# Mally's Deontic Logic

*First published Fri Apr 5, 2002; substantive revision Tue Nov 2, 2004*

In 1926, Mally presented the first formal system of deontic logic. His system had several consequences which Mally regarded as surprising but defensible. It also had a consequence ("A is obligatory if and only if A is the case") which Menger (1939) and almost all later deontic logicians have regarded as unacceptable. We will not only describe Mally's system but also discuss how it may be repaired.

- 1. Introduction
- 2. Mally's Formal Language
- 3. Mally's Axioms
- 4. Mally's Theorems
- 5. Surprising Consequences
- 6. Menger's Criticism
- 7. Where Did Mally Go Wrong?
- 8. Alternative Non-Deontic Bases
- 9. Alternative Deontic Principles
- 10. Conclusion
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Introduction

In 1926, the Austrian philosopher Ernst Mally (1879-1944) proposed
the first formal system of deontic logic. In the book in which he
presented this system, *The Basic Laws of Ought: Elements of the
Logic of Willing*, Mally gave the following motivation for his
enterprise:

In 1919, everybody was using the word self-determination. I wanted to obtain a clear understanding of this word. But then, of course, I immediately stumbled on the difficulties and obscurities surrounding the concept of Ought, and the problem changed. The concept of Ought is the basic concept of the whole of ethics. It can only serve as a usable foundation for ethics when it is captured in a system of axioms. In the following I will present such an axiomatic system.^{[1]}

As Mally's words indicate, he was not primarily interested in
deontic logic for its own sake: he mainly wanted to lay the foundation
of "an exact system of pure ethics" (*eine exakte reine Ethik*).
More than half of his book is devoted to the development of this exact
system of ethics. In the following, we will, however, concentrate on
the formal part of his book, both because it is its "hard core" and
because it is the part that has attracted the most interest.

## 2. Mally's Formal Language

Mally based his formal system on the classical propositional
calculus as formulated in Whitehead's and Russell's *Principia
Mathematica* (vol. 1, 1910).

The non-deontic part of Mally's system had the following vocabulary:
the sentential letters A, B, C, P and Q (these symbols refer to states
of affairs), the sentential variables M and N, the sentential constants
V (the *Verum*, Truth) and Λ (the *Falsum*,
Falsity), the propositional quantifiers ∃ and ∀, and the
connectives ¬, & ,
, → and
↔ . Λ is defined by Λ = ¬V.

The deontic part of Mally's vocabulary consisted of the unary connective !, the binary connectives f and ∞, and the sentential constants U and ∩.

- Mally read !A as "A ought to be the case" (
*A soll sein*) or as "let A be the case" (*es sei A*). - He read A f B as "A requires B" (
*A fordert B*). - He read A ∞ B as "A and B require each other."
- He read U as "the unconditionally obligatory" (
*das unbedingt Geforderte*). - He read ∩ as "the unconditionally forbidden" (
*das unbedingt Verbotene*).

f, ∞ and ∩ are defined by:

Def. f . A f B = A → !B (Mally 1926, p. 12) Def. ∞ . A ∞ B = (A f B) & (B f A) Def. ∩. ∩ = ¬U

Mally did not only read !A as "it ought to be the case that A."
Because a person's willing that a given state of affairs A be the case
is often expressed by sentences of the form "A ought to be the case"
(for example, someone might say "it ought to be the case that I am rich
and famous" to indicate that she wants to be rich and famous), he also
read !A as "A is desirable" or "I want it to be the case that A." As a
result, his formal system was as much a theory about *Wollen*
(willing) as a theory about *Sollen* (ought to be the case).
This explains the subtitle of his book. In modern deontic logic, the
basic deontic connective O is seldom read in this way.

We have just described one respect in which Mally's deontic logic was different from more modern proposals. There are two other conspicuous differences:

- Mally was only interested in the deontic status of states of
affairs; he paid no special attention to the deontic status of actions.
Thus, his
*Deontik*was a theory about*Seinsollen*(what ought to be the case) rather than*Tunsollen*(what ought to be done). Modern authors often regard the concept of*Tunsollen*as fundamental. - In modern deontic logic, the notions of prohibition F, permission P and waiver W are usually defined in terms of obligation O: FA = O¬A, PA = ¬FA, WA = ¬OA. Such definitions are not to be found in Mally's book.

