Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to John Locke

The Influence of John Locke's Works

The sustained argument in An Essay Concerning Human Understanding for rejecting the old scholastic model of knowledge and science in favor of empirically disciplined modes of inquiry was enormously successful. Hans Aarsleff remarks that Locke ‘is the most influential philosopher of modern times.’ He notes that besides initiating the vigorous tradition known as British empiricism, Locke's influence reached far beyond the limits of the traditional discipline of philosophy. ‘His influence in the history of thought, on the way we think about ourselves and our relation to the world we live in, to God, nature and society, has been immense’ (Aarsleff, 1994, 252) Locke may well have influenced such diverse eighteenth century figures as Swift, Johnson, Sterne, Voltaire, Priestly and Jefferson.

Beginning with the publication of the 92 page summary of the Essay in the Bibliotheque universelle et historique for January through March of 1688 along with the publication of the first edition in December 1689, the Essay was both popular and controversial on both the continent and in England for the next fifty years. Locke's arguments against innate principles and ideas largely prevailed. This was an early and striking success of the Essay. Recall that Locke's attack on innate ideas was part and parcel of his anti-authoritarianism and his emphasis on the importance of free and autonomous inquiry. As Aarsleff also notes, the radical nature of Locke's attacks on epistemic, political and religious authority are difficult for us to grasp today. Bishop Stillingfleet, the most prominent of Locke's early critics, claimed that Locke's new way of ideas would lead to skepticism and that his account of substance undermined the doctrine of the trinity. Locke denied this, but given that we have good reason to hold that Locke was an anti-trinitarian, we have some reason to doubt that this denial is sincere. Locke's epistemological views and his advocacy of rational religion were taken up by early eighteenth century deists such as John Toland and Anthony Collins who drew conclusions about religion that outraged the orthodox. The age of rational religion was coming to a close by the middle of the eighteenth century.

Within a few years of the publication of the 5th edition of Locke's essay, Berkeley attacked the alliance between empiricism and the science of Newton and the Royal Society which is an important feature of Locke's Essay. Berkeley argued that the causal or representative account of perception leads to skepticism about the existence of the external world as there is no good solution to the problem of the veil of perception and the associated distinction between primary and secondary qualities is untenable. These attacks gave rise to several misapprehensions about the doctrines of the Essay and their connection with the history of philosophy. If one accepts Berkeley's arguments the result is the view that empiricism leads to idealism and that the atomism which Locke regarded as the most plausible hypothesis about the world must be abandoned. Locke certainly thought he had the resources to solve the problems posed by the veil of perception doctrine and his account of the distinction between primary and secondary qualities is not the same as the one that Berkeley gives. Nonetheless, Berkeley's attacks on the Essay have produced long lasting and influential misinterpretations of the Essay. These misinterpretations led Reid, for example, to the rejection of the way of ideas (as it leads to the denial of the existence of the external world) and probably fueled Kant's notion that the British empiricism of the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries with its characteristic inadequacies and virtues is one of the two great streams leading inevitably towards his own transcendental idealism. If one does not accept the force of Berkeley's arguments, then neither Reid's conclusion or Kant's story have much force to them.

Locke's account of personal identity was genuinely revolutionary and a real contribution to philosophy. This, along with his agnosticism about whether the soul was material or immaterial were debated hotly through much of the eighteenth century and at least the debates about personal identity were largely recapitulated in the twentieth century. Much of this begins with the Collins/Clarke controversy of 1706-08. Locke's account of free agency is just as interesting and important as his account of personal identity with which it is connected. Yet it seems not to have been as controversial as Locke's account of personal identity. Gideon Yaffe's recent book Liberty Worth the Name may well revive interest in Locke's views on this subject as Yaffe argues that they are still of relevance to contemporary debates about free will and compatibilism.

The extant of the influence that Locke's account of language has had over the centuries is a matter of scholarly debate. Norman Kretzmann holds that Locke's views, while not original had a powerful influence on the Enlightenment view of the connection of words and ideas. Noam Chomsky in Cartesian Linguistics traces the important ideas in linguistics back to Descartes and the school at Port Royal rather than Locke. This is largely a matter of the importance of the innate in Chomsky's thought. Hans Aarsleff, on the other hand, believes that Locke stands at the beginning of the developments that produced contemporary linguistics and that Chomsky's account is more polemical than historical.

The Two Treatises of Government were published anonymously and it was only in Locke's will that he acknowledged the authorship of this work and others such as the Letters Concerning Toleration. As a consequence the Two Treatises had very little influence on the debates over how to justify the legitimacy of replacing King James II with William and Mary. John Dunn claims that in the eighteenth century in England the work had little influence. It was supposed that since it was written by England's greatest philosopher it must be the way things were done but few bothered to read it. Certainly conservatives such as Josiah Tucker read it and rejected its doctrines. There has been considerable scholarly debate about how much Locke's political doctrines affected the American revolutionaries and the writing of the American declaration of independence. The original claim that Locke's thought had considerable influence on the colonists was challenged and has more recently been reaffirmed. In France, Locke was influential through the first half of the eighteenth century and then rapidly lost influence as the French came to regard the English as conservative.

In the late eighteenth and nineteenth centuries Locke's views were largely rejected and his influence was at its lowest ebb. He was regarded as one of the prophets of the American and French revolutions. The doctrines of natural rights and human rights were rejected in favor of utilitarianism. Locke's philosophy was largely misinterpreted and rejected. Even the publication of Fox Bourne's two volume biography of Locke hardly raised any new interest.

In the twentieth century with the sale of the Lovelace papers and their donation to Oxford University, interest in Locke among philosophers has considerably revived. These papers included letters, several drafts of the Essay and other works. We now know considerably more about Locke and the development of his thought than was known previously and Locke scholars have been putting Locke's philosophy in its historical, religious, political and intellectual context. It is likely that this revival of interest will continue into the twenty first century.

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