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Medieval Theories of Obligationes

First published Mon 14 Jul, 2003

Obligationes (literally, "obligations") or disputations de obligationibus were a medieval disputation format that became very widespread in the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries. Although their name might suggest they had something especially to do with ethics or moral duty, they did not. The purpose of these disputations has been something of a mystery to modern scholars. Several kinds of disputations de obligationibus were distinguished in the medieval literature. The most widely studied kind to date was called "positio" (= positing). This kind of "obligational" disputation shows, in some authors' theories, a marked similarity to recent theories of counterfactual reasoning. On the other hand, there are also suggestive indications that the medieval disputation de obligationibus lay at the background of the modern practice of the academic "thesis defense."

1. Disputations de obligationibus

The medieval disputation de obligationibus was a highly stylized academic disputation form between two parties, an "opponent" (opponens) and a "respondent" (respondens). From at least the early thirteenth century, a literature began to appear, in independent treatises as well as discussions as part of larger works, on how to conduct such disputations.[1] This literature was regarded as belonging to logic, and the study of obligationes became part of the logic curriculum followed by undergraduates.[2] Despite the name "obligationes," which in Latin as much as in English suggests obligation in the sense of "duty," such disputations need not have anything at all to do with ethics or morality. Treatises on obligationes, therefore, are not early works in deontic logic.[3] Instead, what is "obligatory" in such disputations is merely that the two parties are "obliged" to follow the rules of the format.

2. Origins

Some late-medieval authors claimed that the theoretical basis for obligationes came from two passages in Aristotle (Prior Analytics I.13.32a18–20, Metaphysics IX.4.1047b10–12), both of which say merely that when something possible is posited, nothing impossible results.[4] But this cannot be the origin of the obligationes literature. The first treatises on obligationes are earlier than the ready availability of the Metaphysics in Latin translation, and do not mention either passage in any case. Moreover, while it is certainly true that obligational disputations never require an impossibility to follow when a possibility is posited, that fact does not by itself account for some of the most characteristic features of obligationes. Indeed, some of the earliest discussions concern what happens not when a possibility is posited, but when an impossibility is posited.[5]

It is precisely this feature, in fact, that at least two early treatises attribute to Aristotle[6]:

And Aristotle says this. For he says, "The impossible is to be posited so that it may be seen what follows on that basis."


That impossible positing has to be maintained is proved as follows: For just as we say that the possible is to be conceded so that it may be seen what follows on that basis, likewise we have it from Aristotle that the impossible is to be conceded so that it may be seen what happens on that basis.

No such passage can be found in Aristotle, although Professor Christopher Martin has found a suggestive parallel in Boethius's On Hypothetical Syllogisms.[8]

In any event, the emergence of the obligationes literature still remains a mystery. It cannot be fully explained in terms of these possible sources. For there were several other kinds or "species" of obligationes besides "positing." The early Obligationes Parisienses, for example, distinguishes six kinds; the same six are found also in Walter Burley and William of Ockham: positing (positio), counterpositing (depositio), "let it be doubted" (dubitetur), institution (institutio), the truth of the matter (rei veritas), and petition (petitio).[9] Apart from "positing," most of these kinds of obligationes have been little studied in the modern literature.

3. Positio

The most widely discussed kind of obligatio, both in the medieval literature and in recent scholarship, is no doubt positio or "positing." In a positio the "opponent" begins by saying "I posit that p." The proposition p is called the "positum." The "respondent" then says either "I admit it" or "I deny it," depending on certain conditions. For example, the treatises by Roger Swyneshed, Robert Fland, and Richard Lavenham all stipulate that in order for the positum to be "admissible," it must be a contingent proposition.[10] Other authors, as we have seen above, allow the positum to be an impossible proposition, provided that its impossibility is not "manifest," so that the proposition can be entertained and believed.[11] We shall not consider such cases here.

