Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Medieval Political Philosophy

1. A university was a guild of masters or students in a town. The university was not itself a teaching institution: teaching was done in the masters' schools (or later in colleges). Schools of higher education existed before then among the Greeks, Jews and Muslims, but a trade association of teachers or scholars was a new idea. Like the ancient schools, the medieval schools took students through text books: Aristotle in the Arts faculty, Averroes and Avicenna in medicine, the Bible and the Sentences of Peter Lombard in theology, Justinian in the civil law schools, and Gratian and other collections in canon law. These text books were prescribed by the University.

2. See the Latin text of the Vulgate. The standard English translation of the Vulgate is Challoner's 18th century revision of the Douai-Rheims version. On the history of this translation see the Wikipedia article on the Douai bible listed under "Other Internet Resources". My references will be to the Vulgate and translation will be Douai. (The language of the Douai translation is old fashioned, but it is the only English translation of the Vulgate text available on line.) The divisions and names of the parts of the medieval bible were not altogether the same as those of the King James version. The medieval "canon" of scripture, i.e. the list of books recognised as belonging to the bible differed somewhat from the canon recognised by Protestants, notably by its inclusion of Machabees.

3. See Luther [1915], vol. 1, p. 7.

4. The theory of "passive obedience" is the theory that if a ruler gives a command contrary to God's commands, one may obey it passively rather than actively, i.e. not actively carry out the command, but not resist the punishment the ruler then inflicts. Such a doctrine was common in the seventeenth century among Protestants and was also held by some Catholics. See Somerville [1991].

5. For debate on this between Pope John XXII and Ockham, see William of Ockham [1995a], p. 72ff.

6. See the New Advent (Catholic Encyclopedia) article on "Fathers of the Church" listed under "Other Internet Resources". For English translations online see The Fathers of the Church. On Augustine see Saint Augustine.

7. The age of innocence ended before Adam and Eve had children, whereas the Golden Age lasted through a number of generations. In medieval writers the two ideas were sometimes combined: after the Fall, human beings lived for a while in a social but unpolitical state (though it was hardly a Golden Age) but gradually developed institutions appropriate to the fallen state.

8. See Augustine, The City of God against the Pagans, translated R.W. Dyson (Cambridge 1998). Page references will be to this version.

9. Dist. 47 c.8, Friedberg [1879], vol. 1, col. 171.

10. Translated Tierney [1959], p. 34.

11. Augustine [1955], p. v, n.2. A few commentaries were made; see Smalley [1960], pp. 58, 61f, 88-101, 121-132. Commentaries were uncommon, since The City of God was never a set text.

12. To sample De civitate Dei, read Book XIX. See Markus [1970], especially ch. 3; and Augustine, "History and Eschatology", in this Encyclopedia.

13. See De civitate Dei XI.22, XII.2, 3, 7; Confessions VII.xii.18-xiii.19; Enchiridion 11-12.

14. The reader should be warned that my reference to the different levels of virtue, peace, etc. puts me at odds with many interpreters of Augustine. Usually when Augustine says that something is not "true" something, he is taken to mean that it is not that at all. This seems to me to be an error, which makes Augustine's thinking seem full of inconsistencies. For example, Carlyle ([1930], vol. 1, p. 166-7) says that Augustine's definition of commonwealth makes justice irrelevant to the existence of a commonwealth, and remarks (p. 169) that among the Fathers this view was unique to Augustine. Yet (as Carlyle acknowledges, p. 167) Augustine says that apart from justice a kingdom is only robbery on a large scale. On my interpretation, justice is not irrelevant: anything that can be called a commonwealth must exhibit justice in some degree.

15. Arquillière [1934]. The conception has been severely criticised: see de Lubac [1984], pp. 255-308.

16. Translated from the Latin text of Poole [1920], p. 201.

17. See McGrade [1974], pp. 109-133.

18. Note that the texts of Augustine available on the web contain occasional scanning errors.

19. See Russell [1975], pp. 16ff. Various texts from Augustine are included in Gratian's Decretum, Causa 23 (Friedberg [1879], vol. 1, col. 889 ff.), which is the source of much medieval thinking about warfare.

20. On the views of Augustine and other Fathers on toleration and coercion see Lecler [1960], pp. 32-64. On Augustine in particular see P. Brown [1964], Markus [1970], ch. 6.

21. Tractates on John, 26.2]

22. Bayle [2005], part III, quotes Augustine's justification for coercing heretics and subjects his reasoning to devastating criticism.

