Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Thu Nov 28, 1996; substantive revision Mon Sep 29, 2003

Liberalism can be understood as (1) a political tradition (2) a political philosophy and (3) a general philosophical theory, encompassing a theory of value, a conception of the person and a moral theory as well as a political philosophy. As a political tradition liberalism has varied in different countries. In England — in many ways the birthplace of liberalism — the liberal tradition in politics has centred on religious toleration, government by consent, personal and, especially, economic freedom. In France liberalism has been more closely associated with secularism and democracy. In the United States liberals often combine a devotion to personal liberty with an antipathy to capitalism, while the liberalism of Australia tends to be much more sympathetic to capitalism but often less enthusiastic about civil liberties. To understand this diversity in political traditions, we need to examine liberalism as a political theory and as a general philosophy. These latter two are the concerns of this essay.

1. Liberalism as a Political Theory


‘By definition’, Maurice Cranston rightly pointed out, ‘a liberal is a man who believes in liberty’ (Cranston, 459). In two different ways, liberals accord liberty primacy as a political value. First, liberals have typically maintained that humans are naturally in ‘a State of perfect Freedom to order their Actions…as they think fit…without asking leave, or depending on the Will of any other Man’ (Locke, 1960 [1689]: 287). Mill too argued that ‘[T]he burden of proof is supposed to ith those who are against liberty; who contend for any restriction or prohibition…. The a priori assumption is in favour of freedom…’(Mill, 1991 [1859]: 472). This might be called the Fundamental Liberal Principle (Gaus, 1996: 162-166): freedom is normatively basic, and so the onus of justification is on those who would limit freedom. It follows from this that political authority and law must be justified, as they limit the liberty of citizens. Consequently, a central question of liberal political theory is whether political authority can be justified, and if so, how. It is for this reason that social contract theory, as developed by Thomas Hobbes (1948 [1651]), John Locke (1960 [1689]), Jean-Jacques Rousseau (1973 [1762]) and Immanuel Kant (1965 [1797]), is usually viewed as liberal even though the actual political prescriptions of, say, Hobbes and Rousseau, have distinctly illiberal features. Insofar as they take as their starting point a state of nature in which humans are free and equal, and so argue that any limitation of this freedom and equality stands in need of justification (i.e., by the social contract), the contractual tradition expresses the Fundamental Liberal Principle.

The Fundamental Liberal Principle holds that restrictions on liberty must be justified, and because he accepts this, we can understand Hobbes as espousing a liberal political theory. But Hobbes is at best a qualified liberal, for he also argues that drastic limitations on liberty can be justified. Paradigmatic liberals such as Locke not only advocate the Fundamental Liberal Principle, but also maintain that justified limitations on liberty are fairly modest. Only a limited government can be justified; indeed, the basic task of government is to protect the equal liberty of citizens. Thus John Rawls's first principle of justice: ‘Each person is to have an equal right to the most extensive total system of equal basic liberties compatible with a similar system for all’ (Rawls, 1971: 302).

Negative, Positive, and Republican Liberty

Liberals disagree, however, about the concept of liberty, and as a result the liberal ideal of protecting individual liberty can lead to very different conceptions of the task of government. As is well-known, Isaiah Berlin has advocated a negative conception of liberty:
I am normally said to be free to the degree to which no man or body of men interferes with my activity. Political liberty in this sense is simply the area within which a man can act unobstructed by others. If I am prevented by others from doing what I could otherwise do, I am to that degree unfree; and if this area is contracted by other men beyond a certain minimum, I can be described as being coerced, or, it may be, enslaved. Coercion is not, however, a term that covers every form of inability. If I say that I am unable to jump more than ten feet in the air, or cannot read because I am blind…it would be eccentric to say that I am to that degree enslaved or coerced. Coercion implies the deliberate interference of other human beings within the area in which I could otherwise act. You lack political liberty or freedom only if you are prevented from attaining a goal by other human beings (Berlin, 1969: 122).