If the respondent denies the positum, the disputation is over before it really gets started. If he admits the positum, the disputation is under way: The opponent then "proposes" to the respondent a series of propositions, one after another. To each such propositum the respondent must reply by saying "I concede it," "I deny it," or "I doubt it," according to certain rules.[12] The rules stipulate that the correct response depends in part on whether the propositum is "relevant" or "irrelevant" (pertinens/impertinens), and if it is relevant whether it is "sequentially relevant" or "incompatibly relevant" (pertinens sequens/pertinens repugnans). The specification of these notions and of how they affect the correct response to the propositum constitutes the kernel of the theory of positio, and varied from author to author.

3.1 Walter Burley's theory

Walter Burley's account represents what was perhaps the "default" or "standard" theory.[13] According to him[14]:

  1. For each step n of the disputation, beginning with the first propositum as step 1, the propositum is "sequentially relevant" at step n if and only if it logically follows from the conjunction of the positum together with any propositions that have been conceded at earlier steps of the disputation, and together with the contradictories of any positions that have been denied at earlier steps. The propositum is "incompatibly relevant" at step n if and only if its contradictory follows from that same conjunction. It is "irrelevant" at step n if and only if it is neither sequentially relevant nor incompatibly relevant there.
  2. For each step n of the disputation, and for each propositum p, the respondent must concede p at step n if it is sequentially relevant at n, and must deny it if it is incompatibly relevant at n. If p is irrelevant at step n, the respondent must reply according to his knowledge of the actual facts (independent of what is posited in the disputation). Thus, if p is irrelevant at n and the respondent knows it is true in fact, he must concede it; if p is irrelevant at n and the respondent knows it is false in fact, he must deny it; if p is irrelevant and the respondent does not know whether it is true or false, he must doubt it.

The disputation continues until the opponent says "Cedat tempus," which can either mean "Time is up!" (the disputation is over) or "Time out!" In the latter case the disputation is interrupted temporarily while the opponent points out some mistake in the respondent's replies or makes some other observation. In both senses, the point is the same: the respondent is not "obligated" by the rules of positio except when the "game clock" is running.[15]

An example will help clarify the rules.

  Opponent Respondent Comments
  I posit that Atlanta is the capital of Pennsylvania. I admit it. Atlanta is not in fact the capital of Pennsylvania. But that does not prevent the opponent from positing that it is.
Step 1: Atlanta is south of the Mason-Dixon Line. I concede it. From the positum it follows neither that Atlanta is south of the Mason-Dixon Line nor that it isn't. (The positum says nothing at all about the location of the Mason-Dixon Line.) Hence step 1 is irrelevant. Nevertheless, since the respondent knows that step 1 is in fact true, he must concede it.
Step 2: The capital of Pennsylvania is south of the Mason-Dixon Line. I concede it. From the positum and the already conceded step 1, step 2 follows. Hence it is sequentially relevant and must be conceded.
  Time is up!    

Several peculiar things should be noted about these rules. First, the burden of the rules falls almost entirely on the respondent. As long as he picks an "admissible" positum to begin with, the opponent is otherwise free to propose anything he pleases at any step of the disputation.

Second, note the role of the respondent's epistemic state. It is a factor in determining the correct replies, but only when the propositum is irrelevant.

Third, note that order counts. That is, depending on the order in which propositions are proposed, different replies to them may be required. Thus if steps 1 and 2 were reversed in the above example, both would have to be denied:

  Opponent Respondent Comments
  I posit that Atlanta is the capital of Pennsylvania. I admit it. As before.
Step 1: The capital of Pennsylvania is south of the Mason-Dixon Line. I deny it. From the positum it follows neither that the capital of Pennsylvania is south of the Mason-Dixon Line nor that it isn't. (As before, the positum says nothing about the location of the Mason-Dixon Line.) Hence step 1 is irrelevant. Nevertheless, since the respondent knows that step 1 is in fact false, he must deny it.
Step 2: Atlanta is south of the Mason-Dixon Line. I deny it. From the positum and the contradictory of step 1 (step 1 was denied, recall), the contradictory of step 2 follows. Hence step 2 is incompatibly relevant and must be denied.
  Time is up!    