## 3. Mally's Axioms

Mally adopted the following informal deontic principles (Mally 1926, pp. 15-19):

(i) If A requires B and if B then C, then A requires C. (ii) If A requires B and if A requires C, then A requires B and C. (iii) A requires B if and only if it is obligatory that if A then B. (iv) The unconditionally obligatory is obligatory. (v) The unconditionally obligatory does not require its own negation.

Mally did not offer much support for these principles. They simply seemed intuitively plausible to him.

Mally formalized his principles as follows (Mally 1926, pp. 15-19):

I. ((A f B) & (B → C)) → (A f C) II. ((A f B) & (A f C)) → (A f (B & C)) III. (A f B) ↔ !(A → B) IV. ∃U !U V. ¬(U f ∩)

Axiom IV is strange:

- !U is a more natural formalization of (iv).
- Axiom IV seems redundant: !A → !A is a tautology, so we have !A f A by Def. f, whence !(!A → A) by Axiom III(→), whence ∃M !M by existential generalization. Axiom IV seems to add nothing to this.
- Axiom IV is the only axiom or theorem mentioned by Mally in which U occurs as a bound variable: in Axiom V and in theorems (15)-(17), (20)-(21), (23), (23′) and (27)-(35) (to be displayed below), U is either a constant or a free variable. One should treat it in the same way in the formalization of (iv).

For these reasons, we replace Axiom IV by the following
axiom:^{[2]}

Mally could hardly have objected to this version of Axiom IV because it is equivalent with his theorem (23′), i.e., V f U, in virtue of Def. f. In the following "Axiom IV" will always refer to our version of Axiom IV rather than Mally's.

IV. !U

Using Def. f, Axioms I-V may also be written as follows (Mally 1926, pp. 15-19 and p. 24):

I′. ((A → !B) & (B → C)) → (A → !C) II′. ((A → !B) & (A → !C)) → (A → !(B & C)) III′. (A → !B) ↔ !(A → B) IV′. V f U V′. ¬(U → !∩)

## 4. Mally's Theorems

Mally derived the following theorems from his axioms (Mally 1926,
pp. 20-34).^{[3]}

(1) (A f B) → (A f V) (2) (A f Λ) ↔ ∀M (A f M) (3) ((M f A) (M f B)) → (M f (A B)) (4) ((M f A) & (N f B)) → ((M & N) f (A & B)) (5) !P ↔ ∀M (M f P) (6) (!P & (P → Q)) → !Q (7) !P → !V (8) ((A f B) & (B f C)) → (A f C) (9) (!P & (P f Q)) → !Q (10) (!A & !B) ↔ !(A & B) (11) (A ∞ B) ↔ !(A ↔ B) (12) (A f B) ↔ (A → !B) ↔ !(A → B) ↔ !¬(A & ¬B) ↔ !(¬A B) (13) (A → !B) ↔ ¬(A & ¬!B) ↔ (¬A !B) (14) (A f B) ↔ (¬B f ¬A) (15) ∀M (M f U) (16) (U → A) → !A (17) (U f A) → !A (18) !!A → !A (19) !!A ↔ !A (20) (U f A) ↔ (A ∞ U) (21) !A ↔ (A ∞ U) (22) !V (23) V ∞ U (23′) V f U (24) A f A (25) (A → B) → (A f B) (26) (A ↔ B) → (A ∞ B) (27) ∀M (∩ f ¬M) (28) ∩ f ∩ (29) ∩ f U (30) ∩ f Λ (31) ∩ ∞ Λ (32) ¬(U f Λ) (33) ¬(U → Λ) (34) U ↔ V (35) ∩ ↔ Λ

## 5. Surprising Consequences

Mally called theorems (1), (2), (7), (22) and (27)-(35) "surprising"
(*befremdlich*) or even "paradoxical" (*paradox*). He
viewed (34) and (35) as the most surprising of his surprising theorems.
But Mally's reasons for calling these theorems surprising are puzzling
if not confused.