For Berlin and those who follow him, then, the heart of liberty is the absence of coercion by others; consequently, the liberal state's commitment to protecting liberty is, essentially, the job of ensuring that citizens do not coerce each other without compelling justification. However, despite the powerful case for negative liberty, many liberals have been attracted to more ‘positive’ conceptions of liberty. Although Rousseau (1973 [1762]) seemed to advocate a positive conception of liberty, according to which one was free when one acted according to one's true will (the general will), the positive conception was best developed by the British neo-Hegelians of the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries, such as Thomas Green and Bernard Bosanquet (2002 [1923]). Green acknowledged that ‘…it must be of course admitted that every usage of the term [i.e., freedom] to express anything but a social and political relation of one man to other involves a metaphor…It always implies…some exemption from compulsion by another…(1986 [1895]: 229). Nevertheless, Green went on to claim that a person can be unfree if he is subject to an impulse or craving that cannot be controlled. Such a person, Green argued, is ‘…in the condition of a bondsman who is carrying out the will of another, not his own’ (1986 [1895]: 228). Just as a slave is not doing what he really wants to do, one who is, say, an alcoholic is being led by a craving to look for satisfaction where it cannot, ultimately, be found.

For Green, a person is free only if she is self-directed or autonomous. Running throughout liberal political theory is an ideal of a free person as one whose actions are in some sense her own. Such a person is not subject to compulsions, critically reflects on her ideals and so does not unreflectively follow custom and does not ignore her long-term interests for short-term pleasures. This ideal of freedom as autonomy has its roots not only in Rousseau's and Kant's political theory, but also in John Stuart Mill's On Liberty. And today it is a dominant strain in liberalism, as witnessed by the work of S.I. Benn (1988), Gerald Dworkin (1988), and Joseph Raz (1986).

An older notion of liberty that has recently undergone resurgence, is the republican, or neo-roman, conception of liberty. This conception has theoretical roots in the writings of Cicero and Niccolo Machiavelli (1950 [1513]). According to Philip Pettit, the ancient Romans viewed the opposite of ‘liberty’ as:

The contrary of the liber, or free, person in Roman, republican usage was the servus, or slave, and up to at least the beginning of the last century, the dominant connotation of freedom, emphasized in the long republican tradition, was not having to live in servitude to another: not being subject to the arbitrary power of another. (Pettit, 1996: 576)
On this view, the antonym of freedom is subjugation. An agent is said to be unfree, if she is ‘subject to the potentially capricious will or the potentially idiosyncratic judgement of another’ (Pettit, 1997: 5). The ideal government, then, ensures that no agent, including itself, has arbitrary power over any citizen. The key method by which this is accomplished is via an equal disbursement of power. Such a disbursement would make it more difficult for an agent, or the state, to possess the resources, economic or otherwise, that would allow them to exercise arbitrary interference over another (Pettit, 1997: 67).

The republican conception of liberty is distinct from both the positive and negative conceptions. Unlike positive liberty, republican liberty is not primarily concerned with rational autonomy, realizing one's true nature, or becoming one's higher self. When all dominating power has been dispersed, republican theorists are generally silent about these goals (Larmore 2001). Unlike the latter conception, republican liberty is primarily focused upon ‘defenseless susceptibility to interference, rather than actual interference’ (Pettit, 1996: 577).Thus, unlike the ordinary negative conception, the mere possibility of arbitrary interference constitutes a violation of republican liberty.

Some republican theorists, such as Quentin Skinner (1998:113), Maurizio Viroli (2002:6) and Philip Pettit (1997: 8-11), view their conception of liberty as an alternative to liberalism. Insofar as such republican liberty is seen as a basis for criticizing market liberty and market society, this is plausible (Gaus, 2003). However, when liberalism is understood more expansively, and not so closely tied to either negative liberty or market society, republicanism becomes indistinguishable from liberalism (Larmore 2001; Dagger, 1997).

Property and the Market

Liberal political theory, then, fractures over the conception of liberty. But a more important division concerns the place of private property and the market order. For classical liberals liberty and private property are intimately related. From the eighteenth century right up to today, classical liberals have insisted that an economic system based on private property is uniquely consistent with individual liberty, allowing each to live her life — including employing her labour and her capital — as she sees fit. Indeed, classical liberals and libertarians have often asserted that in some way liberty and property are really the same thing; it has been argued, for example, that all rights, including liberty rights, are forms of property; others have maintained that property is itself a form of freedom (Gaus, 1994a; Steiner, 1994). A market order based on private property is thus seen an embodiment of freedom (Robbins, 1961: 104). Unless people are free to make contracts and to sell their labour, or unless they are free to save their incomes and then invest them as they see fit, or unless they are free to run enterprises when they have obtained the capital, they are not really free.