23. On the political thought of this period see Carlyle [1930], vol. 1, p. 195ff, and Canning [1996], p. 47ff.

24. On the later development of ideas of consent see Tiernery [1982], p. 39-42.

25. See Carlyle [1930], vol. 1, p. 242-252.

26. For the Latin text online see Works of Justinian. English translation of Digest: Justinian [1998]. The other parts of the corpus have also been translated. The medieval glosses are not readily available.

27. For the Latin text see "Decretum Gratiani". For a printed edition see Friedberg [1879]. For a number of studies of the influence of canon law on political thought in the middle ages see bibliography, Tierney, and see the article by Pennington listed under "Other Internet Resources". Gratian's collection was based partly on earlier collections (see the New Advent [Catholic Encyclopedia] article "Collections of Ancient Canons" listed under "Other Internet Resources"), e.g. the collection by Ivo of Chartres (see the Provisional Edition of Ivo of Chartre's Panormia and the New Advent article "St. Ivo of Chartres"). What gave special importance to Gratian's collection was that it became the text book in the newly developing universities. When Pope Gregory IX wished to promulgate an additional collection of "decretals" (i.e. papal letters in which popes decided questions of church law) he did so by sending a copy to the Universities of Bologna and Paris.

Among the earlier collections was the Pseudo-Isidorian collection. (See the Wikipedia article on Pseudo-Isidore, the New Advent article on False Decretals, and Projekt Pseudoisidore, all listed under "Other Internet Resources".) This "Isidore" is not to be confused with Isidore of Seville, whom Gratian often quotes. Gratian's borrowings from Pseudo-Isidore are marked in Friedberg's edition by references to Hinschius's edition of Pseudo-Isidore; e.g. see Friedberg [1879], vol. 1, col. 342, note 221. The Pseudo-Isidorian collection, made in the mid-ninth century, contained much authentic material, but with an admixture of forgery. Its purpose, apparently, was to strengthen the position of the French bishops, in part by enhancing the power of the pope (far off in Rome!)—by reserving certain powers to the pope, Isidore sought to protect the bishops against persons closer at hand. Some of the falsifications included in the Pseudo-Isidorian collection had been produced earlier, e.g. the Donation of Constantine (see English translation and the New Advent article listed under "Other Internet Resources") and the Recognitions of Clement.

28. The relevant part, together with the medieval gloss, has been translated in Gratian [1993].

29. See Tierney [1997].

30. "According to natural law all persons were born free.... slavery itself was unknown; but after slavery was admitted by the Law of Nations..."; Digest 1.1.4. According to Isidore, in Gratian, dist. 1, c. 7 (Friedberg [1879], vol. 1, col. 2), natural law includes "the one liberty of all".

31. According to Institutes 2.1.11-12, property originates by natural law, with which the law of nations is synonymous: "Of some things we obtain dominium [lordship] by natural law, which, as we have said, is called the law of nations... For whatever belonged before to no one is granted by natural reason to the one who takes possession". But according to other texts, distinction of lordship was established by the law of nations, in a sense not synonymous with natural law; Digest 1.1.5.

32. Natural law includes "the common possession of all" (Decretum, dist. 1, c. 7, Friedberg [1879], vol. 1, col. 2). "Superfluous" property must as a matter of justice be made available to the poor, especially in time of need. See Tierney [1959], pp. 28-39.

33. Digest 1.4.1, "Quod principi placuit, legis habet vigorem"—"What pleases the ruler has the force of law, since by the lex regia, which was made concerning the emperor's rule, the people conferred on him all of its power to rule." This makes the ruler's will decisive, but note that his authority rests on a popular decision. (There was some debate among lawyers as to whether the people could reclaim their authority. See Gierke [1951], pp. 43-46, 150-53; Carlyle [1930], vol. 2, pp. 60-67, vol. 5, p. 49, vol. 6, pp. 13-19.) According to Digest 1.3.31, "Princeps legibus solutus est"—"The ruler is not bound by the law." (This text is the origin of the term "absolutism".) Another text, often referred to in the middle ages by the incipit "Digna vox", suggested that the Emperor should obey his own laws: Codex 1.14.4: "It is a saying worthy of the majesty of a ruler for the ruler to profess that he is bound by the laws, since our authority depends on the authority of law. Indeed it is better for the empire for the rulership to submit to the laws". See Pennington [1993a], p.78.

34. Digest 1.1.3, Decretum, dist. 1, c. 7 (Friedberg [1879], vol. 1, col. 2).

35. "Two there are, august emperor, by which this world is chiefly ruled, the sacred authority of the priesthood and the royal power. Of these the responsibility of the priests is more weighty, in so far as they will answer for the kings of men themselves at the divine judgment... [I]n the order of religion... you ought to submit yourselves [to priests] rather than rule... [T]he bishops themselves... obey your law so far as the sphere of public order is concerned". Gratian, Decretum, dist. 96, c. 10; translated Tierney [1980], pp.13-14.

