Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.


First published Tue May 13, 2003; substantive revision Thu Aug 21, 2003

Mereology (from the Greek μερος, ‘part’) is the theory of parthood relations: of the relations of part to whole and the relations of part to part within a whole. Its roots can be traced back to the early days of philosophy, beginning with the Presocratic atomists and continuing throughout the writings of Plato (especially the Parmenides and the Thaetetus), Aristotle (especially the Metaphysics, but also the Physics, the Topics, and De partibus animalium), and Boethius (especially In Ciceronis Topica). Mereology has also occupied a prominent role in the writings of medieval ontologists and scholastic philosophers such as Garland the Computist, Peter Abelard, Thomas Aquinas, Raymond Lull, and Albert of Saxony, as well as in Jungius's Logica Hamburgensis (1638), Leibniz's Dissertatio de arte combinatoria (1666) and Monadology (1714), and Kant's early writings (the Gedanken of 1747 and the Monadologia physica of 1756). As a formal theory of parthood relations, however, mereology made its way into modern philosophy mainly through the work of Franz Brentano and of his pupils, especially Husserl's third Logical Investigation (1901). The latter may rightly be considered the first attempt at a rigorous formulation of the theory, though in a format that makes it difficult to disentagle the analysis of mereological concepts from that of other ontologically relevant notions (such as the relation of ontological dependence). It is not until Leśniewski's Foundations of a General Theory of Manifolds (1916, in Polish) that the pure theory of part-relations as we know it today was given an exact formulation. And because Leśniewski's work was largely inaccessible to non-speakers of Polish, it is only with the publication of Leonard and Goodman's The Calculus of Individuals (1940) that this theory has become a chapter of central interest for modern ontologists and metaphysicians.

In the following we shall focus mostly on contemporary formulations of mereology as they grew out of these recent theories -- Leśniewski's and Leonard and Goodman's. Indeed, although such theories came in different logical guises, they are sufficiently similar to be recognized as a common basis for most subsequent developments. To properly assess the relative strength and weaknesses, however, it will be convenient to proceed in steps. First we consider some core mereological notions and principles. Then we proceed to an examination of the stronger theories that can be erected on this basis.

1. ‘Part’ and Parthood

A preliminary caveat is in order. It concerns the very notion of parthood that mereology is about. The word ‘part’ has many different meanings in ordinary language, not all of which correspond to the same relation. Broadly speaking, it can be used to indicate any portion of a given entity, regardless of whether it is attached to the remainder, as in (1), or detached, as in (2); cognitively salient, as in (1)-(2), or arbitrarily demarcated, as in (3); self-connected, as in (1)-(3), or disconnected, as in (4); homogeneous, as in (1)-(4), or gerrymandered, as in (5); material, as in (1)-(5), or immaterial, as in (6); extended, as in (1)-(6), or unextended, as in (7); spatial, as in (1)-(7), or temporal, as in (8); and so on.

(1)    The handle is part of the cup.
(2) This cap is part of my pen.
(3) The left half is your part of the cake.
(4) The US is part of North America.
(5) The contents of this bag is only part of what I bought.
(6) That corner is part of the living room.
(7) The outermost points are part of the perimeter.
(8) The first act was the best part of the play.

All of these cases illustrate the notion of parthood that forms the focus of mereology. Often, however, the word ‘part’ is used in English in a restricted sense. For instance, it can be used to designate only the cognitively salient relation of parthood illustrated in (1) and (2) as opposed to (3). In this sense, the parts of an object x are just its “components”, i.e., those parts that are available as individual units regardless of their interaction with the other parts of x. (A component is a part of an object, rather than just part of it; see Tversky 1989). Clearly, the properties of such restricted relations may not coincide with those of parthood broadly understood, so the principles of mereology should not be expected to carry over automatically.

Also, the word ‘part’ is sometimes used in a broader sense, for instance to designate the relation of material constitution, as in (9), or the relation of mixture composition, as in (10), or even a relation of conceptual inclusion, as in (11):

(9)    The clay is part of the statue.
(10) Gin is part of martini.
(11) Writing detailed comments is part of being a good referee.

The mereological status of these relations, however, is controversial. For instance, although the constitution relation exemplified in (9) was included by Aristotle in his threefold taxonomy (Metaphysics, Δ, 1023b), many contemporary authors would rather construe it as a sui generis, non-mereological relation (see e.g. Wiggins 1980, Rea 1995, and Thomson 1998). Similarly, the ingredient-mixture relationship exemplified in (10) is subject to controversy, as the ingredients may involve significant structural connections besides spatial proximity and may therefore fail to retain certain important chemical characteristics they have in isolation (see Sharvy 1983). As for cases like (11), it may simply be contended that the term ‘part’ appears only in the surface grammar and disappears at the level of logical form, e.g., if (11) is paraphrased as “Every good referee writes detailed comments.” (For more examples and tentative taxonomies, see Winston et al. 1987, Iris et al. 1988, and Gerstl and Pribbenow 1995.)

Finally, it is worth stating explicitly that mereology assumes no ontological restriction on the field of ‘part’. The relata can be as different as material bodies, events, geometric entities, or geographical regions, as in (1)-(8), as well as numbers, sets, types, or properties, as in the following examples:

(12)   2 is part of 3.
(13) The integers are part of the reals.
(14) The first chapter is part of the novel.
(15) Humanity is part of personhood.

Thus, although both Leśniewski's and Leonard and Goodman's original theories betray a nominalistic stand, resulting in a conception of mereology as an ontologically parsimonious alternative to set theory, there is no necessary link between the analysis of parthood relations and the philosophical position of nominalism.[1] As a formal theory (in Husserl's sense of ‘formal’, i.e., as opposed to ‘material’) mereology is simply an attempt to lay down the general principles underlying the relationships between an entity and its constituent parts, whatever the nature of the entity, just as set theory is an attempt to lay down the principles underlying the relationships between a class and its constituent members. Unlike set theory, mereology is not committed to the existence of abstracta: the whole can be as concrete as the parts. But mereology carries no nominalistic commitment either: the parts can be as abstract as the whole. David Lewis's Parts of Classes (1991), which provides a mereological analysis of the set-theoretic universe, is a good illustration of this “ontological innocence” of mereology.