Classical liberals employ a second argument connecting liberty and private property. Rather than insisting that the freedom to obtain and employ private property is simply one aspect of people's liberty, this second argument insists that private property is the only effective means for the protection of liberty. Here the idea is that the dispersion of power that results from a free market economy based on private property protects the liberty of subjects against encroachments by the state. As F.A. Hayek argues, ‘There can be no freedom of press if the instruments of printing are under government control, no freedom of assembly if the needed rooms are so controlled, no freedom of movement if the means of transport are a government monopoly’ (1978: 149).

What has come to be known as ‘new’, ‘revisionist’, or ‘welfare state’ liberalism challenges this intimate connection between personal liberty and a private property based market order (Freeden, 1978; Gaus, 1983a; Macpherson, 1973: ch. 4). Three factors help explain the rise of this revisionist theory. First, the new liberalism arose in the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries, a period in which the ability of a free market to sustain what Lord Beveridge (1944: 96) called a ‘prosperous equilibrium’ was being questioned (Gaus, 1983b). If a private property based market tended to be unstable, or could, as Keynes argued (1973 [1936]), get stuck in an equilibrium with high unemployment, new liberals came to doubt that it was an adequate foundation for a stable, free society. Here the second factor comes into play: just as the new liberals were losing faith in the market, their faith in government as a means of supervising economic life was increasing. This was partly due to the experiences of the First World War, in which government attempts at economic planning seemed to succeed (Dewey, 1929: 551-60); more importantly, this reevaluation of the state was spurred by the democratisation of western states, and the conviction that, for the first time, elected officials could truly be, in J.A. Hobson's phrase ‘representatives of the community’ (1922: 49). As D.G. Ritchie observed:

be it observed that arguments used against ‘government’ action, where the government is entirely or mainly in the hands of a ruling class or caste, exercising wisely or unwisely a paternal or grandmotherly authority — such arguments lose their force just in proportion as the government becomes more and more genuinely the government of the people by the people themselves (1896: 64).

The third factor underlying the development of the new liberalism was probably the most fundamental: a growing conviction that, so far from being ‘the guardian of every other right’ (Ely, 1992: 26), property rights generated an unjust inequality of power that led to a less-than-equal liberty (typically, ‘positive liberty’) for the working class. This theme is central to contemporary American liberalism, which combines strong endorsement of civil and personal liberties with, at best, an indifference, and often enough an antipathy, to private ownership. Once again, the seeds of this newer liberalism can be found in Mill's On Liberty. Although Mill insisted that the ‘so-called doctrine of Free Trade’ rested on ‘equally solid’ grounds as did the ‘principle of individual liberty’ (1991 [1859]: 105), he nevertheless insisted that the justifications of personal and economic liberty were entirely distinct. And in his Principles of Political Economy Mill consistently emphasises that it is an open question whether personal liberty can flourish without private property (1976 [1871]: 210), a position that Rawls was to reaffirm a century later (1971: 258).

2. Liberalism as a Philosophy

Although liberalism is, first and foremost, a political philosophy, ‘liberal’ has come to be employed to describe a group of comprehensive philosophies (Rawls, 1993), including theories of ethics, value, and the person.

Liberal Ethics

Following Wilhelm von Humboldt (1993 [1854]), Mill's On Liberty based the case for the primacy of freedom on the goodness of developing individuality and the cultivating capacities:
Individuality is the same thing with development, and…it is only the cultivation of individuality which produces, or can produce, well-developed human beings…what more can be said of any condition of human affairs, than that it brings human beings themselves nearer to the best thing they can be? or what worse can be said of any obstruction to good, than that it prevents this? (Mill, 1991 [1859]: 71)

This is not just a theory about politics: it is a substantive, perfectionist, moral theory about the good. And, on this view, the right thing to do is to promote development, and only a regime securing each individual extensive liberty can accomplish this. This moral ideal of human perfection and development dominated liberal thinking in the latter part of the nineteenth, and for most of the twentieth, century: not only Mill, but T.H. Green, L.T. Hobhouse, Bernard Bosanquet, John Dewey and even John Rawls show allegiance to variants of this perfectionist ethic and the claim that it provides the foundation for a regime of liberal rights. (Gaus, 1983a). And it is fundamental to the proponents of liberal autonomy discussed above as well as ‘liberal virtue’ theorists such as William Galston (1980). That the good life is necessarily a freely chosen one in which a person develops his unique capacities as part of a plan of life is probably the dominant liberal ethic of the past century.