This set of rules guarantees that positio is "consistent" in each of the following three, progressively stronger senses[16]:

Nevertheless, on Burley's theory positio fails to be "consistent" in another sense[18]:

As an example of this failure, let p and q be contingent propositions neither of which logically implies the other, and let the respondent know that q is false whereas he does not know the truth value of p. Then:

  Opponent Respondent Comments
  I posit that p or q. I admit it.  
Step 1: p I doubt it. The positum implies neither p nor not-p. Step 1 is therefore irrelevant. Thus, since the respondent does not know its truth value, he must doubt it.
Step 2: q I deny it. The positum implies neither q nor not-q. Step 2 is therefore irrelevant. (Since step 1 was neither conceded nor denied, it does not affect whether step 2 is relevant or irrelevant.) Since the respondent knows that q is in fact false, it must be denied.
Step 3: p I concede it. Step 3 follows from the positum and the contradictory of step 2 (step 2 was denied, recall). Hence it must be conceded, even though the same proposition was doubted in step 1.
  Time is up!    

Clearly positio on Burley's theory is a very peculiar kind of disputation.

3.2 Roger Swyneshed's theory

Burley's theory of positio was not the only one. Another account seems to have originated with a certain Roger Swyneshed, who wrote an Obligationes probably sometime after 1330 and certainly before 1335 (Spade [1977]). This alternative theory was recognized by Robert Fland, a mid-fourteenth century author about whom very little is known. Fland reports both Burley's theory and Swyneshed's theory, calling them the "old response" and the "new response," respectively. He does not choose between them, but simply tells the respondent to pick whichever one he likes (Spade [1980], §20). Richard Lavenham, on the other hand, a later-fourteenth century author contemporary with John Wyclif, accepts Swyneshed's version of positio outright. A certain John of Wesel from mid-fourteenth century Paris also shows knowledge of Swyneshed's views (John of Wesel [1996]). Nevertheless, Swyneshed's views seem to have generated some controversy. For instance, Ralph Strode, in the later-fourteenth century (roughly contemporary with John Wyclif), rejected features of Swyneshed's theory with some heat, as did Peter of Candia and the Logica magna attributed to Paul of Venice (Spade [1982a], pp. 337–39).

Swyneshed's theory of positio is in many respects like Burley's, but differs in one major respect. For Swyneshed, in assessing whether a propositum is relevant or irrelevant, the responses to previous proposita do not matter. That is, for him, a propositum is "sequentially relevant" if and only if it logically follows from the positum alone; it is "incompatibly relevant" if and only if its contradictory opposite follows from the positum alone; it is "irrelevant" if and only if it is neither sequentially nor incompatibly relevant.

Swyneshed's "new response" greatly simplifies the task of the respondent. He no longer has to keep track of what has previously been conceded or denied in the disputation. The order in which propositions are proposed no longer matters. All the respondent has to do is to make sure he responds appropriately whenever the propositum either follows from or is inconsistent with the positum alone, and otherwise just respond according to his knowledge of the actual facts. As long as he does that, he has performed correctly.

Unlike Burley's theory, Swyneshed's guarantees that positio is consistent in sense 4 above.[19] On the other hand, while for Swyneshed positio is consistent in sense 1 and sense 2 above, it fails to be consistent in sense 3.[20] For example, suppose you know you are sitting somewhere in Oxford, and then consider the following positio (Spade [1977], §100):

  Opponent Respondent Comments
  I posit that you are in Rome or you are running. I admit it. The fact that both disjuncts are false does not prevent the proposition's being "admissible."
Step 1: You are in Rome or you are running. I concede it. This is just a repetition of the positum, except that here it is not being posited but proposed. It is obviously sequentially relevant, and so must be conceded.
Step 2: You are not in Rome. I concede it. Neither step 2 nor its contradictory follows from the positum alone. Hence it is irrelevant. Since (by hypothesis) it is also known to be true, it has to be conceded.
Step 3: You are not running. I concede it. Ditto.
  Time is up!    