2. Basic Principles

With these provisos, and barring for the moment the complications arising from the consideration of intensional factors (such as time and modalities), let us now review some core mereological principles. To some extent, these may be thought of as lexical axioms fixing the intended meaning of the relational predicate ‘part’. However, the boundary of what is philosophically uncontroversial is difficult to draw, so it will be convenient to proceed step by step, starting from the obvious and adding more substantive principles as we go on.

2.1 Parthood as a Partial Ordering

The obvious is this: No matter how one feels about matters of ontology, if ‘part’ stands for the general relation exemplified by all of (1)-(8) above, then it stands for a partial ordering -- a reflexive, antisymmetric, transitive relation:

(16) Everything is part of itself.
(17) Two distinct things cannot be part of each other.
(18) Any part of any part of a thing is itself part of that thing.

To be sure, this characterization is not entirely uncontroversial. In particular, since Rescher (1955) several authors have had misgivings about the transitivity principle (18) (see e.g. Lyons 1977: 313, Cruse 1979, and Moltman 1997). Rescher writes:

In military usage, for example, persons can be parts of small units, and small units parts of larger ones; but persons are never parts of large units. Other examples are given by the various hierarchical uses of ‘part’. A part (i.e., biological subunit) of a cell is not said to be a part of the organ of which that cell is a part. (1955: 10)

Arguably, however, such misgivings stem from the aforementioned ambiguity of ‘part’. What counts as a biological subunit of a cell may not count as a subunit (a distinguished part) of the organ, but it is nonetheless part of the organ. The military example is more to the point, yet it also trades on an ambiguity. If there is a sense of ‘part’ in which soldiers are not part of larger units, it is a restricted sense: a soldier is not directly part of a batallion -- the soldier does not report to the head of the batallion. Likewise, one can argue that a handle is a functional part of a door, the door is a functional part of the house, and yet the handle is not a functional part of the house. But this involves a departure from the broader notion of parthood that mereology is meant to capture. To put it differently, if the general intended interpretation of ‘part’ is narrowed by additional conditions (e.g., by requiring that parts make a direct contribution to the functioning of the whole), then obviously transitivity may fail. In general, if x is a φ-part of y and y is a φ-part of z, x need not be a φ-part of z: the predicate modifier ‘ φ ’ may not distribute over parthood. But that shows the non-transitivity of ‘φ-part’ (e.g., of direct part, or functional part), not of ‘part’. And within a sufficiently general framework this can easily be expressed with the help of explicit predicate modifiers.

The other two properties -- reflexivity and antisymmetry -- are less controversial, though also in this regard some qualifications are in order. Concerning reflexivity (16), a familiar objection -- due again to Rescher -- is that

many legitimate senses of ‘part’ are nonreflexive, and do not countenance saying that a whole is a part (in the sense in question) of itself. The biologists' use of ‘part’ for the functional subunits of an organism is a case in point. (1955: 10)

This is of little import, though. Taking reflexivity (and antisymmetry) as constitutive of the meaning of ‘part’ amounts to regarding identity as a limit (improper) case of parthood. A stronger relation, whereby nothing counts as part of itself, can obviously be defined in terms of the weaker one, hence there is no loss of generality (see section 2.2 below). Vice versa, one could frame a mereological theory by taking proper parthood as a primitive instead. This is merely a question of choosing a suitable primitive. Formally, the issue therefore boils down to the previous point: a φ-part may not quite behave as a part simpliciter, where φ is the additional condition of being distinct from the whole.

Finally, concerning the antisymmetry postulate (17), one may observe that this rules out “non-well-founded” mereological structures. Sanford (1993: 222) refers to Borges's Aleph as a case in point:

I saw the earth in the Aleph and in the earth the Aleph once more and the earth in the Aleph… (Borges 1949: 151)

In this case, a plausible reply (following van Inwagen 1993: 229) is that fiction delivers no guidance to conceptual investigations. Conceivability may well be a guide to possibility, but literary fantasy is by itself no evidence of conceivability. However, the idea of a non-well-founded parthood relation is not pure fantasy. In view of certain developments in non-well-founded set theory (i.e., set theory tolerating cases of self-membership and, more generally, of membership circularities -- see Aczel 1988; Barwise and Moss 1996), one might indeed suggest building mereology on the basis of an equally less restrictive notion of parthood that allows for closed loops. This is particularly significant in view of the possibility of reformulating set theory in mereological terms -- a possibility that is explored in the works of Bunt (1985) and Lewis (1991, 1993). Thus, in this case there is legitimate concern that one of the “obvious” meaning postulates for ‘part’ is in fact too restrictive. At present, however, no systematic study of non-well-founded mereology has been put forward in the literature, so in the following we shall confine ourselves to theories that accept the antisymmetry postulate along with relexivity and transitivity.

2.2. Other Mereological Concepts

It is convenient at this point to introduce some degree of formalization before we proceed further. This avoids ambiguities (such as those involved in the above-mentioned objections) and facilitates comparisons and developments. For definiteness, we shall work within the framework of a standard first-order language with identity, supplied with a distinguished binary predicate constant, ‘P’, to be interpreted as the parthood relation. Taking the underlying logic to be a standard predicate calculus with identity,[2] the above minimal requisites on parthood may then be regarded as forming a first-order theory characterized by the following proper axioms for ‘P’:

(P.1) Pxx Reflexivity
(P.2) (Pxy & Pyx) → x=y Antisymmetry
(P.3) (Pxy & Pyz) → Pxz Transitivity

(Here and in the following we simplify notation by dropping all initial universal quantifiers. All formulas are to be understood as universally closed.) We may call such a theory Ground Mereology -- M for short[3] -- regarding it as the common basis of any comprehensive part-whole theory.

Given (P.1)-(P.3), a number of additional mereological predicates can be introduced by definition. For example:

(19)    Oxy =df existsz(Pzx & Pzy) Overlap
(20) Uxy =df existsz(Pxz & Pyz) Underlap
(21) PPxy =df Pxy & ¬ Pyx Proper Part
(22) OXxy =df Oxy & ¬ Pxy Over-crossing
(23) UXxy =df Uxy & ¬ Pyx Under-crossing
(24) POxy =df OXxy & OXyx Proper Overlap
(25) PUxy =df UXxy & UXyx. Proper Underlap

An intuitive model for these relations, with ‘P’ interpreted as spatial inclusion, is given in Figure 1.

Figure 1

Figure 1. Basic patterns of mereological relations. In the leftmost pattern, the relations in parenthesis hold if there is a larger z including both x and y.

