c). His pretense would certainly explain the unhealthiness of the appearance of manifold expertise. But the preceding discussion and definitions leading up to the key passage have not revealed the sophist's pretense. One must look ahead in the dialogue to see that. Instead the unhealthy appearance seems to rest on the very fact that the sophist, as so far defined, has so many sorts of expertise—he knows how to hunt, how to make a profit, how to sell his own intellectual wares, how to dispute about justice and injustice, how to purify the soul of ignorance. What is unhealthy is this appearance of manifold expertise called by one name, "sophistry" (cf. Notomi 1999, 80). It is our mistake. And because we fail to detect that feature of the sophist's art “toward which all these sorts of learning look,” we call him by many names instead of one—we call him a “hunter,” a “merchant,” an “eristic,” and so forth. But in fact, if we could grasp the feature that ties the appearances together, we should call the individual who engages in those many activities by one name: “sophist.”

What are we missing? As the discussion proceeds, the Stranger argues that we are missing the feature of sophists that explains how they can successfully appear wise to their students, when they are not in fact wise (233b). We carefully defined the sophist in terms of many of his activities but none of those makes him what he is. We have so far missed the essence of the sophist. That is why we mistakenly call him by many names instead of one.

The Stranger introduces a new model (233d) to help us recognize the special nature of the sophist's art. Consider someone who claims to make all things by means of a single art. The one art that might enable him to do that is the art of imitation, which creates images with the same names as the originals (234b). The imitator might fool children, who see his products from a distance, into thinking he can make anything he wants. Furthermore, someone might achieve the same result with statements (logoi), making large things appear small, and easy things hard (234c-e). This person, too, could fool young people who don't know. This is what we were missing: the sophist is a sort of wizard, who imitates things with words (234e-235a). That is what holds all the appearances together: he imitates people who truly know the things he appears to know.

With this insight, the Stranger declares that we have nearly caught the sophist, and he sets off once again with his divisions (this seventh division will be finally completed at the end of the dialogue). This time the visitor ignores the entire branch of acquisitive art from which the first five divisions set out and instead takes the other branch stemming from productive art down to image-making, which he divides into two parts: (1) copy-making (eikastikê), and (2) appearance-making (phantastikê). Whereas a copy-maker preserves the proportions of the model (paradeigma in its more usual sense), and keeps the appropriate colors and other details; an appearance-maker alters the true proportions of the original, so that the image appears beautiful from a distance (235e-236a). In which group should we locate the sophist? The Stranger's proclaimed uncertainty on this point takes him into the dialogue's main project, the investigation of not-being. The problem is to make sense of appearances.

Stranger: This appearing and seeming, but not being, and stating things, but not true [things], all these were always full of difficulty in the past and they still are. It is very difficult, Theaetetus, to find terms in which to say that there really is false stating or judging, and to utter this without being caught in a contradiction. (236e-237a)

The essence of the sophist is that he produces appearances, and more precisely false appearances. He imitates the wise man (Sophist 268b-c). But how can we make sense of this appearing but not being, this stating things but not true things? The Stranger says that we must examine Parmenides, who famously said:

Never shall this be proved, that things that are not are. You keep your thought in your inquiry from that route. (237a = Diels and Kranz 1951-52, 28B7.1-2)

5. Not-Being and Being

To define the sophist as an expert in deception, as someone who produces false appearances by means of statements, the Stranger needs to show that Parmenides was wrong; he needs to demonstrate that it is possible to say and to think that things that are not are, and to do so without contradiction.

5.1 Puzzles

The Stranger presents a series of puzzles about not-being and then claims that we are in equal confusion about being (Sophist 243c). After criticizing various treatments of being, he concludes that to the extent that we can get clear about being or not-being, we will get clear about the other as well (250e-251a). The two groups of puzzles include several destructive puzzles, which terminate in frustration, and one or more constructive puzzles, which must somehow be countenanced, if the problem of appearance and falsehood is to be overcome (Owen 1971, 242). The destructive puzzles in both groups presuppose that a name picks out something, that different names pick out different things, and that each thing has one proper name. So the problem about not-being is that in trying to speak of it, we speak of something—something that is. It seems that the expression “not-being” should pick out nothing. Yet if there is nothing to be picked out, any expression we use to name it misfires (singular expressions pick out one thing; plural expressions pick out a number of things). We seem unable even to state the puzzles without contradiction.

The Stranger evidently finds the first three puzzles about not-being (237b-239c) persuasive, because later in the dialogue he says, apparently in reference to them: “If a statement (logos) is of nothing, it would not be a statement at all, for we have shown that a statement that is a statement of nothing cannot be a statement” (263c). As long as we suppose that in speaking or thinking of what is not, we are speaking or thinking of nothing—a non-subject—we cannot answer Parmenides or show how false statement is possible.