This may seem a surprising claim given that, at least since the publication of Rawls's Theory of Justice, it has generally been thought that the main moral dispute among liberals stems from the divide between utilitarians and rights theorists. This is, of course, a real divide, and in the last twenty years it has indeed come to dominate liberal debate. But interestingly, sometimes even those on opposite sides of this supposedly fundamental split advocate some version of liberal perfectionism. Thus the utilitarian-inspired J.S. Mill formulated the canonical version of liberal perfectionism while the apparently anti-utilitarian Rawls insists in his Theory of Justice that ‘human beings enjoy the exercise of their realized capacities (their innate and trained abilities), and this enjoyment increases the more the capacity is realized, or the greater its complexity’ (1971: 426; Gaus, 1981).

To say that liberal perfectionism has come to be a distinctly liberal ethic is not to merely assert that it is an ethic employed to defend liberal political positions. It is to make a stronger claim that liberals have come to understand the nature of moral rightness as founded on the pursuit of individuality and value of human development. In this light, it is less clear that utilitarianism constitutes a liberal ethic. To be sure, the notion of a ‘liberal utilitarianism’ is not an oxymoron; but neither is the term at all redundant. Interestingly, in his attempt to defend an explicitly Liberal Utilitarianism, Jonathan Riley advocates a social welfare function that restricts the domain of preferences to the ‘morally admissible’ or ‘ideal’, and these turn out to be those that reflect the sort of character ideal presented by Mill (1988: 83-92). Thus Riley liberalises utilitarianism by building in Mill's perfectionism. Given sufficient assumptions about human motivation, preferences, lack of knowledge and so on, a utilitarian ethic can endorse a liberal politics, but the relation between the two is highly contingent.

The main challenge to Millian perfectionism as a distinctly liberal ethic comes not from utilitarianism but from moral contractualism, which can be divided into what might very roughly be labeled ‘Kantian’ and ‘Hobbesian’ versions. According to Kantian contractualism, ‘society, being composed of a plurality of persons, each with his own aims, interests, and conceptions of the good, is best arranged when it is governed by principles that do not themselves presuppose any particular conception of the good…’(Sandel, 1982: 1-7). On this view, respect for the person of others demands that we refrain from imposing our view of the good life on them. Only principles that can be justified to all respect the personhood of each. Thus the tendency of recent liberal theory (Rawls, 1971; Reiman, 1990) to transform the social contract from an account of the state to an overall justification of morality, or at least a social morality. Basic to such ‘Kantian contractualism’ is the idea that individuals are motivated not by the pursuit of gain, but by a commitment or desire to publicly justify the claims they make on others (Reiman, 1990; Gaus, 1990; Scanlon, 1982). A moral code that could be the object of agreement among rational individuals is thus a publicly justified morality.

In contrast, the Hobbesian version of contractualism supposes only that individuals are self-interested, and correctly perceive that each person's ability to effectively pursue her interests is enhanced by a framework of norms that structure social life and divide the fruits of social cooperation (Gauthier, 1986; Kavka, 1986). Morality, then, is common framework that advances the self-interest of each. The claim of Hobbesian contractualism to be a distinctly liberal conception of morality stems from the importance of individual freedom and property in such a common framework: only systems of norms that allow each person great freedom to pursue her interests as she sees fit could, it is argued, be the object of consensus among self-interest agents. The continuing problem for Hobbesian contractualism is the apparent rationality of free-riding: if everyone (or enough) comply with the terms of the contract, and so social order is achieved, it would seem rational to defect, and act immorally when one can gain by doing so. This is essentially the argument of Hobbes's ‘Foole’, and from Hobbes (1948 [1651]: 94ff) to Gauthier (1986: 160ff), Hobbesians have tried to reply to it.