It is immediately verified that overlap is reflexive and symmetric, though not transitive:

(26)   Oxx
(27) Oxy → Oyx.

Likewise for underlap. By contrast, it follows from (P.1)-(P.3) that proper parthood is transitive but irreflexive and asymmetric -- a strict partial ordering:

(28) ¬ PPxx
(29) PPxy → ¬ PPyx
(30) (PPxy & PPyz) → PPxz.

As mentioned, one could use proper parthood as an alternative starting point (using (28)-(30) as axioms). This follows from the fact that the following equivalence is provable in M:

(31)  Pxy ↔ (PPxy or x=y)

and one could therefore use the right-hand side of (31) to define ‘P’ in terms of ‘PP’ and ‘=’. On the other hand, as with every partial ordering, it is worth observing that identity could itself be introduced by definition, due to the following immediate consequence of (P.2):

(32)  x=y ↔ (Pxy & Pyx).

Accordingly, theory M could be formulated in a pure first-order language by assuming (P.1) and (P.3) and replacing (P.2) with the following variant of the Leibniz axiom for identity (where φ is any formula):

(P.2′)  (Pxy & Pyx) → (φx ↔ φy).

In the following, however, we shall continue to assume that M is formulated in a language with both ‘P’ and ‘=’ as primitives.

3. Supplementation Principles

Theory M may be viewed as embodying the common core of any mereological theory. Not just any partial ordering qualifies as a part-whole relation, though, and establishing what further principles should be added to (P.1)-(P.3) is precisely the question a good mereological theory is meant to answer. These further principles are more substantive, and they are to some extent stipulative. However, some main options can be identified.

Generally speaking, a mereological theory may be viewed as the result of extending M by means of principles asserting the (conditional) existence of certain mereological items given the existence of other items. Thus, one may consider the idea that whenever an object has a proper part, it has more than one -- i.e., that there is always some mereological difference between a whole and its proper parts. This need not be true in every model for M: a world with only two items, one of which is P-related to the other but not vice versa, would be a counterexample, though not one that could be illustrated with the sort of geometric diagram used in Figure 1. Similarly, one may consider the idea that there is always a mereological sum of two or more parts -- i.e., that for any number of objects there exists a whole that consists exactly of those objects. Again, this need not be true in a model for M, and it is a matter of controversy whether the idea should hold unrestrictedly. More generally, one may consider extending M by requiring that the domain of discourse be closed -- on certain conditions -- under various mereological operations (sum, product, difference, and possibly others). Finally, one may consider the question of whether there are any mereological atoms (objects with no proper parts), and also whether every object is ultimately made up of atoms (or on what conditions an object may be assumed to be made up of atoms). Both of these options are compatible with M, and the possibility of adding corresponding axioms has interesting philosophical ramifications.

3.1. Parts and Remainders

Let us begin with the first sort of extension. The underlying idea can take at least two distinct forms. The simpler one consists in strengthening M by adding a fourth axiom to the effect that every proper part must be supplemented by another, disjoint part -- a remainder:

(P.4) PPxyexistsz(Pzy & ¬Ozx) Weak Supplementation

Call this extension Minimal Mereology (MM). Some authors (most notably Peter Simons 1987, from whom the term ‘supplementation’ is borrowed) regard (P.4) as constitutive of the meaning of ‘part’ and would accordingly list it along with the basic postulates of mereology. However, some theories in the literature violate this principle and it is therefore convenient to keep it separate from (P.1)-(P.3). A case in point would be Brentano's 1933 theory of accidents, according to which a soul is a proper part of a thinking soul even though there is nothing to make up for the difference. (See Chisholm 1978; for an assessment see Baumgartner and Simons 1994.) Another example is provided by Whitehead's 1929 theory of extensive connection, where no boundary elements are included in the domain of quantification: on this theory a topologically closed region includes its open interior as a proper part in spite of there being no boundary elements to distinguish them. (See Clarke 1981 for a rigorous formulation.)

The second way of expressing the supplementation intuition is stronger. It corresponds to the following axiom, which differs from (P.4) in the antecedent:

(P.5) ¬Pyxexistsz(Pzy & ¬Ozx) Strong Supplementation

This says that if an object fails to include another among its parts, then there must be a remainder. It is easily seen that (P.5) implies (P.4), so any theory rejecting (P.4) will a fortiori reject (P.5). (For instance, on Whitehead's boundary-free theory of extensive connection, a closed region is not part of its interior though they have exactly the same extended parts.) However, the converse does not hold. Consider a model with four distinct objects, a, b, c, d, such that c and d are P-related to both a and b. Then the corresponding instance of (P.4) is true, since each proper part counts as a supplement of the other; yet (P.5) is false, since both parts of a are part of (and therefore overlap) b, and both parts of b are part of (and overlap) a. Admittedly, it is difficult to imagine such objects; it is difficult to draw a picture illustrating two distinct objects with the same parts, because drawing an object is drawing its parts. Once the parts are drawn, there is nothing left to be done to get a drawing of the whole object. But this only proves that pictures are biased towards (P.5). In the non-spatial domain, for instance, the envisaged countermodel to (P.5) can be set up by identifying a and b with the ordered pairs <c, d> and <d, c>, respectively, interpreting ‘P’ as the relation of membership for ordered sets.

The theory obtained by adding (P.5) to (P.1)-(P.3) is thus a proper extension of the theory of Minimal Mereology obtained by adding (P.4). We label this stronger theory Extensional Mereology (EM). The attribute ‘extensional’ is justified precisely by the exclusion of countermodels that, like the ones just mentioned, contain distinct objects with the same proper parts. In fact, the following is a theorem of EM:

(33)  existszPPzx → (forallz(PPzx → PPzy) → Pxy).

from which it follows that non-atomic objects with the same proper parts are identical:

(34)  (existszPPzx or existszPPzy) → (x=yforallz(PPzx ↔ PPzy)).