The assumption behind the destructive puzzles is highlighted in a passage about some people the Stranger derisively calls late-learners (251b-c). These people think that a thing can only be called by its own name and not by any other. You can call a man “man” and the good “good,” but you cannot call a man “good” (Moravcsik 1962, 56-59). These people think there should be a one-to-one correspondence between a thing and its name. To solve the problem about not-being and being, the Stranger needs to give an account of how one thing can be called by many names (251a-b).[2]

5.2 Great Kinds

To show that one thing can be called by many names and that some names specify the object but misdescribe it, the Stranger introduces some machinery. He proposes that some kinds can partake of, or blend or associate with, other kinds (these terms appear to be synonyms and to introduce an asymmetrical relation between an object and a property it has, pace Cornford 1935, 255-57), whereas some kinds cannot blend with each other (251d-e). There are great kinds that enable the blending of kinds, much as vowels enable consonants to fit together (252e-253a). Even as some expertise is required to determine which letters can associate with which, so dialectic is required to determine which kinds blend and which do not, and which kinds hold everything together and make them capable of blending, and which are causes of division (253b-e). (For alternative interpretations of dialectic in the Sophist, see Stenzel 1931 [1940]; Gómez-Lobo 1977.)

The Stranger announces that there are five great kinds (254b). He will ask two questions about them: (1) what are they like? and (2) what capacity do they have to associate with each other? (254c). The kinds to be discussed are: motion, rest, being, sameness and difference. Not-being will eventually be identified with difference (258d-e).

The Stranger does not say that these five are the only great kinds. There are probably others, including likeness and unlikeness, and oneness and multitude (cf. Parmenides 129d-3 and 130b-e). The second part of the Parmenides investigates such kinds, especially oneness and multitude, being and not-being, but also sameness and difference, likeness and unlikeness, equality and inequality, and others. The Stranger presumably selects the five he does in the Sophist, because for the present purpose he needs a pair of opposites that exclude each other (motion and rest, described as “most opposite” [250a8; cf. 255a-b], which serve as consonant forms unable to blend with each other) and three vowel forms—being, sameness, and difference—which enable kinds to fit together or to be marked off from others.

The interpretation of this central section of the Sophist has been much discussed and remains controversial. One fruitful approach is to read this section of the Sophist in light of the second part of the Parmenides. The Parmenides achieves a number of strange results by treating kinds like sameness and difference, and likeness and unlikeness as though they were determinate kinds, like justice and injustice, and virtue and vice (see e.g., Parmenides 147c-148d, with M.L. Gill 1996, 80-85). To avoid the puzzles one must recognize that vowel forms are singularly different from ordinary kinds. Whereas ordinary kinds have determinate (or what Aristotle would call categorial) content, vowel forms are content-neutral. The greatest of the great kinds apply to everything, including themselves. Philosophers in the Middle Ages would call such kinds transcendentals, since they transcend Aristotle's ten categories (substance, quantity, quantity, and the other categories). Gilbert Ryle called them syncategorematic: these entities are not highly generic kinds. If one views them as such, one treats them as determinate, since generic kinds have (very general) content. In Ryle's words, the vowel forms “function not like the bricks but like the arrangement of the bricks in a building” (Ryle 1939 [1965], esp. 131, 143-44). They structure other kinds and enable them to relate to one another. Let us call them formal kinds.

Formal kinds apply to determinate individuals and kinds on the basis of other, ultimately determinate properties those entities have. For instance, two objects are equal or unequal if they have some definite size or duration, or if they are numerable. Two objects are like, if they have one or more properties in common. A red cube and a red ball are like because they share redness in common. They are unlike, because their shapes are different. The identity of the formal kinds themselves is determined by their functional roles in enabling determinate kinds to be what they are and/or to associate with or differ from one another.

Motion and rest are great kinds, but they exclude—are incompatible with—each other. Motion is sometimes treated as a determinate kind. In the Parmenides (138b, 139a), it is divided into species, alteration and locomotion, and locomotion is further divided into spinning in the same place and moving from one place to another. The Stranger needs a pair of consonant forms to demonstrate the operation of the vowel forms.

5.3 The Distinction of Great Kinds

In the first part of this section (254d-255e), the Stranger addresses question (1): What is each of the great kinds like? He distinguishes each of the five kinds from one another, starting with being, motion, and rest. Motion and rest, as opposites, do not associate with each other; but being associates with both, since both of them are. Being must be a third thing distinct from them: If being, which applies to both opposites, were the same as either of them—say motion—then when being applies to rest, by substitution rest would partake of its own opposite. But that is impossible, since rest and motion do not blend (254d with 243d-244b and 249e-250e). The Stranger uses a similar argument to show that sameness and difference are distinct from motion and rest (254e-255b). Furthermore, being is distinct from sameness. They have to be different, because if they were not, when we say that motion and rest both are, we could substitute the same, and motion would be the same as rest. (Much more can be said about sameness: see Lewis 1976, and de Vries 1988.)

Finally, the Stranger distinguishes difference from being. This argument introduces a crucial distinction between two modes of predication and deserves a separate subsection.