The proposita in steps 1–3 form an inconsistent triad, and yet each of them has to be conceded in accordance with Swyneshed's rules.

Burley's and Swyneshed's were not the only theories of positio, although they seem to have been the most widely discussed. Other theories were suggested too, but they are not yet thoroughly studied or understood.[21]

4. The purpose of the disputations

What was the purpose of positio? The question is not an easy one.[22] For, oddly, although medieval authors themselves speak of positio as a kind of "disputation," there seems at first to be nothing really in dispute! Look back at the preceding examples. They do not settle, or even try to settle, anything whatever about the capital of Pennsylvania, the location of the Mason-Dixon Line, whether you are sitting or running in Rome or in Oxford, or anything else. Unlike the medieval quaestio format, where there was a real issue being pursued and a real conflict of opposing views, there seems to be nothing like that going on in a positio. What then was its purpose?

Philotheus Boehner, perhaps the first recent scholar to discuss obligationes at all, suggested they were a rudimentary attempt to formulate a theory of axiomatic method (Boehner [1952], p. 14). But on the contrary, a theory of deduction (whether axiomatic or otherwise, whether rudimentary or not) is nowhere formulated in medieval discussions of obligationes. It is rather presupposed there, in the notion of "relevance." Furthermore, axiomatic method or "logical consequence" does not appeal to a person's epistemic state, as the rules of positio do in their treatment of irrelevant proposita.

Some later scholars have suggested that these disputations were meant as "exercises" or perhaps "examinations" of students' skills. But skills at doing what? We have just seen that it would not be their purely logical skills that would be exercised or examined. What other skills were they? Skills at arguing according to the rules of obligatio? No doubt, but without some further explanation, why would anyone want to do that?

4.1 Positio as counterfactual reasoning

One suggestion is that positio might be viewed as something like a theory of counterfactual reasoning.[23] On this account, a positio would explore "what would happen" if the positum were true but everything else stayed as much as possible the same as it really is. This suggestion provides some rationale for the otherwise mysterious treatment of irrelevant proposita, where one looks away from the posited situation back to reality to guide one's responses. In similar fashion, where a counterfactual hypothesis does not require otherwise, counterfactual reasoning typically tries to stay as close as possible to reality.

Furthermore, theories of positio bear striking formal similarities to modern theories of counterfactuals. Transitivity, contraposition and strengthening the antecedent all fail, and a variety of other characteristics of counterfactuals seem to be mirrored in the theory of positio.[24]

This suggestion has met considerable resistance (Stump [1981] and [1985], Martin [1993]). One objection is that, at least on Burley's "standard" theory of positio, if a positum is possible but nevertheless known to be false, the opponent can maneuver the respondent into having to concede any proposition whatever consistent with the positum. Let p be such a positum, and let q be consistent with p. Then:

  Opponent Respondent Comments
  I posit that p. I admit it.  
Step 1: Not-p or q. I concede it. If p logically implies q, then step 1 is sequentially relevant, and so has to be conceded. If p does not logically imply q, step 1 is irrelevant, since q is by hypothesis consistent with p. In that case, since p is known to be false, not-p is known to be true, and step 1 has to be conceded as an irrelevant truth.
Step 2: q I concede it. The propositum q follows from the positum and the conceded proposition in step 1. Hence it is sequentially relevant and must be conceded.
  Time is up!    

This is a very bad result if positio is a form of counterfactual reasoning. For it means that, starting from any known falsehood, one could reason counterfactually to anything whatever consistent with it.