(The analogue for ‘P’ is already provable in M, since P is reflexive and antisymmetric.) This is the mereological counterpart of the familiar set-theoretic extensionality principle, as it reflects the view that an object is exhaustively defined by its constituent parts, just as a set is exhaustively defined by its constituent elements. Nelson Goodman appropriately termed this mereological principle “hyper-extensionalism” (1958: 66), relating it to the ontological parsimony of nominalism:

A class (e.g., that of the counties of Utah) is different neither from the single individual (the whole state of Utah) that exactly contains its members nor from any other class (e.g., that of acres of Utah) whose members exactly exhaust this same whole. The platonist may distinguish these entities by venturing into a new dimension of Pure Form, but the nominalist recognizes no distinction of entities without a distinction of content. (Goodman 1951: 26)

3.2. Identity and Extensionality

Is EM a plausible theory? Apart from the counterexamples to (P.5) mentioned above, several objections have been raised against (34), in spite of its intuitive plausibility in the context of Goodman's geographic example. On the one hand, it is sometimes argued that sameness of parts is not sufficient for identity, as some entities may differ exclusively with respect to the arrangement of their parts. Two sentences made up of the same words -- ‘John loves Mary’ and ‘Mary loves John’ -- would be a case in point (Hempel 1953: 110; Rescher 1955: 10). Likewise, the identity of a bunch of flowers may depend crucially on the arrangements of the individual flowers (Eberle 1970: §2.10). A second familiar objection is familiar from the literature on material constitution, where the principle of mereological extensionality is sometimes taken to contradict the possibility that an object may be distinct from the matter constituting it. A cat can survive the annihilation of its tail, it is argued. But the amount of feline tissue consisting of the cat's tail and the rest of the cat's body cannot survive the annihilation of the tail. Thus, a cat and the corresponding amount of feline tissue have different (tensed or modal) properties and should not be identified in spite of their sharing exactly the same actual parts. (See e.g. Wiggins 1968, Doepke 1982, Lowe 1989, Johnston 1992, and Baker 1999, Sanford 2003 for this line of objection.) Conversely, if the identity relation is taken to extend over times or over possible worlds, as in standard tensed and modal talk, then the possibility of mereological change implies that sameness of parts is not necessary for identity. If a cat survives the annihilation of its tail, then the cat with tail (before the accident) and the cat without tail (after the accident) are numerically the same in spite of their having different proper parts (Wiggins 1980). If any of these arguments is accepted, then clearly (34) is too strong a principle to be imposed on the parthood relation. And since (34) follows from (P.5), it might be concluded that EM should be rejected in favor of the weaker mereological theory MM.

A thorough discussion of these issues is beyond the scope of this entry. (See the entries on Identity and Persistence). Some remarks, however, are in order. Concerning the sufficiency of mereological extensionality, i.e., the right-to-left conditional in the consequent of (34):

(35)  forallz(PPzx ↔ PPzy) → x=y,

it should be noted that the first sort of objection mentioned above may be dispensed with easily. Sentences made up of the same words, it can be argued, are best described as different sentencetokens made up of distinct tokens of the same wordtypes. There is, accordingly, no violation of (35) in the opposition between ‘John loves Mary’ and ‘Mary loves John’ (for instance), hence no reason to reject (P.5) on these grounds. Besides, even with respect to types it could be pointed out that the sentences ‘John loves Mary’ and ‘Mary loves John’ do not share all their proper parts. The string ‘John loves’, for instance, is only included in the first sentence. As for such more concrete examples as a bunch of flowers, a planetary system, or a fleet formation, it should be noted that these violate extensionality only insofar as we engage in tensed or counterfactual talk. It might be plausible to hold that a bunch of flowers would not (or no longer) be what it is if the flowers were arranged differently, or if they were scattered all over the floor. So, if the variables in (35) are taken to range over entities existing at different times, or at different possible worlds, then indeed (35) would appear to be too strong. It does not follow, however, that we have found a counterexample to extensionality if we confine ourselves to issues of syncronic identity in the actual world. (In essence, this amounts to treating sentences of EM as present tensed. So the interesting question is: Does perfectly general mereology, if it makes this move, require tense and modal logic?)

This leads to the second objection to the sufficiency of extensionality, which is more delicate. As a sufficient condition for individual identity (35) is indeed very strict. At the same time, abandoning it may lead to massive ontological multiplication: if the cat is different from the mereological aggregate tail+remainder, it must also be different from the aggregate head+remainder, and from the aggregate nose+remainder, and so on. How many entities then occupy the region occupied by the cat? To what principled criterion can we appeal to avoid this slippery slope? (Similarly, if a bunch of flowers is distinguished from the mere aggregate of the individual flowers constituting it on account of the fact that they have different modal properties -- the latter could while the former could not survive rearrangement of the parts -- then these must be distinguished also from many other mereological aggregates: the one consisting of rose#1+remainder, the one consisting of tulip#2+ remainder, and so on.)

On behalf of EM, and to resist such ontological exhuberance, it should be noted that the appeal to Leibniz's law in this context is to be carefully evaluated. Let ‘Tibbles’ name our cat and ‘Tail’ its tail, and let us grant the truth of

(36)   Tibbles can survive the annihilation of Tail.

There is, indeed, an intuitive sense in which the following is also true:

(37)   The amount of feline tissue consisting of Tail and the rest of Tibbles's body cannot survive the annihilation of Tail.

However, this intuitive sense corresponds to a de dicto reading of the modality, where the description in (37) has narrow scope:

(38)   In every possible world, the amount of feline tissue consisting of Tail and the rest of Tibbles's body has Tail as a proper part.

On this reading (37) is hardly negotiable (in fact, logically true). Yet this is irrelevant in the present context, for (38) does not amount to an ascription of a modal property and cannot be used in connection with Leibniz's law. (Compare the following fallacious argument: George W. Bush might not have been a US President; the 43rd US President is necessarily a US President; hence George W. Bush is not the 43rd US President.) On the other hand, consider a de re reading of (37), where the description has wide scope:

(39)   The amount of feline tissue consisting of Tail and the rest of Tibbles's body has Tail as a proper part in every possible world.

On this reading the appeal to Leibniz's law would be legitimate (modulo any concerns about the status of modal properties) and one could rely on the truth of (36) and (37) (i.e., (39)) to conclude that Tibbles is distinct from the relevant amount of feline tissue. However, there is no obvious reason why (37) should be regarded as true on this reading. That is, there is no obvious reason to suppose that the amount of feline tissue that in the actual world consists of Tail and the rest of Tibbles's body -- that amount of feline tissue that is now resting on the carpet -- cannot survive the annihilation of Tail. Indeed, it would appear that any reason in favor of this claim vis-à-vis the truth of (36) would have to presuppose the distinctness of the entities in question, so no appeal to Leibniz's law would be legitimate to establish the distinctess (on pain of circularity). This is not to say that the putative counterexample to (35) is wrong-headed. But it requires genuine metaphysical work and it makes the rejection of the strong supplementation principle (P.5) a matter of genuine philosophical controversy. (Similar remarks would apply to any argument intended to reject extensionality on the basis of competing modal intuitions regarding the possibility of mereological rearrangement, rather than mereological change, as with the flowers example. On a de re reading, the claim that a bunch of flowers could not survive rearrangement of the parts -- while the aggregate of the individual flowers composing it could -- must be backed up by a genuine metaphysical theory about these entities.)