Consider, for example, theorem (1). Mally interpreted this theorem
as follows: "if A requires B, then A requires everything that is the
case" (Mally 1926, p. 20). He regarded this as a surprising claim,
and we agree. However, Mally's interpretation of (1) is not warranted.
(1) only says that if A requires B, then A requires the *Verum*.
The expression "if A requires B, then A requires everything that is the
case" is to be formalized as

This formula is an immediate consequence of (1) in virtue of Axiom I. In other words, Mally should have reasoned as follows: (1′) is surprising; but (1′) is an immediate consequence of (1) in virtue of Axiom I; Axiom 1 is uncontroversial; so (1) is to be regarded as surprising.

(1′) (A f B) → (C → (A f C))

A similar pattern is to be seen in many of Mally's other remarks about theorems which surprised him. He generally read too much into them and confused them with some of the consequences they had in his system:

- Mally was surprised by (2) because he thought that it says that if A requires B and B is not the case, then A requires every state of affairs whatsoever (Mally 1926, p. 21). But (2) says no such thing. Mally's paraphrase is a paraphrase of (A f B) → (¬B → (A f C)) (a consequence of (2) in virtue of Axiom I) rather than (2).
- Mally paraphrased (7) as "if anything is required, then everything that is the case is required" (Mally 1926, p. 28), which is indeed surprising. However, Mally's paraphrase corresponds with !A → (B → !B) (a consequence of (7) in virtue of Axiom I) rather than (7).
- Mally paraphrased (22) as "the facts ought to be the case" (Mally 1926, p. 24). We grant that this is a surprising claim. But the corresponding formula in Mally's language is A → !A (a consequence of (22) in virtue of Axiom I), not (22).
- Mally read (27) as "if something which ought not to be the case is the case, then anything whatsoever ought to be the case" (Mally 1926, pp. 24, 33), but this is a paraphrase of !¬A → (A → !B) (a theorem of Mally's system) rather than (27).
- Mally paraphrased (33) as "what is not the case is not obligatory" (Mally 1926, p. 25) and as "everything that is obligatory is the case" (Mally 1926, p. 34). These assertions are indeed surprising, but Mally's readings of (33) are not warranted. They are paraphrases of !A → A rather than (33).
- Mally made the following remark about (34) and (35):
The latter sentences, which seem to identify being obligatory with being the case, are surely the most surprising of our "surprising consequences."

^{[4]}However, (34) and (35) do not assert that being obligatory is equivalent with being the case, for the latter statement should be formalized as A ↔ !A. The latter formula is a theorem of Mally's system, as will be shown in a moment, but it is not to be found in Mally's book.

Mally regarded theorems (28)-(32) as surprising because of their relationships with certain other surprising theorems:

- (28)-(30) are instantiations of (27). But this is not sufficient to call these theorems surprising. Mally actually viewed (28) as less surprising than (27): one might use it to justify retaliation and revenge (Mally 1926, p. 24).
- (31) implies (28)-(30) and is therefore at least as surprising as those theorems.
- Mally viewed (32) as surprising because the surprising theorem (33) is an immediate consequence of (32) and the apparently non-surprising theorem (25).

Mally's list of surprising theorems seems too short: for example, (24) is equivalent with A → !A in virtue of Def. f. But A → !A may be paraphrased as "the facts ought to be the case," an assertion which Mally regarded as surprising (Mally 1926, p. 24). So then why didn't he call (24) surprising? Did it not surprise him after (22)?

Even though Mally regarded many of his theorems as surprising, he
thought that he had discovered an interesting concept of "correct
willing" (*richtiges Wollen*) or "willing in accordance with the
facts" which should not be confused with the notions of obligation and
willing used in ordinary discourse. Mally's "exact system of pure
ethics" was mainly concerned with this concept, but we will not
describe this system because it belongs to the field of ethics rather
than deontic logic.

## 6. Menger's Criticism

In 1939, Karl Menger published a devastating critique of Mally's formal system. He first pointed out that A ↔ !A is a theorem of this system. In other words, if A is the case, then A is obligatory, and if A ought to be the case then A is indeed the case. As we have already noted in connection with theorems (34) and (35), Mally made the same claim in informal terms, but the formula A ↔ !A does not occur in his book.

