Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Mental Imagery

The American Response: Behaviorist Iconophobia and Motor Theories of Imagery

Where the Gestalt psychologists, for the most part, ignored the concept of imagery, the Behaviorist movement, which came to dominate American (and, eventually, international) scientific psychology for almost half a century, actively repudiated it. To borrow a coinage from Dennett (1978), Behaviorist psychology was thoroughly iconophobic. Although the rapid rise of Behaviorism in the United States in the early years of the 20th century certainly had multiple causes, social and institutional as well as intellectual (O'Donnell, 1985), the imageless thought controversy, and the questions it raised about introspection as a viable scientific methodology, was certainly prominent amongst the intellectual causes. In the famous “manifesto” by which John B. Watson publicly launched Behaviorism as a self-conscious movement, the controversy over imageless thoughts is cited as the prime example (indeed, the only really explicit example) of the malaise of psychological methodology for which Behaviorism would be the cure (Watson, 1913a). In a lengthy footnote to this paper, and in a follow-up article, Watson (1913b) cast doubt on the very existence of mental imagery, a position he was to state more forcefully in later work, where he stigmatized the concept (together with all other remotely mentalistic concepts) as a thoroughly unscientific, “medieval” notion, inextricably bound up with religious belief in an immortal soul, and, as such, barely one step away from “old wives tales” and the superstitions of “savagery” (Watson, 1930). He described personal reports of such things as memory images of one's childhood home as “sheer bunk,” nothing more than the sentimental “dramatizing” of verbally mediated memories (i.e. conditioned tendencies to say certain things, either out loud or sub-vocally) (Watson, 1928).

Not all American psychologists, even avowed Behaviorists, were quite as vehement as Watson in their denunciation of mentality in general, or imagery in particular, but his views certainly resonated with many. The publication of Watson's manifesto (1913a) had, in fact, been preceded by several less radical critiques of introspective methodology from other American psychologists (Danziger, 1980). Particularly relevant here is Knight Dunlap's “The Case Against Introspection” (1912), because Dunlap, who was a junior colleague of Watson in the Johns Hopkins University Psychology Department, seems to have played a crucial if inadvertent role in the formation of Watson's attitude towards imagery, and, thereby, in the crystallization of Behaviorism itself (Cohen, 1979; Thomas, 1989).

During his early days at Johns Hopkins (where he arrived in 1908) Watson, by his own account, believed that “centrally aroused visual sensations [i.e., mental images] were as clear as those peripherally aroused” (Watson, 1913a), and when Dunlap told Watson of his skepticism concerning what he (Dunlap) called “the old doctrine of images” Watson initially demurred, insisting that he himself made important use of visual imagery, for example in the process of designing experimental apparatus (Dunlap, 1932; cf. Watson, 1936).

However, by this time Watson already seems to have been ambitious to approach human psychology using the methodology that he had already successfully developed for the study of animal behavior (Watson, 1924, 1936). By 1910, the only real factor preventing Watson from conceiving of the study of behavior as embracing the whole of psychology seems to have been “the problem of the higher thought processes” (Burnham, 1968): Thought was supposed to be carried on primarily in imagery, and imagery was not behavior (see Watson, 1913b). Dunlap's objections to the “old doctrine” that held visual imagery to consist in “centrally aroused visual sensations” seems to have played a crucial role in emboldening Watson to deny the existence of imagery altogether, thus enabling him to present the study of behavior as a fully sufficient methodology for psychology (Watson, 1924). Perhaps he believed that his theoretical commitment to the nonexistence of mental pictures entailed a commitment to the nonexistence of quasi-visual experiences (Thomas, 1989).