5.4 The Distinction between Difference and Being

The Stranger begins with an important distinction, which he uses to differentiate difference from being:

But I suppose you agree that some of the things that are are themselves by themselves (auta kath hauta), whereas others are always said in relation to other things (pros alla).—Of course.—But difference is always in relation to something different (pros heteron), isn't it?—Yes.—And this would not be the case, if being and difference were not distinct. For if difference partook of both forms (i.e., auto kath hauto and pros alla), as being does, then something even among the different things could be different without being different in relation to something different. But in fact it has turned out for us that necessarily whatever is different is the very thing that it is [i.e., different] from something different. (255c-d)

So the nature of difference is a fifth kind (255d-e).

Furthermore, we shall say that it pervades all of them, since each one is different from the others not because of its own nature, but because it partakes of the form of the different. (255e)

Difference is distinct from being, because difference is always in relation to other things (pros alla) and more precisely in relation to something different (pros heteron), whereas being is both itself by itself (auto kath hauto) and in relation to other things (pros alla).

What is it for something to be itself by itself and/or in relation to other things (for a detailed discussion, see Dancy 1999)? The traditional understanding of the distinction relies on a passage from Diogenes Laertius (first half of the 3rd century CE). Diogenes uses the expression “in relation to something” (pros ti) in place of “in relation to other things” (pros alla):

Of things that are, some are by themselves (kath heauta), whereas others are said in relation to something (pros ti). Things said by themselves are ones that need nothing further in their interpretation. These would be, for instance, man, horse and other animals, since none of these gains through interpretation. All the things said in relation to something need in addition some interpretation, for instance, that which is greater than something and that which is quicker than something and the more beautiful and such things. For the greater is greater than something less and the quicker is quicker than something. So of things that are some are said themselves by themselves (auta kath hauta), whereas others are said in relation to something (pros ti). In this way, according to Aristotle, he [Plato] used to divide the primary things. (Diogenes Laertius III.108-109)

Many scholars have thought that, in saying that being is said both itself by itself (auto kath hauto) and in relation to other things (pros alla), Plato is distinguishing different senses of the verb “to be”—a complete or absolute sense (= existence, as in “The sea is”) and an incomplete sense (the “is” of predication, as in “the sea is blue” and/or the “is” of identity, as in “the sea is the sea”) (Cornford 1935; Ackrill 1959). There is no separate verb “to exist” in classical Greek. Existence was expressed by means of the verb “to be.”

The trouble with supposing that the Stranger characterizes being as having two (or more) senses is that Plato would then need two (or more) forms of being, one for each sense. Note that the Stranger introduces sameness (identity) as a distinct kind. Frede (1967, 1992), Malcolm (1967), and Owen (1971) insist that Plato does not mark off two senses of the verb “to be,” but only different uses, since he speaks of only one form of being. There are significant differences between these scholars' views, but their common ground, that Plato uses being only as an incomplete predicate, has been queried. Sentences in the Sophist like, “Motion is, because it partakes of being” (256a) are most naturally construed as using “is” as a complete predicate (existence).

But if Plato does use the verb “to be” as a complete predicate, why does he not mention two forms, one for existence and one for incomplete “is”? Lesley Brown (1986) has argued that there is no sharp semantic distinction between the two syntactically distinct uses of the verb “to be” in “x is F” and “x is.” The “is” in “x is” is complete but allows (indeed expects) a further completion. If Brown is right, the correct observation of Frede and others can be preserved, that there is only one form of being; yet claims in the Sophist like “Motion is, because it partakes of being,” can also be accommodated. Motion is (exists), because it is something—it has a property that makes it the very thing that it is: motion.

Notice that on this view the complete use of “is” in Greek does not correspond to existence in our modern sense: we say that horses exist, whereas imaginary objects, like Pegasus, do not. On the proposed interpretation, anything describable is (exists). So Pegasus is (exists), since we can describe him as a winged horse. On the other hand, what is not is nothing at all—indescribable. It was this notion of not-being—a nonentity—that was responsible for the earlier puzzles about not-being in the Sophist.

Supposing that being is a formal kind that functions in two ways, let us consider its operation with determinate kinds. Take some determinate kind F. F is itself by itself (auto kath hauto), if being links F to itself, to what F is by (or because of) itself. For instance, motion is moving by itself, largeness is large by itself, heat is hot by itself, the one is one by itself. All of these statements are self-predications of the sort Plato's characters mention in earlier dialogues (largeness is large, justice is just; for self-predications in the Sophist, see 258b-c). Scholars disagree about how to understand self-predication in Plato. (For a view quite different from that articulated here, see the entry on Plato: middle period metaphysics and epistemology.) The item in the subject position and the item in the predicate position are identical, but the relation between them is predication (cf. Heinaman 1981). F has its own nature by (or because of) itself. One might say that the property F exhausts what F is in its own right.

F is in relation to other things, if being links F to something other than itself. For instance, motion is different from rest. Here being links motion to difference, and difference relates motion to something other than motion. Or motion is the same as itself: “When we say motion is the same as itself, we speak in this way because of its participation in the same in relation to itself [pros heautên])” (256a-b). Being links motion to sameness, and sameness relates motion to itself.