36. Dist. 96., c. 6, Friedberg [1879], vol. 1, col. 339; translated Tierney [1980], pp. 14-15.

37. C. 11, q. 1, c. 29 and c. 30 , Friedberg [1879], vol. 1, col. 634. These texts are inauthentic, being drawn from the Pseudo-Isidorean collection (see note 27 above).

38. On corporations see Tierney [1982], p. 80ff.

39. "Quod omnes tangit ab omnibus tractari et approbari debet". See Post [1946] and Congar [1958].

40. "Sanior et maior pars". See Moulin [1958]. For Ockham's discussion of this idea see William of Ockham [1995a], pp. 175-6. For an entertaining account of an election campaign in a monastery, with references to different modes of decision making, see Jocelin of Brakelond.

41. Lewis [1954], vol. 1, p. 36.

42. Lewis [1954], vol. 1, p. 38.

43. Alexander of Hales [1948], vol. 4, pp. 348, 351-2.

44. "As a sick man should not find fault with the medical treatment, because one thing is prescribed to-day and another to-morrow, and what was at first required is afterwards forbidden, since the method of cure depends on this; so the human race, sick and sore as it is from Adam to the end of the world, as long as the corrupted body weighs down the mind, should not find fault with the divine prescriptions, if sometimes the same observances are enjoined, and sometimes an old observance is exchanged for one of a different kind"; Contra Faustum, XXXII.14. See also De vera religione, XVII.34.

45. "It must be said that by natural law all things were common and there was one liberty of all, this was before sin; after sin some things were proper to some; and both of these are by natural law"; Alexander of Hales [1948], vol. 4, p. 348. Cf. p. 352.

46. According to Bonaventure some things are dictates of nature simply, valid for every state of human existence (e. g. that God is to be honoured), others are dictates of nature as it was first instituted, valid for the state of innocence (e.g. that all things should be common), and others are dictates of nature in its fallen state (e.g. that property rights should be respected); Bonaventure [1882], 2 Sent., dist. 44, a. 2, q. 2, ad 4.

47. See William of Ockham [1995a], pp. 286-293, Kilcullen [2001a].

48. See Flüeler [1993].

49. Thomas Aquinas's commentary is incomplete (it ends at III.6). Peter of Auvergne completed the work. See Grech [1967]. Peter also wrote a commentary in question form. For translations from both commentaries see McGrade, Kilcullen and Kempshall [2001], p. 216ff.

50. See William of Ockham [1995a], pp. 133-143. See Lambertini [2000], p. 269ff.

51. A "political animal" means an animal whose nature is to live in a polis or city, not isolated or in small groups. Civilisation is the natural state not in the sense that it is the original state, but in the sense that the natural goal of human development is life in cities: “If the earlier forms of society are natural, so is the state, for it is the end of them, and the nature of a thing is its end. For what each thing is when fully developed, we call its nature... Hence it is evident that the state is a creation of nature, and that man is by nature a political animal"; Politics I.2, 1252 b30-1253 a3. In this translation (by Jowett) "state" corresponds to the Greek polis, which in the Latin translation is civitas, city. On the vocabulary see Luscombe [1992].

52. Politics III.9, 1280 a32- b35.

53. Politics I.5 and 6 could almost be taken as a dialectical exploration of the question of the justice of slavery, but from other places in the Politics it is clear that Aristotle himself believed that some human beings were marked by nature to be slaves: "Slaves and brute animals... cannot [form a state], for they have no share in happiness or in a life of free choice"; III.9, 1280 a32-4. See my notes. According to Duns Scotus (d. 1308) slavery in the sense of harsh subjection to another can be justified only as punishment. "Natural" slavery, which Scotus describes as "civil and political subjection", must benefit the slave; such slaves do have free will and a possibility of virtue. See Flüeler [1993], pp. 75-81.

54. Politics I.5, 1254 b13. See my notes.

55. Politics III.7. The classification came from Plato (Statesman, 302c-303b), and Aristotle goes on to undermine or qualify it in many ways (see my notes "Kinds of Constitutions" and "Democracy, Oligarchy and Polity").