Finally, consider the objection against (P.5) based on the intuition that sameness of parts is not necessary for identity, contrary to the left-to-right conditional in the consequent of (34):

(40)  x=yforallz(PPzx ↔ PPzy).

This objection proceeds from the consideration that ordinary entities such as cats and other living organisms (and possibly other entities as well, such as statues and ships) survive all sorts of gradual mereological changes. Clearly this a serious objection, unless those entities are construed as fictional entia succcessiva (Chisholm 1976). However, the difficulty is not peculiar to extensional mereology. For (40) is just a corollary of the identity axiom

(ID)  x=y → (φx ↔ φy).

And it is well known that this axiom calls for revisions when ‘=’ is given a diachronic reading. Arguably, any such revisions will affect the case at issue as well, and in this sense the above-mentioned objection to (40) can be disregarded. For example, if the basic parthood predicate were reinterpreted as a time-indexed relation (Thomson 1983), then the problem would disappear as the tensed version of (P.5) would only warrant the following variant of (40):

(41)  x=yforalltforallz(PPtzx ↔ PPtzy).

Similarly, the problem would disappear if the variables in (40) were taken to range over four-dimensional entities whose parts may extend in time as well as in space (Heller 1984, Sider 1997), or if identity itself were construed as a contingent relation that may hold at some times but not at others (Gibbard 1975, Myro 1985, Gallois 1998). Such revisions may be regarded as an indicator of the limited ontological neutrality of extensional mereology. But their independent motivation also bears witness to the fact that the controversies about extensionality, and particularly about (40), stem from genuine and fundamental philosophical conundrums and cannot be assessed by appealing to our intuitions about the meaning of ‘part’.

4. Closure Principles

Let us now consider the second way of extending M, corresponding to the idea that a mereological domain must be closed under various operations.

4.1. Finitary Operations

Take first the operations of sum and product. (Mereological sum is sometimes called “fusion”.) If two things underlap, then we may assume that there is a smallest thing of which they are part -- a thing that exactly and completely exhausts both. For instance, your left thumb and index finger underlap, since they are both parts of you. There are other things of which they are part -- e.g., your left hand. And we may assume that there is a smallest such thing: that part of your left hand which consists exactly of your left thumb and index finger. Likewise, if two things overlap (e.g., two intersecting roads), then we may assume that there is a largest thing that is part of both (the common part at their junction). These two assumptions can be expressed by means of the following axioms, respectively:

(P.6) Uxyexistszforallw(Owz ↔ (Owx or Owy)) Sum
(P.7) Oxyexistszforallw(Pwz ↔ (Pwx & Pwy)) Product

Call the extension of M obtained by adding (P.6) and (P.7) Closure Mereology (CM). The result of adding these axioms to MM or EM instead yields corresponding Minimal or Extensional Closure Mereologies (CMM and CEM), respectively.

The intuitive idea behind these two axioms is best appreciated in the presence of extensionality, for in that case the entities whose conditional existence is asserted by (P.6) and (P.7) must be unique. Thus, if the language has a description operator ‘ι’,[4] CEM supports the following definitions:

(42) x+y =df ιzforallw(Owz ↔ (Owx or Owy))
(43) x×y =df ιzforallw(Pwz ↔ (Pwx & Pwy))

and (P.6) and (P.7) can be rephrased more perspicuously as

(P.6′) Uxyexistsz(z = x+y)
(P.7′) Oxyexistsz(z = x × y).

In other words, any two underlapping things have a unique merelogical sum, and any two overlapping things have a unique product. Actually the connection with extensionality is more subtle. In the presence of the Weak Supplementation Principle (P.4), the product closure (P.7) implies the Strong Supplementation Principle (P.5). Thus, CMM turns out to be the same theory as CEM.

One could consider adding further closure postulates. For instance, it may be reasonable to require that a mereological domain be closed under the operations of mereological difference and mereological complement. In the presence of extensionality these notions can be defined as follows:

(44) xy =df ιzforallw(Pwz ↔ (Pwx & ¬Owy))
(45) ~x =df ιzforallw(Pwz ↔ ¬Owx)

The corresponding closure principles can therefore be stated thus:

(P.8) ¬Pyxexistsz(z = yx) Remainder
(P.9) existsz¬Pzxexistsz(z = ~x) Complementation

The first of these is equivalent to (P.5), but the second is independent of any of the principles considered so far. In many versions, a closure theory also involves a postulate to the effect that the domain has an upper bound -- that is, there is something of which everything is part:

(P.10) existszforallxPxz Top

Again, in the presence of extensionality such a “universal individual” is unique and easily defined:

(46)  U =df ιzforallxPxz

The existence of U makes the algebraic structure of CEM even neater, since it guarantees that any two entities underlap and, hence, have a sum. Thus, in the presence of (P.10) the antecedent in (P.6) may be dropped. On the other hand, few authors have gone so far as to postulate the existence of a “null entity” that is part of everything:

(P.11) existszforallxPzx Bottom

(Two exceptions are Martin 1965 and Bunt 1985; see also Bunge 1966 for a theory with several null individuals.) Without such an entity, which one could hardly countenance except for good algebraic reasons, the existence of a mereological product is not always guaranteed. Hence (P.7) must remain in conditional form. Likewise, differences and complements may not be defined -- e.g., relative to the universe U. Hence, the corresponding closure principles (P.8) and (P.9) must also remain in conditional form.