Notice that Plato speaks often of participation and blending but mentions no distinct form of participation. He mentions no distinct form, because being simply is the form that links an object to a property it has.

Difference is always in relation to something different (pros heteron) (255d). Difference invariably relates the kind F to something different from F.

Although the operation of difference as a formal kind always relates an entity F to something other than F, difference can itself stand in the subject position and be related to itself (via being itself by itself). Difference is different by (or because of) itself (259a with 255e and 258c). Being and difference admit of self-predication like any other kind.

5.5 The Blending of Kinds

The second part of the treatment of great kinds takes up question (2): What capacity do the five kinds have to associate with each other? The Stranger carries out the analysis for one great kind, motion (255e-256d), and argues very systematically that motion is non-identical with each of the other four kinds (motion is not rest, not the same, and so on), but partakes of three of the four—all but rest. Thus it turns out that motion both is and is not each of the others (the Stranger even adds the counterfactual: if motion could partake of rest there would be nothing strange about calling it resting [256b]). The whole analysis is implemented with two relations: non-identity (F is not G, because F partakes of difference from G), and positive predication (F is G, because F partakes of G). For example, motion is not the same, because motion partakes of difference from the same, but motion is the same, because motion partakes of sameness in relation to itself (256a-b).

Scholars have noted that the Stranger's machinery, as so far articulated, seems inadequate to address the upcoming problem of false statement. The visitor has provided an analysis of identity (via being and sameness), non-identity (via being and difference), and positive predication (via being). What about negative predication, which Plato needs for the analysis of false statements, like “Theaetetus is flying”? Isn't this statement false, precisely because the negative predication, “Theaetetus is not flying,” is true? Can Plato also handle negative predication?

6. False Statement

With the main machinery in place for his analysis, the Stranger will shortly turn to false statement. But two preliminary topics remain: (1) How does negation work? (2) What is a statement?

6.1 Negation

The Stranger made a serious mistake about negation in the last two (constructive) puzzles about not-being earlier in the dialogue (240b, 240d). The mistake was to suppose that the negation in “not-being” indicates the opposite (enantion) of being (opposites are polar incompatibles, and these include polar contraries, like black and white, which have some intermediate between them, and polar contradictories, like odd and even, and motion and rest, which do not [Keyt 1973, 300 n. 33]). The opposite of being (its polar contradictory) is nothing. Parmenides was right to object that we cannot speak or think about nothing. If any speaking or thinking is going on, we are speaking or thinking about something. The Stranger showed in the first three (destructive) puzzles about not-being that any attempt to refer to nothing fails. But Parmenides was wrong to suppose that all talk about what is not is attempted talk about nothing.

The problem of not-being is solved by recognizing two things: (1) the negation operates on the predicate, not the subject; (2) the negation need not specify the opposite of the item negated but only something different from it.

Some scholars think that the Stranger extends his machinery to include negative predication, as well as non-identity, at the end of the section on great kinds. He appears to switch his focus from the subject to the predicate, which he says applies to or is about the subject. Thus he sums up his conclusions about motion and generalizes to other kinds saying: “And so necessarily not-being is in application to (epi) motion and in reference to (kata) all the other kinds” (256d); and then: “So about (peri) each of the forms the being is much and the not-being is unlimited in multitude” (256e). The not-being that applies to some entity, say motion, is taken to include negative predications (e.g., is not quick) as well as non-identities (e.g., is not rest) (for interpretations of this sentence, see esp. McDowell 1982, and Frede 1992).

The Stranger calls attention to the mistake about negation and offers a solution. Here too he focuses on the predicate:

When we say “not being” (to mê on), as it seems, we don't mean something opposite to being, but only different.—How?—For instance, when we call something “not large,” we don't indicate by the expression the small any more than the equal.—Of course.—So we won't agree when someone says a negation signifies an opposite; we will agree only to this much, that the “not” when prefixed to the names following it reveals something different [from the names], or rather from the things which the names uttered after the negation designate. (257b-c)

Apparently, when one says, “Simmias is not large,” one indicates by the “not” merely something different from large. Simmias could be equal or small in comparison with someone else.

Now there is a pressing question. Does the speaker designate by “not large” just anything other than large (e.g., human being, just, red-haired, blue-eyed, etc. etc.)? The discussion of not-large itself suggests otherwise. “Different from large,” while it does not mean the opposite of large (= small), surely means some size other than large, which includes large, equal and small. The negation appears to specify part of a wider kind which is determined by the positive term (large) that is negated—in this case size.

In characterizing the nature of difference, the Stranger compares it to knowledge (257c-d) (on this analogy, cf. Lee 1972). Knowledge is of course a determinate kind, and so many species of knowledge are structurally different from one another (see below § 7.2). Even so, the comparison is instructive because some branches of knowledge, such as applied mathematics, are differentiated from one another, not by intrinsic differences in the structure of the expertise, but by differences in the objects to which the same expertise applies (e.g., calculation in surveying and navigation). Like varieties of applied mathematics, whose content is supplied by the domain to which the knowledge is applied, there are kinds of difference whose content is supplied by the objects differentiated.