However, Dunlap never became a Behaviorist himself (Dunlap, 1932), and when his actual views about imagery are examined (Dunlap, 1914) it becomes apparent that he did not intend to deny that people have experiences that are, in a significant sense, quasi-perceptual. Although he described himself as an “iconoclast” (1932), and held that “the image, as a copy or reproduction of sensation . . . does not exist,” (Dunlap,1914), Dunlap also asserted that Watson went much too far in rejecting “imagination” as well as “images” (Dunlap, 1932), and he continued to hold that we are in need of an account of the nature of “ideas”. Something, something mental and, indeed, quasi-perceptual, is needed to fill the functional role that images played in the traditional psychology of thinking. It is clear that he (unlike Watson) did not deny the existence of imagery in the sense in which it was defined at the beginning of this article (i.e. quasi-perceptual experience). Dunlap's theory would seem to be best understood as a pioneering (though perhaps, ultimately, unconvincing) attempt to explain both the experience of imagery, and the functional role that it plays in thinking, in a way that avoids postulating the presence of pictures in the head, or inner copies of former sense impressions.

According to Dunlap, ideas are actually complexes of muscular sensations, caused by outwardly imperceptible movements, or, at least, tensings, of the muscles, particularly (though not exclusively) the muscles associated with the sense organs themselves, such as those that move the eyes. Particular patterns of muscular response, Dunlap holds, occur during the perception of particular types of objects or events, and may be aroused not only in the course of the actual perception of a relevant object, but also through associative links with the sensations produced by other muscular response patterns appropriate to other sorts of objects or events. These latter patterns may have arisen in actual perception, or may themselves have been aroused associatively in a similar way. Thus, associative trains of thought can be sustained. When the muscular response is aroused associatively, rather than by the actual perceptual presence of the relevant object, we experience the idea, or image, of the object. Visual imagery consists not of copies or echoes of visual sensations, but rather of actual current sensations in the muscles involved in the process of seeing something.

There is indeed a present content essentially connected with imagination or thought; but this present content is in each case a muscle sensation, or a complex of muscle sensations. We are therefore, in investigating images, dealing not with copies, or pale ghosts, of former sensations but with actual present sensations. (Dunlap, 1914)

These muscle sensations are, explicitly, not to be confused with the impalpable imageless thoughts of Würzburg, rather, “This sensation is the true image” (Dunlap, 1914, emphasis in original). (For a more extensive account of Dunlap's theory of imagery, and its influence on Watson, see Thomas (1989).)

Dunlap's theory of imagery/ideas was publicly presented only in one brief and rather obscurely published article (Dunlap, 1914) and (apart from its unintended and covert influence on Watson), it seems to have attracted very little interest from his contemporaries. The theory probably owes much to the influence of Hugo Münsterberg, whose “motor theory” of the mind had a considerable vogue amongst American psychologists at the time. Although it was quickly eclipsed, as a movement, by the rise of Behaviorism, it has had a continuing influence on psychological and cognitive theory (Scheerer, 1984; Weimer, 1977). Münsterberg was a German, a former student of Wundt, who had been hired to teach psychology at Harvard when William James moved on, and Dunlap had studied under him before coming to Johns Hopkins (Dunlap, 1932). Another non-pictorialist theory of imagery (relating the phenomenon to attentional processes) had been sketched a little earlier by the pioneering French psychologist Theodule Ribot (1890, 1900), and related ideas also surface later in the Soviet tradition of psychology (Wekker, 1966), and in the “enactive” imagery theories of more recent times (see section 4.5). However, the most fully developed version of the motor theory of imagery was surely that of Margaret Floy Washburn, a former student of Titchener. Washburn (unlike Dunlap) is quite open in acknowledging her intellectual debt to Münsterberg (Washburn, 1932), and in her Movement and Mental Imagery (1916) she goes into considerable, if speculative, physiological as well as psychological detail (see also, Boodin, 1921). However, by the time this was published Behaviorist iconophobia was already taking firm hold.