4.2. Unrestricted Fusions

In the literature, closure merelogies are just as controversial as extensional mereologies, though for quite independent reasons. We shall attend to these reasons shortly. First, however, let us note the possibility of adding infinitary closure conditions. One may allow for sums of arbitrary non-empty sets of objects, and consequently also for products of arbitrary sets of overlapping objects (the product of all members of a class A is just the sum of all those things that are part of every member of A). It is not immediately obvious how this can be done if one wants to avoid commitment to classes and stick to an ordinary first-order theory -- e.g., without resorting to the machinery of plural quantification of Boolos (1984). As a matter of fact, in some classical theories, such as those of Tarski (1929) and Leonard and Goodman (1940), the formulation of these conditions involves explicit reference to classes. (Goodman produced a class-free version of the calculus of individuals in 1951.) We can, however, avoid such reference by relying on an axiom schema that involves only predicates or open formulas. Specifically, we can say that for every satisfied property or condition φ there is an entity consisting of all those things that satisfy φ. Since an ordinary first-order language has a denumerable supply of open formulas, at most denumerably many classes (in any given domain) can be specified in this way. But this limitation is, in a way, negligible, especially if one is inclined to deny that classes exist except as nomina. We thus arrive at what has come to be known as Classical or General Mereology (GM), which is obtained from Mby adding the axiom schema

(P.12) existsxφ → existszforally(Oyzexistsx(φ & Oyx)) Unrestricted Fusion

(where, again, φ is any formula in the language). The result of adding this schema to EM or MM yields correspondingly stronger mereological theories. In fact, both MM and EM extend to the same extensional strengthening of GM -- the theory of General Extensional Mereology, or GEM -- since (P.12) implies (P.7) and (P.7)+(P.4) imply (P.5) (Simons 1987: 31). It is also clear that both GM and GEM are extensions of CM and CEM, since (P.6) also follows from (P.12). The logical space of all these theories can thus be represented schematically as in Figure 2.

Figure 2

Figure 2. Hasse diagram of mereological theories (from weaker to stronger, going uphill).

It is worth observing that if the extensionality principle is satisfied, then again at most one entity can satisfy the consequent of (P.12). Accordingly, in GEM we can define the operations of general sum (σ) and product (π):

(47) σxφ =df ιzforally(Oyzexistsx(φ & Oyx))
(48) πxφ =df σzforallx(φ → Pzx).

(P.12) then becomes

(P.12′)  existsxφ → existsz(z = σxφ),

which implies

(49)  (existsxφ & existsyforallx(φ → Pyx)) → existsz(z = πxφ),

and we have the following definitional identities whenever the relevant existential presuppositions are satisfied:

(50)   x+y = σz(Pzx or Pzy)
(51) x × y = σz(Pzx & Pzy)
(52) xy = σz(Pzx & ¬Ozy)
(53) ~x = σz¬Ozx
(54) U = σzPzz

(It may be instructive to compare these identities with the definitions of the corresponding set-theoretic notions, with set abstraction in place of the fusion operator.) This gives us the full strength of GEM, which is in fact known to have a rich algebraic structure: Tarski (1935) proved that the parthood relation axiomatized by GEMhas the same properties as the set-inclusion relation -- more precisely, as the inclusion relation restricted to the set of all non-empty subsets of a given set, which is to say a complete Boolean algebra with the zero element removed. (Compare Clay 1974 for a corresponding result in relation to Leśniewski's mereology, which is not based on classical logic.)

Various other equivalent formulations of GEM are also available, using different primitives or different sets of axioms. For instance, it is a theorem of every extensional mereology that parthood amounts to inclusion of overlappers:

(55)  Pxyforallz(Ozx → Ozy).

It follows that in an extensional mereology ‘O’ could be used as a primitive and ‘P’ defined accordingly. In fact, the theory defined by postulating (55) together with the Fusion Axiom (P.12′) and the Antisymmetry Axiom (P.2) is equivalent to GEM, but more elegant. Another elegant axiomatization of GEM, due to Tarski (1929), is obtained by taking as only postulates the Transitivity Axiom (P.3) and the Unique Fusion Axiom (P.12′).

4.3. Composition, Existence, and Identity

The algebraic strength of GEM, and of its weaker finitary variants, reflects substantive mereological postulates that some may find unattractive. Indeed, as anticipated above, closure merelogies are just as controversial -- philosophically -- as extensional mereologies. Two objections, in particular, have been given serious consideration in the literature. The first is that such theories are ontologically exuberant -- they involve a significant increase in the number of entities to be included in an inventory of the world, contrary to the thought that mereology should be “ontologically innocent”. The second objection is that they are ontologically extravagant -- they involve a commitment to a wealth of entities that are utterly counterintuitive and for which we have no place in our conceptual scheme, contrary to the thought that mereology should be “ontologically neutral”.

To begin with the first objection, there is no question that a typical C(E)M model (not to mention a G(E)M model) is more densely populated than a corresponding (E)M (or MM) model. If the ontological commitment of a theory is measured exclusively in Quinean terms -- via the dictum “to be is to be a value of a bound variable” -- then clearly a mereological theory accepting a closure principle such as (P.6), (P.7), or (P.12) will involve greater ontological commitments than a theory rejecting such principles, and one might find this unpalatable. This is particularly true for theories that accept the sum principles (P.7) or (P.12) but not the Strong Supplementation postulate (P.5) -- hence the extensionality principle (34) -- for then the ontological exhuberance of such theories may yield massive multiplication, as seen in section 3.2. There is, accordingly, no question that the acceptance of a closure principle requires substantive philosophical defense and can hardly be motivated exclusively in terms of the meaning of ‘part’. Nonetheless, two sorts of remarks could be offered on behalf of GEM and of its weaker finitary variants.

First, it could be observed that the ontological exhuberance associated with the relevant closure principles is not substantive -- that the increase of entities in the domain of quantification of a closure mereology involves no substantive additional commitments besides those already involved before the closure. This is perhaps best appreciated in the case of a closure principle such as (P.7), to the effect that any two overlapping entities have a mereological product. After all, a product adds nothing. But the same could be said with respect to such principles as (P.6) and (P.12), which assert the existence of finitary or infinitary mereological sums. At least, this seems reasonable in the presence of extensionality. For in that case it can be argued that even a sum is, in a sense, nothing “over and above” its constituent parts. As David Lewis put it:

Given a prior commitment to cats, say, a commitment to cat-fusions is not a further commitment. The fusion is nothing over and above the cats that compose it. It just is them. They just are it. Take them together or take them separately, the cats are the same portion of Reality either way. (1991: 81)

Thus, the ‘are’ of mereological composition -- the many-one relation of the parts to a whole -- is for Lewis a sort of plural form of the ‘is’ of identity. For some authors (e.g., Baxter 1988) mereological composition is more than analogous to ordinary identity. It is identity. The fusion is just the parts counted loosely; it is strictly a multitude and loosely a single thing. This is the thesis known in the literature as “composition is identity”. And if this view is accepted, then one can speak of a powerful mereological theory such as GEM as being “ontologically innocent” after all -- not only insofar as it is topic-neutral and domain-independent, but also insofar as it does not carry any additional ontological commitments besides those that come already with the choice of any model for a weaker theory such as EM. (For more discussion on this issue see van Inwagen 1994, Yi 1999, Merricks 2000, Varzi 2000.)