The visitor gives a second example of negation, which helps to clarify this point. There is a part of the different that is placed over against the beautiful. This is called “not beautiful” and it is different from nothing other than the nature of the beautiful (257d). The Stranger then says:

Doesn't it turn out in this way that the not beautiful, having been marked off from (aphoristhen) some one kind among beings, is also again in turn set in opposition (antitethen) to some one of the things that are? (257e)

Two kinds are mentioned here in addition to the not-beautiful. The not-beautiful is marked off from some one kind among beings, and then set in opposition to the beautiful. The not-beautiful is not just anything other than beautiful, but something other than beautiful within a kind that covers both (let's call it “the aesthetic”).

If this is right, there will be as many kinds of difference as there are terms to be negated—difference can range over size (containing large and not-large), over temperature (containing hot and not-hot), over the aesthetic (containing beautiful and not-beautiful), and so on. These kinds of difference are structurally alike but their content is determined by the items differentiated. A kind of difference (say size) contains two parts, which are opposites (polar contradictories), such as large and not-large. Let us call this kind an incompatibility range. This will prove important for the analysis of negative predication.

6.2 Statement

To make a statement, two things are required (Frede 1992): First, one must identify an object one intends to say something about. A statement must single out an object for there to be a statement at all. Second, one must specify something one intends to say about the object. So a statement consists minimally of two parts, one part that refers to the object the statement is about (subject), and one part that says something about that object (predicate). Only once there is a statement consisting of these two parts, is there something that can be true or false (262e-263b).

The Stranger distinguishes between names and verbs (261e-262a). A verb is a sign that is set over actions (or properties); a name is a sign that is set over the things that perform the actions (or have the properties) (262a). There cannot be a sentence that is simply a string of names or a string of verbs. A statement must fit a name together with a verb (262a-c).

The central idea is very simple. Statements are structured. The name refers to an object (if it fails to pick out anything there is no statement at all, true or false [262e]). The verb says something about the object. If the predicate states something that is about the subject (i.e., one of the properties the object has), the statement is true. If the predicate states something that is not about the subject (i.e., something different from what is true about the object), then the statement is false (263b). For instance, “Theaetetus is sitting” is true, because “sitting” specifies something that is about Theaetetus, who is currently sitting. “Theaetetus is flying” is false, because “flying” specifies something different from what is about Theaetetus. Notice that the Stranger states the falsehood thus: “Theaetetus (to whom I'm now speaking) is flying” (263a). The falsehood is about Theaetetus, who is currently sitting.

6.3 Negative Predication

The statements the Stranger considers, “Man learns,” “Theaetetus is sitting,” and “Theaetetus is flying,” are all positive predications, the first two true, the third false. But as noted above (§ 5.5), we need negative predication to explain the false statement, “Theaetetus is flying.” If “Theaetetus is flying” is false, it is false because the negative predication “Theaetetus is not flying” is true. Negative predication has received considerable attention in the scholarly literature on the Sophist (for helpful accounts of the various interpretations, and their advantages and disadvantages, see Keyt 1973, and van Eck 1995). Does Plato need a second notion of negation in addition to difference (= distinctness or non-identity), such as incompatibility, to accommodate negative predication (for arguments that he does, see e.g., Lee 1972, and Lewis 1977)? If so, does he need a second form, in addition to difference, to provide for that other meaning? Plato mentions only one form of difference, just as he mentions only one form of being. Alternatively, does he need universal quantification in order to analyze negative predication? In saying that Theaetetus is not flying, does he need to say that flying is different from everything that Theaetetus is—a man, snub-nosed, sitting, and so on? If so, he fails to provide it (see Wiggins 1971; Bostock 1984, 113; White 1993, §§ 10, 11).

If Plato construes difference as a formal kind, which operates in the way we have discussed, the problem of negative predication can be handled. There is no need to consider all of Theaetetus's properties to explain the falsehood of “Theaetetus is flying.” Plato has already introduced the notion of an opposite, which is put to work in the analysis of negative predication. The analysis of negative predication (as distinct from non-identity) is complex. First, the item negated, say large, indicates an incompatibility range (a kind of difference), in this case size, which consists of a pair of opposites, large and not-large. The negation then indicates something different (distinct, non-identical) from large within that range. Thus, in the case of Theaetetus' flight, we must merely find that property different from flying within the relevant incompatibility range (perhaps animal locomotive activity). Since Theaetetus is currently sitting, and sitting is a locomotive activity different from flying, we can explain his not flying simply by appeal to his sitting. (Wiggins 1970, 301, entertains this possibility, though he regards it as an amendment of Plato's account. We have cited some evidence that he adopts this solution. Further indications are discussed below in § 7.2).

7. Method and Metaphysics in the Statesman

Like the Sophist, the opening division in the Statesman locates a problem with its target kind. Whereas the sophist turned up all over the tree, the statesman turns up at a single terminus, but he is not alone. Many rivals have a claim to be there too. Furthermore, just as the puzzle about the sophist revealed by the opening divisions indicated something significant about the essence of a sophist, so the competition at a single terminus indicates something significant about the essence of a statesman.