Liberal Theories of Value

Turning from rightness to goodness, we can identify three main candidates for a liberal theory of value. We have already encountered the first: Millian perfectionism. Insofar as perfectionism is a theory of right action — that rightness consists of promoting what Mill called ‘utility in the largest sense’, i.e., human development (1991 [1859]: 15) — it can be understood as an account of morality. Obviously, however, it is an account of rightness that presupposes a theory of value or the good: the ultimate human value is developed personalities or an autonomous life. Competing with this objectivist theory of value are two other liberal accounts: pluralism and subjectivism.

In his famous defence of negative liberty, Isaiah Berlin insisted that values or ends are plural, and no interpersonally justifiable ranking among these many ends is to be had. More than that, Berlin maintained that the pursuit of one end necessarily implies that other ends will not be achieved. In this sense ends collide or, in the more prosaic terms of economics, the pursuit of one end necessarily entails opportunity costs in relation to others which cannot be impersonally shown to be less worthy. So there is no interpersonally justifiable way to rank the ends, and there is no way to achieve them all. The upshot is that each person must devote herself to some ends at the cost of ignoring others. For the pluralist, then, autonomy, perfection or development are not necessarily ranked higher than hedonistic pleasures, environmental preservation or economic equality. All compete for our allegiance, but because they are incommensurable, no choice can be interpersonally justified as correct.

The pluralist is not a subjectivist: that values are many, competing and incommensurable does not imply that they are somehow dependent on subjective experiences. But the claim that what a person values rests on experiences that vary from person to person has long been a part of the liberal tradition. To Hobbes, what one values depends on what one desires (1948 [1651]: 48). Locke advances a ‘taste theory of value’ (Gaus, 1986):

The Mind has a different relish, as well as the Palate; and you will as fruitlessly endeavour to delight all Man with Riches or Glory, (which yet some Men place their Happiness in,) as you would satisfy all men's Hunger with Cheese or Lobsters; which, though very agreeable and delicious fare to some, are to others extremely nauseous and offensive: And many People would with reason preferr [sic] the griping of an hungry Belly, to those Dishes, which are a Feast to others. Hence it was, I think, that the Philosophers of old did in vain enquire, whether the Summun bonum consisted in Riches, or bodily Delights, or Virtue, or Contemplation: And they might have as reasonably disputed, whether the best Relish were to be found in Apples, Plumbs or Nuts; and have divided themselves into Sects upon it. For…pleasant Tastes depend not on the things themselves, but their agreeableness to this or that particulare Palate, wherein there is great variety…(1975 [1706]: 269).

The perfectionist, the pluralist and the subjectivist concur on the crucial point: the nature of value is such that people will pursue different ways of living. To the perfectionist, this is because each person has unique capacities, the development of which confers value on her life; to the pluralist, it is because values are many and conflicting, and no one life can include them all, or make the interpersonally correct choice among them; and to the subjectivist, it is because our ideas about what is valuable stem from our desires or tastes, and these differ from one individual to another. All three views, then, defend the basic liberal idea that people rationally follow very different ways of living. But in themselves, such notions of the good do not constitute a full-fledged liberal ethic, for an additional argument is required linking liberal value with norms of equal liberty. To be sure, Berlin seems to believe this is a very quick argument: the inherent plurality of ends points to the political preeminence of liberty (Kocis: 1980). Guaranteeing each a measure of negative liberty is, Berlin argues, the most humane ideal, as it recognises that ‘human goals are many,’ and no one can make a choice that is right for all people (1969: 171). But the move from diversity to equal liberty and individual rights seems a complicated one; it is here that both subjectivists and pluralists often rely on versions of moral contractualism. Those who insist that liberalism is ultimately a nihilistic theory can be interpreted as arguing that this transition cannot be made successfully: liberals, on their view, are stuck with a subjectivistic or pluralistic theory of value, and no account of the right emerges from it.

The Metaphysics of Liberalism

In his Liberalism and the Limits of Justice Michael Sandel charged that ‘Kantian liberals’ in general, and John Rawls in particular, are committed to a conception of the person according to which the self is in some way prior to its ends or substantive attachments. What has become known as the ‘communitarian critique of liberalism’ has insisted that this is implausible — people are ‘constituted’ by their ends or values, and they cannot abstract from these particular ends and social commitments to deliberate on matters of justice from a ‘disembodied’ perspective. Although it is dubious that liberals are really committed to all that, it is surely the case that, overwhelmingly, liberals do believe that individual persons are ontologically prior to social groups and relations and, so, persons and their identities are distinct, and that central to personhood is a capacity to choose among alternative ways of living.