Secondly, it could be observed that the objection in question does not bite at the right level. If, given two objects x1 and x2, the countenance of a sum x1 + x2 is regarded as a case of further ontological commitment, then given a mereologically composite object y1 + y2 the countenance of its proper parts y1 and y2 could also be regarded as a case of further ontological commitment. After all, every object is distinct from its proper parts. So the objection in question would apply in the latter case as well -- there would be ontological exhuberance in countenancing y1 and y2 along with y1 + y2. Yet this has nothing to do with the Sum axiom; it is, rather, a question of whether there is any point in countenancing a whole along with its parts. And if the answer is negative, then there seems to be little use for mereology tout court. From the point of view of the present objection, it would appear that the only thoroughly parsimonious account would be one that rejects, not only some logically admissible sums, but any such sum. The only existing entities would be mereological atoms, entities with no proper parts. And such an account, though perfectly defensible, would be mereologically uninteresting: nothing would be part of anything else and parthood would collapse to identity. (This account is sometimes referred to as mereological nihilism -- in contrast to the mereological universalism represented by adherence to the principle of Unrestricted Composition. The terminology is from van Inwagen 1990: 72ff.[5] For a detailed defense of nihilism see Rosen and Dorr 2002.)

The second line of objection to closure mereologies -- to the effect that they are ontologically extravagant -- might well be called the objection from counter-intuitiveness and applies especially to theories accepting the principle of unrestricted fusion (P.12). According to this objection, it is all right to countenance certain mereological sums as bona fide entities -- for example when the summands make up an ordinary object or event. Even when the summands are spatially scattered material objects (for instance) it may sometimes be reasonable to speak of them jointly as forming one thing, as when we speak of Mary's new bikini, of my copy of Proust's Recherche, of the solar system, or of some printed inscription consisting of separate letter tokens (see Cartwright 1975). However -- the objection goes -- a principle such as (P.12) would force us to countenance all sorts of scattered objects, all sorts of queer entities consisting of scattered or otherwise ill-assorted summands, such as you and I, my cat and your umbrella, or Chisholm's left foot and the top of the Empire State Building -- not to mention categorially distinct summands such as Chisholm's left foot and Sebastian's stroll, your life and my favorite Chinese restaurant, or the color red and the number 2. Such “sums” fail to display any degree of integrity whatsoever and there appears to be no grounds for treating them as unified wholes. There appears to be no reason whatsoever to postulate them on top of their constituent parts and, indeed, common sense disregards them altogether. (This objection goes back to the early debate on the calculus of individuals: see Lowe 1953 and, again, Rescher 1955, with replies in Goodman 1956, 1958; for more recent formulations see, e.g., Wiggins 1980, Chisholm 1987, and van Inwagen 1987, 1990.)

A sympathiser of this objection need not adhere to a nihilist position concerning mereological composition. More simply, the objection reflects the intuitive view that only some mereological composites exist -- not all. And no doubt common sense supports this sort of intuition. In spite of this, two sorts of replies have been offered on behalf of (P.12), both of which are rather popular in the literature. The first reply is that the question of which fusions exist (what van Inwagen 1990 calls the “general composition question”) cannot be successfully answered in a restricted way. Of course, it may well be that whenever some entities compose a bigger one, it is just a brute fact that they do so (Markosian 1998b). But if we are unhappy with brute facts, then the challenge is to come up with a specification of the circumstances under which the facts obtain, so as to replace (P.12) with a restricted version. And according to the reply in question this is not a feasible option. Any attempt to do away with queer fusions by restricting composition would have to do away with too much else besides the queer entities; for queerness comes in degrees whereas parthood and existence cannot be a matter of degree. In David Lewis's words:

The question whether composition takes place in a given case, whether a given class does or does not have a mereological sum, can be stated in a part of language where nothing is vague. Therefore it cannot have a vague answer. … No restriction on composition can be vague. But unless it is vague, it cannot fit the intuitive desiderata. So no restriction on composition can serve the intuitions that motivate it. So restriction would be gratuitous. (1986: 213)

(This line of argument, or some modified version of it, is particularly congenial to authors adhering to a four-dimensional ontology of material objects; see e.g. Heller 1990: 49f, Jubien 1993: 83ff; Sider 2001: 121ff, and Hudson 2001: 99ff.)

The second reply on behalf of (P.12) is that the objection rests on psychological biases that should have no bearing on ontological issues. Granted, we may feel uneasy about treating unheard-of fusions as bona fide entities, but this is no ground for doing away with them altogether. We may ignore such things when we tally up the things we care about in ordinary contexts, but this is not to say they do not exist. We seldom speak with our quantifiers wide open; we normally quantify subject to restrictions, as when we say “There is no beer” meaning that there is no beer in the refrigerator. So in that sense we may want to say that there are no cat-umbrellas and stroll-feet -- there truly aren't any such things among the things we care about. But they are all there nonetheless, like the warm beer in the garage. As James Van Cleve put it:

Even if one came up with a formula that jibed with all ordinary judgments about what counts as a unit and what does not, what would that show? Not … that there exist in nature such objects (and such only) as answer the formula. The factors that guide our judgments of unity simply do not have that sort of ontological significance. (1986: 145)

From this perspective, the endorsment of (P.12) is certainly not neutral with respect to the question of what there is. But it loses its flavor of counterintuitiveness, especially if combined with the “composition as identity” account mentioned in relation to the first objection above.

In recent years, further objections have been raised against closure mereologies -- especially against the the full strength of GEM. These include objections to the effect that unrestricted composition does not sit well with certain fundamental intuitions about persistence through time (van Inwagen 1990, 75ff), or that it implies that an entity must necessarily have the parts it has (Merricks 1999), or that it is incompatible with certain models of space (Forrest 1996b), or that it -- or the weaker closure principle (P.10) -- leads to paradoxes similar to the ones afflicting naïve set theory (Bigelow 1996). Such objections are still the subject of on-going controversy and a detailed examination is beyond the scope of this entry. Some discussion of the first point, however, is already available in the literature: see especially Rea 1998, McGrath 1998, 2001, and Hudson 2001: 93ff. Hudson 2001: 95ff also contains a discussion of the last point.