Another objection might be that counterfactual reasoning, at least as we are think of it today, does not incorporate epistemic factors in the way the theory of positio does. It is one thing to say that we do not know what would happen under a given counterfactual hypothesis; it is quite another thing to say, as this suggestion has it that the theory of obligationes does, that what would happen depends in part on what we do know in fact.

Positio as a "thesis defense"

Another suggestion is that positio might lie at the background of the modern academic practice of the "thesis defense." ‘Positio’, after all, is just Latin for the Greek ‘thesis’. Furthermore, to this day, the characteristic terminology of "opponent" and "respondent" is preserved in some European academic thesis-defenses. Moreover, despite our earlier sense that there is, oddly, nothing really "in dispute" in a positio, it is relatively easy to find medieval discussions—not in treatises or other passages devoted specifically to the theory of obligationes, but in other texts—where the characteristic vocabulary and procedures of positio are appealed to in a context where some substantive view is being argued.[25] That view, however, is not to be found in the positum or in any of the subsequent proposed steps of the positio. It is rather a view that the respondent takes himself to know (and so is prepared to "defend"), and that will therefore affect the responses he gives to irrelevant proposita. The view being "defended," therefore, is not a view explicitly stated anywhere in the disputation, but a kind of background assumption that underlies the respondent's replies. This suggestion has some promise, but has not yet been thoroughly explored in the recent literature. One objection might be that, despite the initial attractiveness of the fact that Latin ‘positio’ is the same as Greek ‘thesis,’ this view ends up divorcing the "thesis" being defended by the respondent from the positum in the disputation.

The jury is still out. It must be admitted that no one has yet explained positio, much less the obligationes-literature in general, in a fully satisfactory way. An adequate account would have to accommodate

5. Other kinds of obligatio

Apart from positio, the other kinds of obligatio recognized in the medieval literature have not been studied nearly so much. One kind that perhaps needs little separate study is "counterpositing" (depositio). In effect, if "positing" requires the respondent to uphold the positum as true (by conceding what follows from it, etc.), "counterpositing" requires the respondent to uphold the depositum as false (by denying what implies it, etc.). In other respects, counterpositing seems, mutatis mutandis, to be a trivial variation on positing.[26] This itself raises an interpretive problem: why treat counterpositing as a separate kind of obligatio at all?

Another kind that that probably needs only cursory recognition is "doubting." Doubting (dubitatio), like counterpositing, is a variation on positing. In this case, the respondent is required to uphold the dubitatum as doubtful. (Recall the role of doubtful irrelevant propositions in a positio.) Again, while the complications can get get confusing in practice, theoretically this seems a trivial variation on positing. One wonders again why it some authors singled it out as a separate kind of obligatio.[27]

A few words should be said about other kinds of obligatio. Even apart from the context of obligationes, "institution" (or "imposition") was regarded as the assigning of meaning to expressions of language. Within the context of obligationes, the issue seems to have revolved around how institution or imposition affected the correct responses in an obligational disputation. Suppose we call a tail a leg (that is, "impose" the word ‘leg’ to include tails). How many legs does a lion have? Should we say five, on the grounds that we are calling tails legs? Or should we continue to say four, on the grounds that our replies are to be given according to the meanings words actually have, quite apart from whatever meanings they might (counterfactually) be assumed to have in the context of a disputation? (See Spade [1982a], pp. 339–40.)

"Petition" (petitio) has been completely ignored in the recent literature, and little can be said that is informative about it. Somewhat more has been said about "the truth of the matter" (rei veritas), but not much (Spade [1994–1997]).

6. Conclusion

The medieval obligationes-literature is still not well understood. Yet its vocabulary ("positing," "conceding," "admitting," "relevance/irrelevance") appears ubiquitously in late medieval scholastic writings. Plainly, much remains to be studied.


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Boethius, Anicius Manlius Severinus | Burley [Burleigh], Walter | medieval philosophy | medieval philosophy: literary forms of | Ockham [Occam], William | Paul of Venice