A perennial issue in liberal theory is the extent to which this basic individualism can be combined with a recognition of the social nature of humans, and the importance of one's social environment in the formation of personality. Stanley Benn is among those who insist that the liberal commitment to persons as choosers is in no way inconsistent with appreciating the importance of our social inheritance. The liberal individual, he insists, does not:

conjure his nomos out of thin air, adopting it by a kind of random fancy, kicking aside the nomoi of his culture, its traditions, as so much clutter. One's reasons for engaging in an activity as worthwhile, for accepting the principles and standards that regulate it as constraining one's own performances, must already be built into one's conception of the world, which one must have received initially from those about one, as conceptual resources made available by the cluster of subcultures that combine to make one what one is — or rather that provide the materials for what one can become (1988: 220-21).

It has been plausibly argued that the French, as opposed to the British liberal tradition, has taken more seriously these social influences on individuals and their lives (Siedentop, 1979). More generally, Will Kymlicka (1989) has argued that liberalism can indeed makes sense of ‘cultural membership’ and the way individual identities are dependent upon it. Yet it is unclear just how far liberalism's basic individualism permits accommodation with communitarian conceptions of the self, in which one's identity is bound up with a group identity (Gaus, 1983). Although the liberal can certainly acknowledge that we are both individual and social creatures, it seems doubtful that liberals can see individualised personalities as simply social artefacts of a particular, Western, culture: some sort of inherent individuation of personalities seems, as John Chapman argues (1977), a basic element of the liberal conception of human nature. Thus the worry that T.H. Green's or Bernard Bosanquet neo-Hegelian theory of the person is at odds with their liberal politics. According Bosanquet's Absolute Idealism, individual persons are less real, because less complete and coherent, than the social whole (Gaus, 1994b). Moreover, Bosanquet insisted that ‘it is very hard to establish a difference in principle between the unity of what we call one mind and that of all the “minds” which enter into a single social experience’ (1923: 166).

3. The Return of a Purely Political Liberalism?

Prominent liberals have recently shied away from the conception of liberalism as a comprehensive philosophy, and have sought to return to its roots: as a purely political doctrine. This important development, aptly enough described as ‘political liberalism’, insists that liberalism as a comprehensive philosophy — as including an ethical theory, an epistemology or a metaphysics of the person and society — is just one more controversial or ‘sectarian’ doctrine in a society already filled with such doctrines. To John Rawls (1993: 5ff), the preeminent proponent of this view, such a ‘sectarian liberalism’ is open to rational dispute, and thus is not in the requisite sense publicly justified. If it is to serve as the basis for public reasoning in our diverse western societies, liberalism must be restricted to a core set of political principles that are, or can be, the subject of consensus among all reasonable citizens. Rawls's notion of a purely political conception seems in fact more austere than the traditional liberal political theories discussed above, being largely restricted to constitutional principles upholding basic civil liberties and the democratic process.

There are good grounds for doubting that liberalism can really rid itself of controversial metaphysical (Hampton, 1989) or epistemological (Raz, 1990; Gaus, 1996) commitments. As indicated above, Rawls seems to rest his case on the requirements of public justification, yet he seeks a distinctly political, non-epistemological, conception of justification (1993:44). And this, of course, because epistemological theories are controversial. We thus seem driven to the idea that a citizen could ‘politically justify’ a claim in a way that violates her epistemic standards of what constitutes a good reason. It is not at all clear, though, whether one could see oneself as having a politically justified claim on another while recognising that the argument for that claim depends on what, from one's epistemic perspective, are bad reasons (Gaus, 1996: 131ff).

Liberalism is, first and foremost, a political theory, yet it seems dubious that it can be a purely political theory. While no liberal need embrace every element of the wider liberal philosophy — not every liberal must advance a liberal notion of the morally right, a liberal conception of value, a liberal epistemology and a liberal metaphysics of the person — it is hard to see how any liberal political theory can avoid all of these. To be sure, no necessary principles mandate how political philosophy links up to the rest of philosophy. But neither is it an entirely autonomous field; hence the ‘comprehensive’ nature of all liberal theories.


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