5. Atomistic and Atomless Mereologies

We conclude this review of mereology by briefly considering the question of atomism. Mereologically, an atom (or “simple”) is an entity with no proper parts, regardless of whether it is point-like or has spatial (and/or temporal) extension:

(56)  Ax =df ¬existsyPPyx.

Are there any such entities? And if there are, is everything entirely made up of atoms? Does everything comprise at least some atoms? Or is everything made up of atomless gunk? These are deep and difficult questions, which have been the focus of philosophical investigation since the early days of philosophy and have been center stage also in many recent disputes in mereology (see, for instance, van Inwagen 1990, Sider 1993, Zimmerman 1996, Markosian 1998a, Mason 2000.) Here we shall confine ourselves to pointing out that all options are logically compatible with the mereological principles examined so far and can therefore be treated on independent grounds.

The two main options, to the effect that there are no atoms at all, or that everything is ultimately made up of atoms, correspond to the following postulates, respectively:

(P.13) ¬Ax Atomlessness
(P.14) existsy(Ay & Pyx). Atomicity

These postulates are mutually incompatible, but taken in isolation they can consistently be added to any mereological theory X considered in the previous sections. Adding (P.14) yields a corresponding Atomistic version, AX. By contrast, adding (P.13) yields an Atomless version, AX, in which the existence of a bottom level of mereological entities is rejected -- everything is made up of “atomless gunk”. Since finitude together with the antisymmetry of parthood (P.2) jointly imply that decomposition into parts must eventually come to an end, it is clear that any finite model of M (and a fortiori of any extension of M) must be atomistic. Accordingly, an atomless mereology AX admits only models of infinite cardinality. (A world containing such wonders as Borges's Aleph, where parthood is not antisymmetric, might by contrast be finite and yet atomless.) An example of such a model, establishing the consistency of any atomless theory up to AGEM, is provided by the regular open sets of a Euclidean space, with ‘P’ interpreted as set-inclusion (Tarski 1935). On the other hand, the consistency of any atomistic theory is guaranteed by the trivial one-element model (with ‘P’ interpreted as identity), though the full strength of AGEM is best appreciated by considering that it is isomorphic with an atomic Boolean algebra with the zero element removed.

It bears emphasis that atomistic mereologies admit of significant simplifications in the axioms. For instance, AEM can be simplified by replacing (P.5) and (P.14) with

(P.5′)   ¬Pxyexistsz(Az & Pzx & ¬Pzy),

which in turns implies the following atomistic variant of the extensionality thesis (34):

(57)  x=yforallz(Az → (Pzx ↔ Pzy))

Thus, any atomistic extensional mereology is truly hyperextensional in Goodman's sense: things built up from exactly the same atoms are identical. Similarly, AGEM could be simplified by replacing the Unrestricted Fusion postulate (P.12) with

(P.12″)   existsxφ → existszforally(Ay → (Pyzexistsx(φ & Pyx))).

An interesting question, discussed at some length in the late 1960's (Yoes 1967, Eberle 1968, Schuldenfrei 1969) and taken up more recently by Simons (1987: 44f), is whether there is any atomless analogue of (57). Is there any predicate that can play the role of ‘A’ in an atomless mereology? Such a predicate would identify the “base” (in the topological sense) of the system and would therefore enable mereology to cash out Goodman's hyperextensional intuitions even in the absence of atoms. This question is particularly significant from a nominalist perspective, but it has deep ramifications also in other fields (e.g., in connection with the Whiteheadian conception of space mentioned in section 3.1, according to which space contains no parts of lower dimensions such as points or boundary elements; see Forrest 1996a and Roeper 1997). In special cases there is no difficulty in providing a positive answer. For example, in the AGEM model consisting of the open regular subsets of the real line, the open intervals with rational end points form a base in the relevant sense. It is unclear, however, whether a general answer can be given that applies to any sort of domain, regardless of its specific composition. If not, then the only option would appear to be an account where the notion of a “base” is relativized to entities of a given sort. In Simons's terminology, we could say that the G-ers form a base for the F-ers iff the following variants of (P.14) and (P.5′) are satisfied:

(P.14*)   Fxexistsy(Gy & Pyx))
(P.5*) (Fx & Fy) → (¬Pxyexistsz(Gz & Pzx & ¬Pzy)).

An atomistic mereology would then correspond to the limit case where ‘G’ is identified with ‘A’ for every choice of ‘F’. In an atomless mereology, by contrast, the choice of the base would depend each time on the level of granularity set by the relevant specification of ‘F’.

Between the two main options corresponding to Atomicity and Atomlessness, there is of course room for intermediate positions. For instance, it can be held that there are atoms, though not everything need have a complete atomic decomposition, or it can be held that there is atomless gunk, though not everything need be gunky. (The latter position is defended e.g. by Zimmerman 1996.) It is not difficult to provide a formal statement of these views:

(P.15) existsxAx Weak Atomicity
(P.16) existsxforally(Pyx → ¬Ay) Weak Atomlessness

However, at present no thorough investigation of the resulting systems has been entertained.

Let us also mention, in closing, the option corresponding to the nihilist position mentioned in the previous section. This option can be expressed by the following simple postulate:

(P.17) Ax Nihilism

It is easy to verify that (P.17) is compatible with all the mereological principles considered so far, except for the atomlessness postulates (P.13) and (P.16). On the other hand, because of the following immediate corollary

(58)  Pxyx=y,

it is also apparent that no system resulting from the addition of this postulate would deserve the appellative ‘mereology’ except in a trivial sense. Nihilism is, in fact, a rejection of mereology. It is a rejection of the theory of parthood relations as mereology understands it -- not a theory of bare identities, but of the relations of part to whole, and of the relations of part to part within a whole.


Historical Surveys


Cited Works

Other Internet Resources

Stanislaw Lesniewski (from Polish Philosophy Page - edited by Arianna Betti)

Related Entries

artifact | Boolean algebra: the mathematics of | boundary | identity | logic and ontology | many, problem of | mereology: medieval | nominalism: in metaphysics | object | set theory | temporal parts