7.1 The Statesman and the Herdsman

The opening division in the Statesman takes place in two stages—a first stage that focuses on the statesman's knowledge, followed by a lecture on method, and a second stage that focuses on the object of that knowledge. Both phases of the division are peculiar but in quite different ways.

Consider stage one. Having set off down the theoretical branch of knowledge in search of the statesman, the Stranger divides theoretical knowledge into two sub-kinds. One kind recognizes difference, judges things recognized and then leaves off; the other kind recognizes difference and judges things recognized, and then directs on the basis of that judgment (statecraft is located here) (Statesman 259d-260c). Directing suggests practical knowledge, which was marked off and abandoned at the start (cf. Dorter 1994, 184). Next the Stranger divides directive knowledge into two sub-kinds: one kind passes on the directions of others, whereas the other kind passes on its own directions for the sake of generation (statecraft belongs here) (260c-261b). Knowledge for the sake of generation again suggests practical expertise. The statesman's knowledge looks ever more practical as the division proceeds. At the next division one kind passes on its own directions for the sake of generating inanimate things, whereas the other is engaged in the generation of animate things (statecraft belongs here) (261b-d). This latter kind is then divided into those who engage in generating and rearing single animate things, and those who generate and rear them in herds (statecraft and herding belong here) (261d). Once the statesman is merged with the herdsman, the theoretical branch has become thoroughly mixed up with the practical branch originally discarded. The knowledge of horse-breeders, cowherds, shepherds, and swineherds is highly practical. No wonder the statesman has company at the terminus. Everyone concerned with practical aspects of human care—farmers, millers, physical trainers, and doctors—turns up at the terminus together with him (267e).

At the end of the first stage of the division, when the inquirers have reached herd-rearing, the Stranger invites Young Socrates to make the next division himself. By now Socrates sees where the division is heading and suggests marking off the rearing of humans (= statecraft) from the rearing of beasts (ordinary herding) (262a). The Stranger objects: That is like dividing the human race into Greek and barbarian. We have a name “barbarian,” but it merely refers to humans who do not speak Greek. The mistake is like marking off the number 10,000 from all the other numbers (262a-263a). Numbers other than 10,000 have merely a negative property in common—being numbers other than 10,000. The Stranger insists that Young Socrates divide through the middle of things, not break off one small part, leaving many large ones behind, which do not constitute a kind. The Stranger goes on to give a lecture on the difference between mere parts of a kind and parts that are themselves genuine kinds (263b). It appears that proper kinds include members that have some positive feature in common, whereas mere parts include members that share only some negative feature.

Scholars have taken the Stranger's lecture very seriously as indicating Plato's views about proper procedure and the metaphysics on which division relies (see Moravcsik 1973, Cohen 1973, and Wedin 1987). But before we assess Young Socrates' mistake and the Stranger's lecture, we should consider the second stage of the division, which purportedly demonstrates correct procedure.

First the visitor retraces his steps and points out that in speaking of rearing animate things, they had already in effect divided living creatures into wild and tame (264a). All rearing is concerned with tame creatures, and some of that rearing devotes itself to tame animals in herds. He then divides herd-rearing into aquatic and terrestrial (the branch he pursues). Next he marks off the winged from the footed (the branch he pursues); then the horned (oxen, sheep) from the hornless (the branch he pursues); then the interbreeding (horses, donkeys) from the non-interbreeding (the branch he pursues); and finally the four-footed (just pigs are left) from the two-footed (humans). Statecraft can now be defined as rearing the two-footed, non-interbreeding, hornless, footed, terrestrial, tame herd: humans (267a-c).

This is the division that has given Platonic division a bad name. Why does Young Socrates go along with it? The statesman turns out to be more akin to the swineherd than the swineherd is to the cowherd and shepherd. There is much to query about this division, but the main question is this. How is the isolation of human beings from other animals by means of their physical features relevant to the investigation? The target kind is statecraft, a sort of knowledge, and the statesman who possesses such knowledge. The definition of statecraft no more needs an elaborate demarcation of its objects from all other animals than the definition of angling needs an elaborate demarcation of fishes from all other creatures. The second stage of the division adds nothing to the definition of statecraft.

7.2 The Statesman's Knowledge

Young Socrates' division of herding into the herding of humans and the herding of other animals seems, in retrospect, to have considerable merit. Indeed, the proposal suggests that he is applying an important lesson from earlier that day. As we saw (§ 6.1), in the Sophist the Stranger argued that a negation does not mean the opposite of the term negated, but only something different from it within an incompatibility range. Thus “not-large” need not pick out the opposite of large, but merely some size other than large (Sophist 257b-c); and “not-beautiful” need not pick out the opposite of beautiful but merely some aesthetic property other than beautiful (Sophist 257c-258c). The Stranger called the not-beautiful a part of the different, which is set over against the beautiful (257d-e). Not only is the not-beautiful a part of the different. Both the beautiful and the not-beautiful are beings (257e), and furthermore, the not-beautiful is one kind (eidos hen), which has its own nature (phusis). The not-beautiful is in its own nature not beautiful (258b-c). If the not-beautiful and the not-large are kinds with their own natures, why does the Stranger chastise Socrates for treating animals other than human as a kind? And why does he object to barbarian and numbers other than 10,000 as kinds? These, too, would be approved as kinds in the Sophist.