Menger's theorem A ↔ !A may be proven as follows (Menger's
proof was different; **PC** denotes the propositional
calculus).

First, A → !A is a theorem:

1. A → ((!B → !B) & (B → A)) [ PC]^{[5]}2. ((!B → !B) & (B → A)) → (!B → !A) [ I′ ] 3. A → (!B → !A) [ 1, 2, PC]4. !B → (A → !A) [ 3, PC]5a. !U [ Ax. IV ] 5b. !(!A → A) [ III′(→), PC]6. A → !A [ 4, either 5a or 5b, PC]

Second, !A → A is a theorem:

1. ((U → !A) & (A → ∩)) → (U → !∩) [ I′ ] 2. ¬((U → !A) & (A → ∩)) [ 1, V′, PC]3. ¬((U → !A) & (A → ∩)) → (!A → A) [ PC]^{[6]}4. !A → A [ 2, 3, PC]

Because A → !A and !A → A are theorems, A ↔ !A is a theorem as well.

Menger gave the following comment:

This result seems to me to be detrimental for Mally's theory, however. It indicates that the introduction of the sign ! is superfluous in the sense that it may be cancelled or inserted in any formula at any place we please. But this result (in spite of Mally's philosophical justification) clearly contradicts not only our use of the word "ought" but also some of Mally's own correct remarks about this concept, e.g. the one at the beginning of his development to the effect that p → (!q or !r) and p → !(q or r) are not equivalent. Mally is quite right that these two propositions are not equivalent according to the ordinary use of the word "ought." But they are equivalent according to his theory by virtue of the equivalence of p and !p (Menger 1939, p. 58).

Almost all deontic logicians have accepted Menger's verdict. After 1939, Mally's deontic system has seldom been taken seriously.

## 7. Where Did Mally Go Wrong?

Where did Mally go wrong? How could one construct a system of deontic logic which does more justice to the notion of obligation used in ordinary discourse? Three types of answers are possible:

- Mally should not have added his deontic axioms to classical propositional logic;
- Some of his deontic principles should be modified; and
- Both of the above. Menger advocated the latter view: "One of the reasons for the failure of Mally's interesting attempt is that it was founded on the 2-valued calculus of propositions" (Menger 1939, p. 59).

We will only explore the first two suggestions. Each of them will turn out to be sufficient, so the third proposal is overkill.

We will first show that if Mally's deontic principles are added to a system in which the so-called paradoxes of material and strict implication are avoided, many of the "surprising" theorems (such as (34) and (35)) are no longer derivable and A ↔ !A is no longer derivable either. But most of the theorems which Mally regarded as "plausible" are still derivable. The resulting system is closely related to Anderson's relevant deontic logic (1967).

After this, we will show that one might also modify some of the specifically deontic principles: Def. f and Axiom I may be modified in such a way that the resulting system is almost identical with the system nowadays known as standard deontic logic. The resulting system agrees less well with Mally's deontic expectations (as revealed by his expressions of surprise) than the first one does, but it is adequate in the sense that (34), (35) and A ↔ !A are no longer derivable.

## 8. Alternative Non-Deontic Bases

Mally's informal postulates (i)-(iii) and (v) are conditionals or
negations of conditionals, i.e., of the form "if ... then --" or "not:
if ... then --." Føllesdal and Hilpinen (1981, pp. 5-6)
have suggested that such conditionals should not be formalized in terms
of material implication and that some sort of strict implication would
be more appropriate. But this suggestion is not altogether
satisfactory, for if I′ and III′ are added to the rather
weak system of strict implication **S2** (with → as
the symbol of strict implication), then the undesirable theorem A
→ !A is again
derivable.^{[7]}

In systems of strict implication the so-called paradoxes of material
implication (such as A → (B → A)) are avoided, but the
so-called paradoxes of strict implication (such as (A & ¬A)
→ B) remain. What would happen to Mally's system if *both*
kinds of paradoxes were avoided? This question can be answered by
adding Mally's axioms to a system in which none of the so-called
"fallacies of relevance" can be derived (see the entry on
relevance logic).