It should be said that most of the avowedly Behaviorist theorists and researchers who succeeded Watson (who had given up his academic career by 1920, and published his last significant psychological work in 1930) did not reject talk of inner psychological processes quite as vehemently as he had done. Thus, for instance, the covert “fractional anticipatory goal responses” of Hull (1931, 1937), the “cognitive maps” of Tolman (1948), and the “representational mediation processes” of Osgood (1952, 1953) all seem to have played at least some of the explanatory roles that earlier, mentalistic psychologists assigned to images. Most psychologists of the Behaviorist era simply avoided talking about imagery, but there is one important exception. Although he avoided using imagery as an explanatory construct, B.F. Skinner (probably the most famous and influential theorist of the later decades of Behaviorism, and arguably a more radical and consistent Behaviorist even than Watson), nevertheless accepted that imagery experiences were not something that could simply be denied or dismissed (as Watson had attempted to do): Some sort of Behavioristic explanation of them was required. In his Notebooks (1980, p. 160), Skinner briefly describes his own experiences of auditory, musical imagery, and in his influential Science and Human Behavior (Skinner, 1953), he discusses, in a speculative way, the causes of what he calls “conditioned seeing” and “operant seeing” (1953 ch. 17), which are clearly intended as non-mentalistic ways of referring to the experiencing of imagery, that will not violate Behaviorist principles. In his About Behaviorism (1974), Skinner reiterates essentially restates his earlier position, but allows himself to speak more freely of “visualizing,” “imaging,” and “seeing in the absence of the thing seen.”

But, although he describes it as “perhaps the most difficult problem in the analysis of behavior” (1953 p. 265), the significance of Skinner's attempts to grapple with the experience of imagery should not be overstated. Unlike many other aspects of his theoretical work, his remarks on imagery never seem to have become the basis of a sustained experimental research program on the topic (by Skinner himself, or by any of his numerous followers). Indeed, his discussions (1953, 1974) seem designed to explain the phenomenon away, to show that it does not threaten basic Behaviorist commitments, rather than to examine it as a topic of scientific interest in its own right. The focus is, on the one hand, to insist that the occurrence of quasi-perceptual experience in no way constitutes evidence for the existence of mental representations (or anything else mental), and, on the other hand, to consider the sorts of circumstances, the “contingencies of reinforcement,” which might cause such experiences to arise for a particular individual at a particular time.[1] Skinner holds that instead of thinking of imagery as a “thing” we should instead think of visualization (and, indeed, seeing) as a form of behavior (albeit a largely or completely covert behavior, hidden from casual observation somewhere under the skin of the organism). However, this positive view is sketched extremely lightly, and, apart from a very passing allusion to eye movements, he tells us little or nothing about the specific forms that such visualization behavior might take, and sets out no systematic evidence to support his suggestions.

According to Paivio (1971), the 1920s and 1930s (when Watson's influence was at its height) were “the most arid period” for imagery research, but Kessel (1972) reports that even through the 1940s and 1950s a scant five references to imagery are to be found in Psychological Abstracts. Admittedly some interest in the psychology of imagery continued outside the United States through these decades. In Britain, for example, psychologists such as Pear (1925, 1927), Bartlett (1927, 1932), and, latterly, McKellar (1957) kept a degree interest in the topic alive, and when Place (1956) made his influential philosophical case for the identification of conscious experience with brain processes, mental imagery was one of his main examples of mental phenomena that would not yeild to a purely behavioral analysis. However, these discussions of imagery did not have much contemporaneous impact on psychologists in the United States (which by the 1930s had already achieved its dominant superpower status in psychology). A general revival of interest in the topic did not get under way in America before the 1960s. By that time the iconophobic consensus was beginning to break down due both to internal strains and external attacks. On the one hand, we find Mowrer (1960a, 1960b, 1977), Sheffield (1961), and others attempting to patch-up Behaviorist learning theory by reintroducing the concept of the mental image in an explanatory, representational role. On the other hand, we see new and striking empirical findings about imagery emerging to play a significant role in the so called Cognitive Revolution, that was soon to break the Behaviorist hegemony over scientific psychology (Gardner, 1987). Before long there was very little audience for Taylor's (1973) attempt to devise an explicitly Behavioristic theory of imagery. (In any case, Taylor identifies mental images with memory engrams in the brain, a move which both Watson and Skinner, at any rate, would surely have rejected as thoroughly unbehavioristic.)