56. See Kempshall [1999]. For translations of relevant texts, see McGrade, Kilcullen and Kempshall [2001].

57. See Blythe [1992]; William of Ockham [1995a], pp. 311-323.

58. Politics III.16.

59. Nicomachean Ethics V.10, and Politics III.16, 1287 a23-28, 1287 b15-27.

60. Politics V, and VI.5.

61. Thomas Aquinas [2002], p. 17ff.

62. Politics III.11.

63. "For those who wish to get clear of difficulties it is advantageous to discuss the difficulties well; for... it is not possible to untie a knot of which one does not know... Hence one should have surveyed all the difficulties beforehand... Further, he who has heard all the contending arguments, as if they were the parties to a case, must be in a better position to judge"; Aristotle, Metaphysics, III.1, 995 a23-b5. The study of law also reinforced the practice of disputation.

64. See Rivière [1925].

65. See Congar [1961].

66. Tierney [1980], pp. 153-4.

67. See Miethke [2000a]. For translations and explanations of texts relating to the conflict see Tierney [1980].

68. The texts are collected in Thomas Aquinas [2002], to which I give page references.

69. Natural law is mentioned in Romans 2:14-15: "For when the Gentiles, who have not the law, do by nature those things that are of the law; these having not the law are a law to themselves: Who shew the work of the law written in their hearts, their conscience bearing witness to them, and their thoughts between themselves accusing, or also defending one another." The contrast between nature and convention goes back to the sophists. It would have been known to medieval readers also from Aristotle, Politics, I.6, 1255 a5.

70. This theory is a species of what Sidgwick called "intuitionism" (Sidgwick [1907], Book 1, chapter 8, esp. p. 101).

71. See Blythe [1992], pp. 57-8. Thomas knew nothing of Polybios.

72. See Rivière [1926], Dupuy [1655]. In addition to the writers discussed below see also Dyson [1999a], [1999b], James of Viterbo [1995], Augustine of Ancona [2001].

73. According to Ubl, [2003], pp. 54-56, John of Paris had in his sights not Giles of Rome but university disputations of James of Viterbo and Henry of Ghent.

74. Giles of Rome [1986], pp. 116-123. On theories of hierarchy, see Luscombe [1988b],1998, [2003]. See also Pascoe [1973], p. 17ff.

75.Giles of Rome [1986], pp. 68-69.

76. See Wyclif [2001]. For a discussion of the question whether unbelievers can have dominium, see William of Ockham [1992], pp. 84-7.

77. On the genesis and intention of Unam sanctam see Ubl [2004].

78. For translation see McGrade, Kilcullen and Kempshall [2001], p. 200ff.

79. According to the canon lawyers, the Pope and other clergy were administrators of Church property, not the owners. See Tierney [1959], pp. 39-43.

80. John of Paris [1971], pp 148, 154, 225-6. See Ubl and Vinx [2000], p. 321, where they quote also from John of Paris's unpublished Commentary on the Sentences to the same effect: "appropriatio est de iure humano".

81. For translation see Marsilius of Padua [1980]. Page references are to that version.

82. Hooker's defence of Elizabeth's governorship of the Church (Hooker, 1989) seems to have been influenced, at least indirectly, by Marsilius. Hooker maintains that when the people are Christians there is no "personal separation" between Church and State, and that the secular ruler is then (in some sense) the head of the Church, with sole authority to call church assemblies and a veto over their legislation, with authority to appoint bishops and other officials, with exemption from excommunication.

83. See William of Ockham [2001].

84. See Kilcullen [2001b].

85. See William of Ockham [1992], [1995a], [1995b] (3.1 Dialogus 1), and [1998].

86. For Ockham's disagreements with Marsilius, see William of Ockham [1995b] (3.1 Dialogus 3, 4).

87. See Bayley [1949].

88. See William of Ockham [1995a], p. 309ff.

89. See McGrade [1974], pp. 47-77; McGrade, Kilcullen, and Kempshall [2001] pp. 484-95.

90. Tierney [1969].

91. See Oakley [1962], pp. 3-11.

92. See Tierney [1955].

93. Ockham's opinion was that no part of the Church, neither Pope nor Council, was infallible (Kilcullen [1991]). For what is probably an attempt to answer Ockham, see Marsilius Defensor minor 12.5, [1993], pp. 42-3.

94. See Burns and Izbicki [1997] for an English translation of the debate over conciliarism between Cajetan, Almain and Maior. Like Ockham, Cajetan held that the constitution of the Church is monarchical, by divine law, but, unlike Ockham, did not envisage the possibility that on occasion exceptions might be made to divine law.

95. See Hamilton [1963].

96. On attempts by theologians to defend the rights of the Indians see Muldoon [1980], [1998].

97. On war see also Suárez [1944], pp. 800ff, 739ff.