In the following, we will add Mally's axioms to the most popular
system of this type, relevant system **R**. The result is
better than in the case of **S2**: most of the theorems
which Mally regarded as surprising are no longer derivable, and
Menger's theorem A ↔ !A is not derivable either. But many
"plausible" theorems can still be derived.

Relevant system **R** with the propositional constant t
("the conjunction of all truths") has the following axioms and rules
(Anderson & Belnap 1975, ch. V; ↔ is defined by A ↔
B = (A → B) & (B → A)):

Self-implication. A → A Prefixing. (A → B) → ((C → A) → (C → B)) Contraction. (A → (A → B)) → (A → B) Permutation. (A → (B → C)) → (B → (A → C)) & Elimination. (A & B) → A, (A & B) → B & Introduction. ((A → B) & (A → C)) → (A → (B & C)) Introduction. A → (A B), B → (A B) Elimination. ((A → C) & (B → C)) → ((A B) → C) Distribution. (A & (B C)) → ((A & B) C) Double Negation. ¬¬A → A Contraposition. (A → ¬B) → (B → ¬A) Ax. t. A ↔ (t → A) Modus Ponens. A, A → B / B Adjunction. A, B / A & B

A relevant version **RD** of Mally's deontic system may
be defined as follows:

- The language is the same as the language of
**R**, except that we write V instead of t, add the propositional constant U and the unary connective !, and define Λ, ∩, f and ∞ as in Mally's system. - Axiomatization: add Mally's Axioms I-V to the axioms and rules
of
**R**.

**RD** has the following properties.

- Axioms I, II and III may be replaced by the following three
simpler
axioms:
^{[8]}I*. (A → B) → (!A → !B) II*. (!A & !B) → !(A & B) III*. !(!A → A) - Formulas I′-V′, (3), (4), (6), (8)-(11), (14),
(16)-(18), (23′) and (30) are theorems of
**RD**.^{[9]} - Formulas (1), (2), (5), (7), (12), (13), (15), (19)-(23),
(24)-(29), (31)-(35), A → !A and !A → A are not
derivable.
^{[10]} - There are 12 mismatches between
**RD**and Mally's expectations: (5), (12)-(13), (15), (19)-(21), (23) and (24)-(26) are not derivable even though Mally did not regard these formulas as surprising, and (30) is a theorem even though Mally viewed it as surprising. - Formulas (34) and (35) (the formulas which Mally viewed as the most
surprising theorems of his system) are in a sense stranger than
Menger's theorem A ↔ !A because the latter theorem is derivable in
**RD**supplemented with (34) or (35) while neither (34) nor (35) is derivable in**RD**supplemented with A ↔ !A.^{[11]}

Although most of Mally's surprising theorems are not derivable in
**RD**, this has nothing to do with Mally's own reasons
for regarding these theorems as surprising. They are not derivable in
**RD** because they depend on fallacies of relevance.
Mally never referred to such fallacies to explain his surprise. His
considerations were quite different, as we have already described.

**RD** is closely related to Anderson's relevant
deontic logic **ARD**, which is defined as
**R** supplemented with the following two axioms (Anderson
1967, 1968, McArthur 1981; Anderson used the unary connective O instead
of !):

ARD1. !A ↔ (¬A → ∩) ARD2. !A → ¬!¬A

- All theorems of
**RD**are theorems of**ARD**.^{[12]} - ARD1( → ) is not a theorem of
**RD**+ARD2.^{[13]}This formula does not occur in Mally's book. According to Anderson, Bohnert (1945) was the first one to propose it.^{[14]} - ARD2 is not a theorem of
**RD**+ARD1.^{[15]}This formula does not occur in Mally's book, but Mally endorsed the corresponding informal principle: "a person who wills correctly does not will (not even implicitly) the negation of what he wills; correct willing is free of contradictions."^{[16]} **RD**supplemented with ARD1( → ) and ARD2 has the same theorems as**ARD**.^{[17]}

Anderson's system has several problematical features (McArthur 1981,
Goble 1999, 2001) and **RD** shares most of these
features. But we will not go into this issue here. It is at any rate
clear that **RD** is better than Mally's original
system.