Young Socrates has made the right cut, but he has lost sight of the target. The kind under investigation is knowledge of a particular sort—herd-rearing. He should be distinguishing the knowledge of human herding from all other herding by a difference in the mode of herding (Statesman 275a). He is treating herding as though it were a single undifferentiated whole, marked off merely by the objects to which it applies. But herding is not like calculation, which can simply be applied to different objects. There is an internal structural difference between the art of human herding (= statecraft) and all other herding (cf. Lane 1998, 44). After the upcoming myth,[3] the visitor claims that he has revealed several problems with the opening division. He and Young Socrates were right to characterize the statesman as ruling over the whole city, but they failed to specify the manner of his rule. The visitor acknowledges that what they said was true, but declares that it was incomplete and unclear (275a). By treating knowledge of herding as a single undifferentiated capacity, which can be applied to different objects, the inquirers failed to recognize how the rearing of humans differs from that of all other animals. There is a big difference. No one disputes with the cowherd his claim to look after all aspects of the life of his herd. He rears them; he is their doctor, their match-maker, their breeder and trainer. The same is true of all other herdsmen, with one exception: the herdsman of humans, the statesman (267c-268c; 275d-e). In his case alone many rivals compete for the title of care-taker, since they look after various aspects of human life. Something about the nature of the statesman's art, and not about its objects, accounts for that difference. That was Young Socrates' mistake.

The Stranger's lecture on parts and kinds is pertinent, but not in the way one initially expects. If we want to divide humankind into two, it is indeed a mistake to differentiate Greek and barbarian (262c-d). Greek and barbarian are mere parts of humankind and not themselves subordinate kinds. But if the target kind were Greek speaker, and the kind to be divided were language user, the division into Greek and barbarian would be quite appropriate. Division is directed toward a goal, a target kind to be defined. That target (however vague or even misguided the initial conception of it) determines what wide kind to divide (art in the Sophist, knowledge in the Statesman), and what successive divisions are relevant (cf. Ackrill 1970, 384; Cavini 1995, 131). Different targets (the angler, the sophist, the statesman, and even Theaetetus' current locomotive activity) prompt the investigators to carve up the world in different ways. What counts as a “natural joint” (Phaedrus 265e1-3; cf. Statesman 262a8-b1), a proper break between kinds and not mere parts, depends on the target under investigation. The definition of statecraft, when ultimately discovered, will mention humans, since the city is the object of the statesman's knowledge, and humans make up a city. But human being is not a kind into which knowledge should be divided. The essence of statecraft must be found in the structure of that expertise.

Earlier we observed (§ 4.2) that the problems of definition to which the Sophist calls attention, though not unique to the sophist, are in his case partially explained by his essence. The same is true of the statesman. The inquirers have trouble sticking to a single thread. We have noticed that they tangle the threads of theoretical and practical knowledge. This difficulty arises, because statecraft, as we finally learn, involves both theoretical and practical knowledge (cf. Statesman 284c; 289d with 305d). Because of the nature of his expertise, the statesman is intimately connected with everyone engaged in the care of humans: the truest criterion (horos) of the statesman, says the Stranger, is that by which the wise and good man manages the affairs of the ruled for the benefit of the ruled (296d-297b). So their business is also his business.

Even had Young Socrates focused on what was special about the statesman's knowledge as opposed to that of other herdsmen, the first division could not have taken the inquirers the whole distance. The resulting definition would not have shown how the statesman differs from other care-takers of human life. But reflection on the shortcomings of that division eventually suggests a way to get beyond the impasse. What is the special manner of the statesman's care? Perhaps the statesman somehow combines theoretical and practical knowledge in managing the interactions of the members of his flock. Indeed, perhaps his essence is or includes the art of combining, like a weaver. The last part of the dialogue recognizes this connection and takes weaving as its model.

7.3 Weaving and Statecraft

The Stranger quickly presents a dichotomous division that yields the art of weaving. Weaving is defined as the art in charge of clothes (279c-280a). Like the definition of the statesman reached in the first part of the dialogue, this definition, for all its detail, is too general, since many arts compete for the same title: carding, spinning, spindle-making, mending, clothes-cleaning, and others. The dichotomous division fails to isolate the mode of clothes-working peculiar to weaving.