## 9. Alternative Deontic Principles

Instead of changing the non-deontic propositional basis of Mally's
system, one might also modify the specifically deontic axioms and
rules. This might of course be done in various ways, but the following
approach works well without departing too much from Mally's original
assumptions.^{[18]}

First, regard f as primitive and replace Mally's definition of f in terms of → and ! (Def. f, the very first specifically deontic postulate in Mally's book) by the following definition of ! in terms of V and f :

Second, replace Axiom I, which may also be written as (B → C) → ((A f B) → (A f C)), with the following

Def. !. !A = V f A

*rule of inference*:

R f . B → C / (A f B) → (A f C)

We may then derive:

1. B → C / !B → !C [ Def. !, R f ] 2. (!A & !B) → !(A & B) [ Def. !, Ax. II ] 3. !V [ 1, Ax. IV, PC]4. ¬!Λ [ 1, Ax. III(←), Ax. V, PC(ex falso) ]

The so-called standard system of deontic logic **KD**
is defined as **PC** supplemented with 1-4 (except that !
is usually written as O: see the entry on
deontic logic),
so the new system is at
least as strong as **KD**. It is not difficult to see that
it is in fact identical with **KD** supplemented with OU
(Mally's Axiom IV) and the following definition of f : A f B = O(A
→ B). In modern deontic logic, the notion of *commitment*
is sometimes defined in this way.

In the new system, Mally's theorems have the following status.

- II′, IV′, (1)-(5), (7)-(11), (13)-(15), (17), (20)-(24) and (27)-(32) are derivable.
- I′, III′, V′, (6), (12), (16), (18)-(19), (25)-(26), (33)-(35), A → !A and !A → A are not derivable.
- There are 20 mismatches with Mally's deontic expectations: 10 "plausible" formulas are no longer derivable, namely I′, III′, V′, (6), (12), (16), (18)-(19) and (25)-(26), and 10 "surprising" theorems are still derivable, namely (1), (2), (7), (22) and (27)-(32).
- Although (34) and (35) are not derivable, adding them would by no means lead to the theoremhood of A ↔ !A.

There were only 12 mismatches in the case of **RD**, so
the new system does less justice to Mally's deontic expectations than
**RD** did. But it agrees better with his general outlook
because it is still based on classical propositional logic, a system to
which Mally did not object (not that he had much choice in the
1920s).

Many of Mally's surprising theorems are derivable in
**KD**, but they have, as it were, lost their sting: those
theorems lead to surprising consequences when combined with Mally's
Axiom I and his definition of f , but they are completely harmless
without these postulates.

The standard system of deontic logic has several problematical features. The fact that each provable statement is obligatory is often regarded as counterintuitive, and there are many other well-known "paradoxes." The revised version of Mally's system shares these problematical features. But we will not discuss these issues here. The standard system is at any rate better than Mally's original proposal.

## 10. Conclusion

Mally's deontic logic is unacceptable for the reasons stated by Menger (1939). But it is not as bad as it may seem at first sight. Only relatively minor modifications are needed to turn it into a more acceptable system. One may either change the non-deontic basis to get a system that is similar to Anderson's system, or apply two patches to the deontic postulates to obtain a system similar to standard deontic logic.

Some authors have refused to view Mally's deontic logic as a "real" deontic system and say that they "mention it only by way of curiosity" (Meyer and Wieringa 1993, p. 4). The above shows that this judgment is too harsh. It is only a small step, not a giant leap, from Mally's system to modern systems of deontic logic, so Mally's pioneering effort deserves rehabilitation rather than contempt.

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## Other Internet Resources

- Basic information page on Ernst Mally (Edward Zalta, Stanford University).

## Related Entries

logic: deontic | logic: relevance### Acknowledgments

The author is very grateful to Lou Goble, whose extensive comments on two earlier drafts led to many substantial improvements. The author would also like to thank Lou Goble and Edgar Morscher for making their papers on Anderson's and Mally's deontic logic available to him, and Robert K. Meyer for helping him find the matrices used in note 10.