The model of weaving serves two main functions. First, it introduces a new procedure, which shows how to mark off the art to be defined from others akin to it, which are located in the lowest kind reached by the previous dichotomous division. As earlier noted (§ 3.2), the new procedure is division by limbs, “like a sacrificial animal” (287c). Whereas dichotomous division separates a kind into two parts, and then ignores at each step the part that does not lead to the goal; division by limbs breaks off pieces of an original whole, whose members are interrelated and share a common domain, and defines the art in relation to the others that share its domain. All the arts of clothes-working have clothes as their object. Many of the kindred arts turn out to contribute to weaving by providing its tools or preparing its materials (these are characterized as sunaitiai, “helping causes”). The differentiation of weaving from various subsidiary arts reveals a procedure to define statecraft in relation to its subordinate arts.

Second, like the model of angling, weaving is relevant not only in indicating a useful procedure that yields a definition, but also as an example. The essence of weaving—intertwining different kinds of threads—indicates an essential feature of statecraft. The statesman weaves in a number of ways. In particular, he weaves together into one fabric the virtues of courage and moderation, which often clash in the city. The statesman and the weaver have many other features in common. They are both experts in measurement: they measure the more and the less not only in relation to each other but also in relation to some goal they aim to achieve (284a-e) (on the two sorts of measurement, see esp. Sayre, forthcoming). Furthermore, both are said to direct the subsidiary experts, whose products and activities they use (308d-e). The statesman directs the experts who are, as it were, the practical arms of his expertise: the orator, the general, the judge, and the teacher. The statesman must be an expert in timing to determine when the general should go to war (on the importance of timing, see Lane 1998), though he leaves it to the general to work out the details of military strategy and carry them out. He must determine the good that rhetoric will serve, though he leaves the techniques and practice of persuasion to the rhetorician. The statesman must decide whether a particular goal is best achieved through force or persuasion, or through force with some people, persuasion with others, and then delegate the tasks to the appropriate experts. The statesman must also decide what is just and lawful, though he leaves it to the judges to implement his judgment. The statesman must further determine what mix of courage and moderation will most advance the good in the city, though he leaves it to the teachers to instill in the youth the right belief about what is good (308e-310a). The visitor tells us that the statesman cares for every aspect of things in the city, weaving them together in the most correct way (305e).

8. Metaphysics and Dialectic in the Sophist and Statesman

In the first part of the Parmenides, the youthful Socrates set out a theory of forms reminiscent of forms in the Phaedo and the Republic. This theory was then subjected to intense scrutiny by Parmenides. There were two fundamental questions: What forms are there? and what is the nature of the relation between physical objects and forms—the relation known as participation? At the end of the interrogation in Part I, when Socrates had failed to rescue his theory, Parmenides came to its defense, saying that if someone with an eye on all the difficulties denies that there are stable forms, he will have nowhere to turn his thought and will destroy the power of dialectic entirely (Parmenides 135b-c). Scholars look to the Sophist and Statesman and other late dialogues in the hope of finding Plato's answer to the problems posed in the Parmenides. Does Plato continue to treat forms as he did in the Phaedo and Republic, despite the objections? Are the objections answerable and was Socrates simply too inexperienced to answer them adequately? Do the late dialogues record Plato's on-going perplexity? Or do they seriously modify Plato's earlier positions?

Our investigation of the Sophist and Statesman prompts several observations. First, these two dialogues are engaged from beginning to end in dialectic, and the Statesman explicitly claims that the exercise is to make us better dialecticians. So Plato clearly thinks that dialectic is possible. Second, both dialogues are searching for the essence of their objects. An essence is something stable, which makes its possessor be what it is. Both dialogues are fairly successful in their search for the essence of their objects. The objects of the investigation—the sophist and the statesman—are both characterized as great and difficult kinds (Sophist 218c5-d9; Statesman 278e7-8; cf. 279a7-b2), as opposed to the angler and weaver, which are humble and easy to track down. But the Stranger identifies the essence of those humble objects too. Are the sophist, the statesman, the angler, and the weaver or their arts separate forms of the sort described in the Phaedo? Strange if they are, since these experts and their expertise are human inventions. These kinds are not said to exist separately from actual practitioners. Although the Stranger alludes to “immaterial things, which are finest and greatest, [which] are shown clearly by account alone and by nothing else,” and claims that “all things said now are for the sake of those” (Statesman 286a-b), the sophist and the statesman appear to be among those great objects. There are other great objects as well, including not only the philosopher, but also the separate immaterial forms discussed in the Timaeus (widely regarded as a late dialogue). But those separate forms are absent from the Sophist and Statesman.

In addition to determinate kinds like the sophist and statesman, there are also the great kinds discussed in the Sophist—motion, rest, being, sameness and difference. These kinds were recognized in the Parmenides (cf. the “common notions” at Theaetetus 184-186). But these great kinds seem very different from ordinary kinds like the sophist and statesman. The vowel forms—being, sameness, and difference—appear to structure other kinds, enabling them to be what they are and to relate to one another. The task of dialectic is to discover and articulate those structures. Formal kinds are closely tied to dialectic, as Parmenides foretold, but both forms and dialectic seem to have developed apace since the Phaedo and the Republic.


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Plato | Plato: Cratylus | Plato: middle period metaphysics and epistemology | Plato: on knowledge in the Theaetetus